Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite

First published Mon Sep 6, 2004; substantive revision Wed Dec 31, 2014

Dionysius, or Pseudo-Dionysius, as he has come to be known in the contemporary world, was a Christian Neoplatonist who wrote in the late fifth or early sixth century CE and who transposed in a thoroughly original way the whole of Pagan Neoplatonism from Plotinus to Proclus, but especially that of Proclus and the Platonic Academy in Athens, into a distinctively new Christian context.

1. Dionysius: Persona

Since Pseudo-Dionysius represented himself as St. Dionysius the Areopagite, an Athenian member of the judicial council, the Areopagus, who was converted instantly by St. Paul, his work, strictly speaking, might be regarded as a successful “forgery”, providing him with impeccable Christian credentials that conveniently antedated Plotinus by over two hundred years. So successful was this stratagem that Dionysius acquired almost apostolic authority, giving his writings enormous influence in the Middle Ages and the Renaissance, though his views on the Trinity and Christ (e.g., his emphasis upon the single theandric activity of Christ (see Letter 4) as opposed to the later orthodox view of two activities) were not always accepted as orthodox since they required repeated defenses, for example, by John of Scythopolis and by Maximus Confessor. Dionysius' fictitious identity, doubted already in the sixth century by Hypatius of Ephesus and later by Nicholas of Cusa, was first seriously called into question by Lorenzo Valla in 1457 and John Grocyn in 1501, a critical viewpoint later accepted and publicized by Erasmus from 1504 onward. But it has only become generally accepted in modern times that instead of being the disciple of St. Paul, Dionysius must have lived in the time of Proclus, most probably being a pupil of Proclus, perhaps of Syrian origin, who knew enough of Platonism and the Christian tradition to transform them both. Since Proclus died in 485 CE, and since the first clear citation of Dionysius' works is by Severus of Antioch between 518 and 528, then we can place Dionysius' authorship between 485 and 518–28 CE. These dates are confirmed by what we find in the Dionysian corpus: a knowledge of Athenian Neoplatonism of the time, an appeal to doctrinal formulas and parts of the Christian liturgy (e.g., the Creed) current in the late fifth century, and an adaptation of late fifth-century Neoplatonic religious rites, particularly theurgy, as we shall see below.

It must also be recognized that “forgery” is a modern notion. Like Plotinus and the Cappadocians before him, Dionysius does not claim to be an innovator, but rather a communicator of a tradition. Adopting the persona of an ancient figure was a long established rhetorical device (known as declamatio), and others in Dionysius' circle also adopted pseudonymous names from the New Testament. Dionysius' works, therefore, are much less a forgery in the modern sense than an acknowledgement of reception and transmission, namely, a kind of coded recognition that the resonances of any sacred undertaking are intertextual, bringing the diachronic structures of time and space together in a synchronic way, and that this theological teaching, at least, is dialectically received from another. Dionysius represents his own teaching as coming from a certain Hierotheus and as being addressed to a certain Timotheus. He seems to conceive of himself, therefore, as an in-between figure, very like a Dionysius the Areopagite, in fact. Finally, if Iamblichus and Proclus can point to a primordial, pre-Platonic wisdom, namely, that of Pythagoras, and if Plotinus himself can claim not to be an originator of a tradition (after all, the term Neoplatonism is just a convenient modern tag), then why cannot Dionysius point to a distinctly Christian theological and philosophical resonance in an earlier pre-Plotinian wisdom that instantaneously bridged the gap between Judaeo-Christianity (St. Paul) and Athenian paganism (the Areopagite)?

2. Reading Dionysius' Works

Reading Dionysius can be a difficult business for many reasons: partly because his frequent hyperbolic theological language is foreign to our own English-speaking practices; partly because almost every word he employs resonates with the whole history of ancient thought, from the Christian Platonism of the Fathers, particularly, Gregory of Nyssa and the Cappadocians, to the Neoplatonism of Plotinus, Iamblichus, and Proclus, while his theology focuses predominantly upon the Jewish and Christian scriptures (which Dionysius calls “divine oracles”); partly, again, because the order in which we are to read his works is unclear and because Dionysius mentions at least seven works that have been lost. So we are unsure how to read him since so much seems doubtful or potentially fictitious. This picture is further complicated by the titles subdividing portions of his works, which appear, because of terminology peculiar to them, to have been inserted by a later hand or hands.

The surviving writings are four treatises and ten letters. The four treatises are: 1) On the divine names (DN) (Peri theion onomaton, in Greek; De Divinis Nominibus, in Latin), the longest work of thirteen chapters that deals with affirmative or kataphatic theology, namely, the names attributed to God the creator in scripture and also in pagan texts, but also exploring the limits of language and therefore also involving negative or apophatic theology. 2) On the celestial hierarchy (CH) (Peri tes ouranias hierarchias, in Greek; De coelesti hierarchia, in Latin), a work that examines how the nine choirs of angels (in scripture) are to be understood in lifting us up to God. 3) On the ecclesiastical hierarchy (EH) (Peri tes ekklestiastikes hierarchias, in Greek; De ecclesiastica hierarchia, in Latin) that examines the various orders and liturgy of the church as relating us to God through a divinely appointed but human hierarchy. And 4) On Mystical theology (MT) (Peri mustikes theologias, in Greek; De mystica theologia, in Latin), a brief but powerful work that deals with negative or apophatic theology and in which theology becomes explicitly “mystical” for the first time in history (By mystical here we do not mean an extraordinary or private experience of transcending one's self in the modern sense of the term, but simply “hidden”. On this see Bouyer, 1949; Vanneste, 1959; McGinn 1994). There follow ten letters that provide helpful comments upon topics in the above four treatises, especially letter 9 on what Dionysius calls symbolic theology of which works 2) and 3) above (CH; EH) form a substantial part. The ten letters appear to be arranged in a roughly hierarchical order, letters 1–4 being addressed to a monk (a certain Gaius, also the name of one or more of St. Paul's companions), letter 5 to a deacon, letter 6 to a priest, and letters 7 and 9 to hierarchs or bishops. Letter 8 disrupts this order since it is addressed to a monk charged with disrupting the hierarchical order itself!

