Notes to Presocratic Philosophy

1. There is dispute about the extent of the implied quotation here; it is widely agreed that the sentence beginning “For they give justice, etc.” is Anaximander's, but it may well be that part of the preceding sentence is also authentic (Kahn 1985a). The presence of the Aristotelian word elements shows that the analysis of Anaximander's motivation and the discussion of elements at the end of the passage are Simplicius' comments. All translations from the Greek are by P. Curd.

2. It is unlikely that any Presocratic thought explicitly in terms of underlying substances that gain and lose properties through the agency of an external efficient cause. That notion is probably first found in Plato and then fully analyzed in Aristotle, although there are hints of it in some early thinkers.

3. Logos can mean “account,” “word,” “thing said,” “argument,” or  “statement.”

4. Hence the cosmos is intelligible in the old sense of “Capable of understanding; able to understand; intelligent. Obs;” as the OED has it. Note the reference: “1669, Theophilus Gale, The Court of the Gentiles 1669–78:  I. III. iii. 38 ‘Plato supposeth the Universe … a living intelligible creature’.”

5. The nature of the ‘is’ or what-is in Parmenides is a highly contentious subject. Some have taken it to be whatever exists, some to be whatever is or can be the object of scientific inquiry, some take it to be a claim of essential or substantial being (Owen 1960, Furth 1993, Mourelatos 1971, Curd 2004, Palmer 2009).

6. All the evidence for Zeno's paradoxes is indirect, based on Aristotle's discussions in the Physics. Commentators and scholars have reconstructed them from Aristotle's comments; these traditional names come from Aristotle.

7. There is controversy about just what the list of basic ingredients includes. Some scholars argue that the list includes only opposites like dark and light, dense and rare, etc. (Inwood 1986; Furth 1991; Sedley 2007, Schofield 1980, but with reservations); others argue that the list includes everything that appears in the world (and the ingredients of these) except obviously human-made artifacts (Barnes 1979); others opt for a moderate list including stuffs and opposites, but not the specific ingredients of living things as such (Curd, 2007).

8. There is disagreement over most of the details of the cycle. For options see Graham 2006, Long 1993, O'Brien 1969, Kingsley 1995.

9. Primavesi (in Martin and Primavesi 1999 and Primavesi 2008) for instance, argues for the two-poem view, Inwood 1992 and 2001 and Osborne 1987b and 2000 against.

10. It may be that the Purifications is addressed to a public audience who are able to live correctly by following its precepts, although they do so uncomprehendingly, without the complete understanding of one who has the knowledge of the world embodied in the Physics, which is addressed to a more esoteric audience.

11. It is unclear how different the theories of Leucippus (DK 67) and Democritus (DK 68) were. Many commentators treat them as having identical views on all basic points. Democritus' voluminous writings are much more reported and commented on by our sources than Leucippus’, so his views are much better known to us.

12. Although Socrates says that he heard someone reading from Anaxagoras’ book, this need not imply a public reading.

Copyright © 2012 by
Patricia Curd <>

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