What order of the works are we to adopt? In the French translation of M. de Gandillac and the English translation of C. Luibheid and P. Rorem (see bibliography), the order is DN, MT, CH and EH. In the manuscripts of the Areopagitic corpus, the order is CH, EH, DN, MT, followed by the Letters. Dionysius himself provides an explanatory outline that favors the order of Luibheid and Rorem, and that gives a systematic organization to his body of work, including both the treatises we presently possess and also the treatises which either no longer exist or, more likely, were never written. His outline is especially valuable for two of these latter treatises—the Theological Representations and the Symbolic Theology—since the order in which he claims to have written them reveals both the relative worth of their contents and the sequence in which the reader should proceed. It thus helps the reader to divine the nature of their content, and to put them in their proper place with the remaining two works written by Dionysius on the forms of theology. The first three—the Theological Representations, On the Divine Names, and the Symbolic Theology—discuss ever more divided and sensuous forms of theology. The fourth theological work, the Mystical Theology, reverses the sequence and restores the reader to the divine unity:

In the earlier books my argument traveled downward from the most exalted to the humblest categories, taking in on this downward path an ever-increasing number of ideas which multiplied with every stage of the descent. But my argument now rises from what is below up to the transcendent, and the more it climbs, the more language falters, and when it has passed up and beyond the ascent, it will turn silent completely, since it will finally be at one with him who is undescribable (MT 1033 C).

In this article we shall adopt a variant of this last order both because Dionysius himself seems to have favored it and because it clarifies the systematic structure of the theological works.

3. Outline and Content of the Works

3.1 Theological Representations

Although the Theological Representations is not extant, we are able to glean its content from Dionysius' ample descriptions of it in his other works. It seems to have devoted itself to names for the three persons within the godhead and their attributes. These names are the representations mentioned in the work's title. They describe two forms of differentiation within the godhead: the distinction into persons, and into attributes of the persons. Names for the persons include “Father,” “Son,” and “Holy Spirit.” Names for the attributes include “source,” “offshoot,” “flower,” and “light.” Dionysius does not explain why he uses the term “representation” (hypotuposis) for these names, but his fondness for puns may have led him to adopt it because of its similarity to “person” (hypostasis).

Some of these names describe more than a person within the godhead. The name “father,” for instance, may also be used of animals, in which case it means the male parent. We seem to apply such names literally to animals and only metaphorically to persons within the godhead. But Dionysius uncovers a passage from Paul's letter to the Ephesians which leads him to claim otherwise. Paul says that God the Father is the one “from whom all fatherhood in the heavens and on earth is named.” On the basis of this scriptural authority, Dionysius explains that we are able to use the terms “father” and “son” of animals only because the godhead has already undergone the same relation. In other words, the internal causality exercised within the godhead is the source of all other causality. This includes not only the causation of one animal by another, but of one angel by another, since angels, too, receive the names of “father” and “son.”

3.2 On the Divine Names

Strictly speaking, all of the theological works except for the Theological Representations devote themselves to divine names or names for the godhead. But Dionysius devotes his second theological treatise, entitled On the Divine Names only to a particular kind of divine name. This kind of name describes a third distinction within the godhead (in addition to the distinction of persons and of personal attributes): the distinction into the multiple attributes of the godhead as a whole. Though the names apply to the godhead as a whole, and so refer to it as a unity, each name is different and so, taken together, they differentiate the godhead. The implicit distinction between the unity of the godhead and the multiplicity of the names is reflected in the very structure of the names themselves. Each name includes the same prefix: “over-”, or hyper- in Greek, which indicates the unity of the godhead to whom the names are applied. But each name is different, indicating the self-multiplication of the godhead. The result is a set of names like “over-good,” “over-being,” and “over-life.” Occasionally, Dionysius also makes use of a second, equivalent prefix: “pre-” or pro- in Greek. God is “pre-good,” and “pre-being,” meaning that he has the attributes of creatures in a way that transcends both creature and attribute. The “over-” and “pre-” prefixes must be applied strictly to the names when they are used of God in himself. On the other hand, when the names are used only of God as cause, the prefixes may be left off, since the causality of God is already a procession into the differentiation properly signified by each of the different names.

Some of Dionysius' later medieval interpreters suggest that God possesses the attributes of creatures in their most proper and ideal form, but Dionysius himself does not suggest this. Instead, the most proper object of the names is the highest creature. The exemplary instances of “goodness,” “being,” and “life,” for example, are the highest of the angels or intelligible minds, as Dionysius also calls them. For this reason, Dionysius frequently refers to this type of name as an “intelligible name.” He incorporates into the number of intelligible names the traditional Neoplatonic intelligible categories: being, identity, difference, rest, and motion, as well as the Neoplatonic triad of being, life, and intellect. The fact that God transcends the proper meaning of these names does not mean that he ought to be called “non-being,” “non-life,” or “non-intellect.” Dionysius prefers simply to say that God is “over being,” “over life,” and “over intellect.”

The intelligible names could form the ground of a theology independent of any specific religious tradition or sacred text. Many of them are central to Platonic sources outside the context of Christianity, and appear only incidentally and obscurely in the Hebrew and Christian scriptures. They also describe the intelligible structure of the cosmos, a structure that is accessible to all human inquiry, whether assisted by scriptural texts or not. But Dionysius explicitly denies that the names may be acquired from any source other than the Hebrew and Christian scriptures. Even if the names could be derived from contemplation of the world's intelligible structure, we apply them in theology to the cause of that structure and not to the structure itself. Since the cause of that structure is beyond the grasp of human inquiry, we cannot rely on our own powers for our description. We depend instead on the revelation of the scriptures as our source for the intelligible names.

Few human beings have the ability to contemplate the intelligible names in their purity. Most of us require the names to be incarnated in visible things before we can understand them. Unable to see “being,” “life,” and “wisdom” in themselves, we need a visible being who is living and wise. Such a person can then become the means by which we contemplate the intelligible. Dionysius' possibly fictional teacher Hierotheus is one such visible incarnation of the names. But Hierotheus may do more than incarnate the names. He can also unfold them in speech, taking the unitary name of “being” and describing it at length, as Dionysius does in the fifth chapter of On the Divine Names. As he describes it, the name unfolds itself into a form that is more multiple, because of the many words used in his description. It thus approaches the multiple character of our ordinary human way of knowing, and becomes more easily understood.

3.3 Symbolic Theology

Other names directly refer to visible things, whose multiplicity and accessibility to sensation make them easy for us to understand. The difficulty with these names, referred to by Dionysius and the Neoplatonic tradition generally as “symbols,” is that they have no inherent relation to the godhead at all. Their literal signification is restricted to the realm of the sensuous, and so they must be turned into metaphors if they are to become useful for theology. This is the task of Dionysius' Symbolic Theology. Though the work itself is not extant, we find him undertaking the same project in each of his extant works.

One of Dionysius' favorite sources of symbols is a verse from the 78th psalm: “the Lord awoke, like a strong man, powerful but reeling with wine.” Taken literally, the verse indicates that God sleeps and gets drunk on wine, two activities that properly apply only to embodied, visible beings. Only an embodied being can manifest the activities to which the names “sleep” and “drunkenness” literally refer. If we are to apply such terms to God, they must be attached to a foreign, intelligible content that will be able to lead the interpreter of the symbolic name to the contemplation of an intelligible name. In “sleep,” for example, Dionysius finds a meaning common to both intelligible and visible things: withdrawal from the world. He concludes that God's sleep is his “removal from and lack of communication with the objects of his providence.” In drunkenness, Dionysius sees a kind of over-filling, and so he explains that God's drunkenness is “the overloaded measurelessness of all goods in the one who is their cause.” From the easily comprehended literal meaning of the term, the reader rises to the more difficult intelligible terrain of imparticipability and measurelessness.

Drunkenness and sleep are what Dionysius calls “dissimilar similarities.” They strike us as exceptionally unworthy of God, and so are “dissimilar,” yet they reveal an intelligible truth capable of leading us to him, and so are “similar.” Dionysius privileges such names over more appropriate names like “golden” and “luminous.” The more that the name seems appropriate, the more we are likely to be lulled into thinking that we have adequately comprehended the godhead in our use of the name. The very materiality and ignobility of the dissimilar similarities cry out that the names do not literally describe the godhead, and compel the reader to seek the intelligible truth behind the name.

We may wonder whether the symbolic names are a necessary part of theology at all, since their content belongs to the intelligible theology and not to a “symbolic” theology. Dionysius repeatedly affirms their necessity, not because of the character of their content, but because of the nature of the human soul. The soul may be divided into two parts: one passionate and the other passionless. Passionate here means set in motion by things exterior to the soul. The senses, for example, are passionate because they can only function when an outside object gives them something to sense. Dionysius follows a longstanding Neoplatonic tradition when he says that most of us are unable to engage our passionless part directly. Instead, our passionless part comes into play only indirectly, through the activity of the passionate part. By sensing the world around us, we are led to contemplate its intelligible structures through the sensations we receive. Even those few human beings who can engage their passionless part directly find it helpful to shore up their contemplation with examples drawn from the senses. Dionysius may understand the causality of God directly, and yet still find it helpful to compare God's causality to the emanation of light from the sun.

Such examples do not require the presence of a revealed scripture. Skilled teachers in any subject are characterized by their ability to come up with helpful examples drawn from ordinary experience when explaining a difficult intelligible truth. Dionysius himself frequently resorts to examples “at our level” in order to explain something intelligible. The scriptural symbol goes further, attempting to reveal the God who is before and beyond even the intelligible truth. The highest human intellect has little ability to attain this truth directly, and so we cannot rely on intellectual teachers as guides to that truth. We require the gift of symbols, which tie our ordinary comprehension to the godhead beyond being. And so Dionysius does not describe the symbolic names as pedagogical tools developed by theologians. The names appear instead in the ecstatic visions of the prophets. Though Dionysius explicitly asserts our dependence on the Hebrew and Christian scriptures as the source of these symbols, he has no qualms about embellishing the list of names with symbols drawn from other traditions. For instance, he discusses at length the name of “mixing bowl,” which has no real source in the Christian or Hebrew scriptures, but occurs centrally in the Platonic philosophy deriving from Plato's Timaeus.

3.4 Mystical Theology

When Dionysius praises “dissimilar similarities” over seemingly more appropriate symbolic names for God, he explains that at least some dissimilar names are negations, and negations are more proper to God than affirmations. The Mystical Theology has this last, most arcane form of theology as its subject. Negations are properly applied not only to the names of the symbolic theology. Any and all of the divine names must be negated, beginning with those of the symbolic theology, continuing with the intelligible names and concluding with the theological representations. The godhead is no more “spirit,” “sonship,” and “fatherhood” than it is “intellect” or “asleep.” These negations must be distinguished from privations. A privation is simply the absence of a given predicate that could just as easily be present. The absence of the predicate is opposed to its presence: “lifeless” is opposed to “living.” But when we say that the godhead is not “living,” we do not mean that it is “lifeless.” The godhead is beyond the lifeless as well as beyond the living. For this reason, Dionysius says that our affirmations of the godhead are not opposed to our negations, but that both must be transcended: even the negations must be negated.

The most controversial and arcane passages of the Mystical Theology revolve around the mystical as taken in itself and not as the act of negating the other forms of theology. Dionysius says that after all speaking, reading, and comprehending of the names ceases, there follows a divine silence, darkness, and unknowing. All three of these characteristics seem privative, as though they were simply being the absence of speech, sight, and knowledge respectively. But Dionysius does not treat them as privative. Instead, he uses temporal and spatial language to mark off a special place and time for them. Using as his example the account of Moses' ascent up Mount Sinai in the Hebrew scriptures, Dionysius says that after Moses ascends through the sensible and intelligible contemplation of God, he then enters the darkness above the mountain's peak. The darkness is located above the mountain, and Moses enters it after his contemplation of God in the various forms of theology. Dionysius leaves the relation between Moses and the darkness highly obscure. Some commentators reduce it to a form of knowing, albeit an extraordinary form of knowing. Others reduce it to a form of affective experience, in which Moses feels something that he can never know or explain in words. Dionysius himself does not give decisive evidence in favor of either interpretive move. He speaks only of Moses' “union” with the ineffable, invisible, unknowable godhead.

3.5 On the Celestial and Ecclesiastical Hierarchies

Perhaps even more vexing than the nature of union in Dionysius is the question of how the theological treatises relate to Dionysius' two treatises on hierarchy. The Mystical Theology suggests an ascent from the lower sensuous realm of reality through the intelligible intermediate realm to the darkness of the godhead itself, all accomplished by a single person. The hierarchic treatises, on the other hand, suggest that the sensible and intelligible realms are not places reached by a single being, but different kinds of beings, and that the vision of God is handed from being to being downward through the levels of the hierarchy. On the Celestial Hierarchy describes the intelligible realm as divided into nine ranks of beings: the seraphim, cherubim, thrones, dominions, powers, authorities, principalities, archangels, and angels. On the Ecclesiastical Hierarchy describes the human beings within the church as divided into eight ranks: the hierarchs or bishops, priests, deacons, monks, laity, catechumens, penitents, and the demon-possessed. Dionysius does not address human life outside the church, except for a few scattered references to the angels presiding over other religious traditions and the earlier “legal hierarchy” of the Jewish rite, which precedes the ecclesiastical hierarchy of the Christian rite.

The hierarchs, highest within the human hierarchy, contemplate the intelligible realm directly, though presumably they contemplate only its lowest level: the angels. The visible result of the hierarchs' contemplation of the angels is the series of rites belonging to the Christian church. Since the hierarchs are able to contemplate the intelligible directly, they do not perform the rites for their own sake, but for the sake of the monks and laity, who have no capacity for direct intelligible contemplation. The monks and laity are able to engage the passionless part of their souls only through the passionate part, and so they require a visible trigger—the symbol—to stimulate their intelligible contemplation. The ranks of hierarch, priest, and deacon are in charge of administering the rites, with a specific set of initiates in their care and a specific action to perform. The deacons purify the catechumens, penitents, and possessed, primarily by giving them ethical instruction. The priests illuminate the laity, who are able to receive the intelligible truth. The hierarchs perfect, a task whose initiate seems ideally to be the monk, since Dionysius identifies the monks as leading the more perfect life of those who are not explicitly consecrated as clergy.

The very structure of the church reflects the different roles of the clergy and the laity. The hierarch stands still at the altar, facing away from the multiplicity of the church's interior. He enters the nave of the church only to bring sacred objects like incense, bread and wine, and holy oil into the realm of multiplicity, the spatially extended nave. When he brings the censer into the nave, for example, its fragrance is distributed to the laity there, just as the bread and wine are later distributed in the eucharistic rite. The hierarch then returns to the altar, and takes up again his own proper object of contemplation, the intelligible source of the rites. The laity, on the other hand, remain within the spatially extended nave, but orient themselves toward the altar, where the sacred objects are raised for their contemplation. Before this contemplation can occur, the catechumens, penitents, and the demon-possessed must be removed from the church. Their orientation toward the material prevents them from adequately contemplating the intelligible truth through its visible manifestation in the sacred objects.

Although the rites have intelligible contemplation as their goal, it does not appear that non-ritual forms of contemplation, like reading, can substitute for participation in the rites. Dionysian contemplation is public, so that it may unite us to each other; it involves prayer, so that it may unite us explicitly with the godhead; it also requires bodies, since only the interaction of bodies allows the contemplative act to include both components of our nature: body and soul. The names used in Dionysius' theological treatises acquire their salvific power in this liturgical context. Although the rites involve the performance of bodily actions, they clothe themselves in words: the Hebrew and Christian scriptures, and the oral tradition of the liturgical prayers. Only the silence and unknowing of the Mystical Theology finds no clear place within the liturgical rites of the hierarchy, since it transcends both the visible rites of the laity and the intelligible contemplation of the clergy. It may be that, just as some points of the liturgy call for a literal silence, the intelligible contemplation of the hierarch at the altar must engage in its own form of silence, so as to allow the appearance of the godhead beyond naming. On this question, however, Dionysius is as silent as the mystical theology which crowns his vision of the human ascent to God.

4. Sources, Ideas, Character of Writing, Terms: Christianity and Neoplatonism

Having examined the plan and content of these works let us now take a brief look at some of the sources of Dionysius' ideas (and associated problems), and at the character of Dionysius' writing in order to determine what in practice he is actually doing and to see if there is anything genuinely philosophical in his writing.

4.1 Sources, Ideas, and Terms

There is a major tension between Platonism and Christianity in Dionysius' writing. Luther expressed the negative side of this tension: “Dionysius is most pernicious; he platonizes more than he Christianizes” (Babylonian Captivity of the Church (Weimarer Ausgabe 6, 562)). Von Balthasar has been more positive, seeing Dionysius' Christianization of Neoplatonism “as a side-effect of his own properly theological endeavor”, namely, “the clear realized synthesis of truth and beauty, of theology and aesthetics” (The Glory of the Lord, vol. 2, 148–9). Perhaps one may suggest that neither Christianity nor Platonism are side shows in Dionysius' thought; They are rather mutually important whole perspectives that do not get lost in the mix, no matter how subordinate Neoplatonism nonetheless may be to Christianity for Dionysius himself. Dionysius' central concern is how a triune God, that he calls—among other things—the thearchy (god-rule; god-beginning), who is utterly unknowable, unrestricted being, beyond individual substances, beyond even goodness, can become manifest to, in, and through the whole of creation in order to bring back all things to the hidden darkness of their source. To this end Dionysius employs some major Neoplatonic insights: (1) The abiding—procession—return or conversion of all things as the creative and receptive expression of what it means for anything created to be. In Proclus' terms in the Elements of Theology, prop. 35: “Every effect remains in its cause, proceeds from it, and converts to it”. This is a way of expressing the vertical connectedness of everything by identity, difference, and the overcoming of difference by a return to identity that constitutes the nature of anything that is caused. (2) The hierarchical ordering of beings as an expression of both their natural placements and their freedoms as well as the simultaneous immediacy, without intermediary, of the unknown God's presence (on hierarchy see CH 3). Each thing and order bears relation to the whole or manifests the whole, but “according to its own capacity”, as the famous Neoplatonic saying puts it. A rock or a worm, for instance, is a window upon the entire universe if you only know how to look.

In the case of (1), the contrast between Dionysius and Neoplatonism should not be taken to be a contrast between free divine creation, on the one hand, and supposed emanation or illumination by necessity, on the other, for divine/ human freedom and creation out of “nothing” are conspicuous facets of Neoplatonic thought as well. What we see in Dionysius is rather a new way of understanding the abiding, outpouring, and return, not only concretely in relation to the various hierarchies, and structurally in relation to the various works (DN is more concerned with procession, for instance, while EH, CH, and MT deal with different levels of return), but also in relation to God's providential love that, while remaining supereminently identical to itself, and precontaining everything within itself, nonetheless is the creative power overflowing into its effects (procession) in order to bring them back into identity (return): “[The Cause of All] is ‘all in all‘, as scripture affirms, and certainly he is to be praised as being for all things the creator and originator, the One who brings them to completion, their preserver, their protector, and their home, the power which returns them to itself, and all this in the one single, irrepressible, and supreme act” (DN 1, 7, 596c-597a).

In the case of (2) (hierarchy and divine presence), Dionysius emphasizes, much more so than the impression often suggested by Neoplatonism, the directness of creation. Every being, no matter where it is placed in the scale of beings and no matter how dependent it might be on beings ontologically higher than it (e.g., for human beings, angels) is directly and immediately dependent upon God in and for its existence. Again, the contrasts often drawn between Neoplatonism's “flight of the alone to the alone” and Dionysius' community of hierarchy or between the supposed Neoplatonic view that the One causes the existence of lower beings only through the mediation of the higher, while Christianity sees creation as immediate are simply false or too simplistic. Plotinus' mysticism is not “solitary” in the sense often supposed and, for Plotinus, Porphyry, and Proclus, the One causes existence immediately and most profoundly, whatever other influences enter into the complexity of existence. What we see in Dionysius, by contrast, is a retention of one's place in hierarchy and a very concrete return to identity—in the case of human beings, for instance, through scripture, ritual, and practical performance to a deeper union with God rather than a simple, spatially conceived movement “up” the hierarchy. More broadly still, we see in Dionysius' thought new possibilities for thinking about divine love, a love that combines beyond beingness and unrestricted being, transcendence and yet even a kind of hyperessential vulnerability in rather startling ways, new ways consequently of thinking about both divine and human eros, about affectivity (cf. Dionysius' famous dictum about learning from sacred writers, or discovering the truth oneself, or not only learning but “experiencing the divine things” (pathein ta theia) (DN 2, 9); and compare Aristotle, fr. 15 (Rose) and Hebrews 5:8), about the nature of signification and the limits of language (see section 4 below), about the theory of evil as privation and non-being, however dependent this is upon one of Proclus' opuscula (cf. DN 4, 18–35), about the aesthetic richness of this world in the light of theology and the life of the Church, and even about the soul–body relation, though anthropology is not a part of Dionysius' primary concern (but see his comments at EH 404B, 433c, 437a–440a, 441b, 553a ff, 565b–c).

Two examples will have to suffice here: a) Dionysius' remarkable description of the ecstatic love of God and b) his radical transformation of the Neoplatonic intelligible and sensible worlds.

a) First, Dionysius evidently cannot accept in any single straightforward sense the Neoplatonic notion of a One that excludes the possibility of expressing trinity. He therefore links in a new way God as unrestricted being with God as utterly beyond being or any determinate predications. At the same time in the DN he argues that the ecstasy of love, which moves as a unifying force through creation without departing from itself, is the divine nature. Dionysius admits, in a note from Plato's Phaedrus, that it is characteristic of yearning not to allow “lovers to belong to themselves but only to their loved ones” (DN 4, 13). This is shown, he goes on to argue, by the providential care of the greater for the lesser (a reference to Proclus' divine providential love (eros pronoetikos) from the Commentary on the First Alcibiades, #56), by the love of equals, and by that of the lesser for those better than them (a reference both to Aristotle's seminal treatment of friendship in the Nicomachean Ethics and to Proclus' returning or converting love (eros epistreptikos) in the same Commentary above), as also in the case of St. Paul's famous dictum “I live now, not I, but Christ lives in me” (Gal 2:20). Might then such a belonging to one's beloved be characteristic of God, if perhaps in a different sense?

Dionysius continues as follows:

We must dare to say even this on behalf of the truth that the cause of all things himself, by his beautiful and good love for all things, through an overflowing of loving goodness, becomes outside of himself (exo heautou ginetai) by his providential care for all beings and is as it were, charmed (thelgetai) by goodness, affection (agapesis), and love (eros), and is led down (katagetai) from his place above all and transcendent of all to dwell in all things in accordance with his ecstatic superessential power which does not depart from itself (DN 4, 13).

The very notion is, of course, remarkable, the notion, that is, of a kind of conjunction of opposites that strives to express the inexpressible magnitude of divine love and even to suggest power and vulnerability (or “almost” vulnerability: “as it were, charmed (beguiled, enchanted)”), as well as the possibility of a genuine two-way relation between Creator and creatures more in tune with Biblical thought. Yet the expression remains Greek, for the word thelgetai that Dionysius chooses is one that echoes the conclusion of Agathon's speech in the Symposium where Agathon praises a Love that everyone “should hymn fairly, sharing in the song he sings that enchants/charms/beguiles (thelgon) the thought (phronema) of all gods and human beings” (197c). Dionysius changes the context but does not really reverse the polarity: it is God who still—like human beings—is beguiled by love and affection for beings and “led down” to dwell in them. Is this small detail and transposition merely accidental? It may well be, but in this context, the use of such a verb and thought is not accidental. Dionysius does not write as a Christian walled off from pagan thought or as if he were a Neoplatonic thinker in Christian disguise. Instead he provokes and delights in intertextuality at every point.

b) A second example is the precise nature of Dionysius' transposition of Neoplatonic structure. Dionysius makes concrete and accessible the whole world of Neoplatonism in the human, but sacramental life of the Church, a world of ordinary people and things whose significance can only be fully realized and perfected in the celestial and supercelestial world.

For Classical Neoplatonism, especially in its Plotinian form, the real truths that undergird or form the origins, beginnings (archai) of the world of ordinary experience are the three hypostases or realities of soul, intellect, and the One. The hypostases are necessary, above all, to account for our experience of degrees of unity and organization. The life-world accessible to our senses is an organized, animated world, and this needs a more intensive degree of unity to account for it, namely, the principle of life, that is, soul and all souls. But even the world of soul is a “one and many”, organized from within yet also requiring a principle of unity and organization beyond itself. And the same is true even to a higher degree of intellect. Intellect is a “one-many”, an organized world of intellects, in each of which the whole of intellect is present. Each is a sort of holographic reality. And because intellect is still a world despite its more intensive unity than soul, it requires a unity beyond intellect and beyond being to organize it and to form the groundless ground of its own being from which it has emerged.

So (1) in Neoplatonism, there are 3 hypostases, on the one hand, namely, soul, intellect, and the One, and four cosmic or hypercosmic dimensions, on the other: (i) the sensible world as a world of things; (ii) the sensible world linked by the soul to the intelligible world; (iii) the intelligible world itself composed of all intellects; and finally (iv) the One or the Good, from which everything has come. And (2) while everything has its appropriate “place” in this hypostatic hierarchy, the presence of the Good is so immediate and so accessible, that the presence is closer to each thing even than intellect or soul. This is equally true in both Plotinus and Proclus. Furthermore, (3) in order to explicate the derivation of each entity from what comes before it, it is not sufficient as some scholars have supposed that Neoplatonism should just have multiplied intermediaries and indulged in an absurd proclivity for triads, such as Life, Wisdom, Mind; Neoplatonism should rather be seen as a form of thought that attempts to meditate upon, read the signs in, and represent how, as precisely as possible, all beings are derived from and relate to the One, to examine and explicate their dependence, open-endedness, and radical interconnectedness without losing sight of the multidimensional ordering of the universe (sensible/intelligible) and of the fact that even the simplicity of things that have no intellect or life, but only bare existence, springs from the power of the One.

What Dionysius manages to do is both to capture this spirit profoundly, and, therefore, transform it, as well as to make it concrete and accessible in the scriptural, sacramental, and ordinary experiences of Christian practitioners. Instead of the 4 dimensions of the Neoplatonic universe, Dionysius has the following: (1) the sensible world or Legal hierarchy, i.e., the world considered under the aspect either of objective “thinginess” or of law, namely, in the case of law, a world in which we are dependent upon prescriptions rather than upon any deeper understanding, a world in which the “mysteries” or hidden things (such as Baptism and the Eucharist) are mere mechanical ceremonies and the Scriptures are given only a literal meaning. For Dionysius (as for Plato), law is necessary, but still deficient. The law of Moses, for instance, “gave only a veiled contemplation as to enlighten without harm weak capacities for sight” (EH 501c). Then (2) there follows the ecclesiastical hierarchy, namely, the sensible world as the limbs of the mystical body of Christ led by soul into the significance of the intelligible or celestial hierarchy, where the symbols can begin to be read. Its mysteries, both sensible and intelligible, are the Scriptures and the Sacraments, its initiators the priests, and its initiated the ones who receive them. From this perspective, Dionysius transforms Neoplatonism radically but at the same time provokes entirely new possibilities in the structures he transforms.

4.2 Character of Writing

What is the general character of Dionysius' writing and is there anything philosophical in it? Dionysius presents us with complex affirmative (kataphatic) and negative (apophatic) forms of theology, exploring what we can say about God, what we mean by our statements, discovering the necessity for us to talk too much about God and to push language forms to their breaking points, and then to see what we cannot say about God. Negation is important here at both levels, in kataphatic theology as well as in apophatic theology. This complex theory of signification and its subversion is often referred to as negative theology: affirming our affirmations, then negating them, and then negating the negations to ensure that we do not make an idol out of a God about whom we know nothing. But it is also much more than this.

Dionysius is practising forms of theological meditation in the sense that the earlier Church Fathers had understood this, not as a type of objectified, academic knowledge, but rather as a more complex, intersubjective form of address, communion and contemplation. Dionysius adopts the word theurgy, “god-work”, together with theology, “god-word”, to describe the inmost reality of this practice, adopting it from the later Neoplatonist understanding of a hidden sympathy or interconnectedness between material things and the sacred, divine significances resident in them by virtue of divine power. Iamblichus, for instance, had denied that pure thought or contemplation could bring about union with the divine. What was crucial was the performance of certain ritual actions or theurgy, “god-work”, in the belief that one could attain to the divine by the incarnation of divine forces in material objects, statues, or human beings through the divine power mirrored everywhere in the universe and in the natural sympathy of all parts, and not just by talking about the gods (theo-logy) or by looking at them (theoria). For some modern critics, Dionysius' adaptation of pagan theurgy is analogous to calling the Christian sacraments “magical”, which also results in the subsumption of everything (morality as well as contemplation) to a form of magical correspondence. But Dionysius does not understand theurgy in this way. For him, “theurgy is the consummation (sygkephalaiosis) of theology” (EH 432B), which is to say that God's activity within all the orders of nature does not abolish nature, morality, contemplation, or science but rather completes them and makes possible the divinization of human nature.

God's work in all things, therefore, turns the world into a reservoir of possibilities: at its lowest and most fragmented, it is apparently a world of only individual, discrete things without significance, but in reality it is a world vested with signs, symbols, and hidden meanings as the multidimensional creation of a Triadic God. Even the lowest things cannot simply be despised, for even in their dissimilarity from the divine, they bear the capacity to signify the divine more appropriately than supposedly worthier images. If we say God is good, we run the risk of thinking we know entirely what we mean and consequently of closing off a thought that has to be radically open-ended, if not altogether subverted. If we liken God to a “worm”, we subvert our own comfortable tendencies by being shocked into filling the image with enquiry. So the Psalmist who uses the worm image hides the sacred from those who would defile it with a lack of understanding and yet points to the sacred in a new way. This constant tension or dialectic between hiddenness and openness pervades the whole of Dionysius' meditative practice of theology; and from this perspective Dionysius' practice of writing is a complex and necessarily deceptive or subversive process of reading the encoded insight (or contemplation) in created things in such a way that neither the perceptual beauty of the material thing nor the deeper hidden beauty of the sign becomes a trap, an idol, or a vanishing point but, instead, an activity that opens up an irresistibly beautiful world in and to God.

There are several consequences of this. First, Dionysius' writing is a response, a preparing of the organs of reception for the love of God in praise and worship. In theology, we are learning how to praise, to hymn—not to catalogue—God. Second, such writing is dialogic and intersubjective to its core in three ways: a) As “in between” teacher and pupil, dialogical receptivity and transmission, open-ended in both directions, characterize its essential form; b) Even in the content of Dionysius' various works, replete as they are with triads (which can so easily be relegated to a Neoplatonic obscure penchant for providing intermediate links), this open-ended in-betweenness, characteristic of conversation and cooperation, is fundamental to the ranks of the various hierarchies. In the EH, for instance, in the triad catechumen (the one undergoing purification), sponsor or confirmed Christian (the one being illumined), and hierarch (the one being perfected and enlightening) (according to the traditional triadic form: purification—illumination—perfection), the sponsor first introduces the catechumen and both sponsor and catechumen are then mediated by the work of the hierarch. For Dionysius at least (if not in the actual operation of a “church”), hierarchy is here not a question of domination, but rather of a genuine open-endedness, testability through interlocutor and mediator, community and responsibility. c) Finally, what completes both the form and the content above all is prayer, since, for Dionysius (as for Anselm much later), prayer is the primary form of reverential philosophical thought and receptivity, “stretching ourselves out”, as in Gregory of Nyssa, so as to be “lifted up” (cf. DN 3). The most famous example of such prayer is the very beginning of the MT, where in the address/request “Triad, above substance, above god, above good” to “make our way straight to the topmost peak, beyond knowing and light, of the mystical scriptures—there where the simple, absolute and unchangeable, mysteries of God's speaking lie wrapped in the darkness beyond light of secret—hidden silence”, Timotheus, the disciple is also included, together with us the readers.

4.3 Philosophy?

All of this looks so alien to the spirit of modern philosophy that we may well ask if there is anything really philosophical in Dionysius' practice? The answer has to be affirmative, for there is a perfectly reasonable pattern to the whole of Dionysius' works. In addition, Dionysius regards his own task as a kind of demonstration (apodeixis) or showing (deixai). In the Divine Names, such demonstration is given a Pauline resonance when Dionysius states that we should hold to the scriptural revelation of divine names “not in the persuasive words of human wisdom, but in demonstration of the power granted by the Spirit” (DN 585b; cf. Paul 1 Cor 2–4). In other words, Dionysius here sees scripture as providing the basis for a deeper understanding of attribution or predication that will lead us beyond our own merely human capacities. That such a demonstration involves the unpacking of the symbolic, contemplative, and mystical significances of ordinary things by the aid of scriptural testimony is clear in the Ecclesiastical Hierarchy, which again starts from Dionysius' purpose of demonstrating what the hierarchy comprises; and that this includes arguments, reasons, the possibility of debate and even improvement upon Dionysius' demonstrations by his interlocutor becomes clear too at the end of the work, when the literary humility that is characteristic of his writing (cf. EH 568a ff.; DN 981c–984a; CH 340b) shows itself to be philosophically justified by Dionysius' ability to set out both sides of the case for and against infant baptism in the understanding that he may not fully be in possession of the most complete view of the situation and that his interlocutor should “use” what he has said “as steps (epanabathmois) to a higher ray of light” (EH 568d–569a). This is a thought couched in terms very reminiscent of Socrates' wish in the Republic to subvert or destroy hypotheses and use them as stepping stones to something better, and it is also a thought not unworthy of Wittgenstein's similar view at the end of the Tractatus. The words immediately following make clear the connection between charity of interpretation, open-endedness and demonstration: “Be generous with me then, my dear friend,… and show (deixon) to my eyes that more beautiful and unified beauty which you may be able to see”. Demonstration in this sense, then, includes much of what we might consider to be properly philosophical, but at root it is also a form of “divine reading” (lectio divina, or meditative, prayerful reading) of nature and word, a receptive recognition as a kind of method or making one's way “to hear the sacred words as receptively as possible, to be open to the divine workings of God, to clear an uplifting path (hodopoiesis) toward that inheritance that awaits us in heaven, and to accept our most divine and sacred regeneration” (EH 392a).

5. Afterlife: Significance and Influence

In sum, Dionysius represents the instantaneous resonances, possible in unusual circumstances, between forms of thought and practice that may at first sight appear entirely divergent. He is therefore in some respects a dangerous thinker, yet at the same time a forger of new possibilities:

  1. Partly because as a Christian he cannot accept at face value the Neoplatonic view of the One as excluding trinity, Dionysius forges a new way of thinking about God by linking beyond-beingness with unrestricted being and by combining in God's transcendent love both power and a kind of hyperessential, erotic vulnerability. In the first instance, he provides a fruitful link between philosophies based upon a transcendent principle beyond being (for example, the Good) and philosophies of being, and in the second instance he suggests a loving God whom, in the Judaeo-Christian tradition, it makes sense to address in prayer. At the same time, however, this standpoint leaves room, from a modern viewpoint particularly, for interreligious dialogue since, while it is certainly a Christian view, it also remains radically open-ended.
  2. He also succeeds in transposing Pagan Neoplatonism into a complete Christian theology, from the Trinity and the angelic world through the incarnation and redemption to the sacramental life and orders of the Church, and extending to the old Law, and provides not only a symbolic and mystical explanation, but a profound reconsideration of the importance of liturgical practice as a response to both the hidden and the more manifest divine workings of grace in scripture, ritual, morality, law and even material things.
  3. Together with scripture, the Fathers, and the entire ancient tradition, he provides a framework and a vocabulary for ordinary spirituality as well as mystical practice, especially for describing the approach of the soul through inactivity of all knowledge to a state of unification with God “in the brilliant darkness of a hidden silence” (MT 1); and his complex negative theology transmits a theory of signification that in many ways is so self-subversive and necessarily deceptive at each level (both kataphatic and apophatic) that for future generations after his own time it will hardly be possible to translate his works without also writing commentaries upon them.
  4. In addition, Dionysius' view of the visible created universe was to have a marked influence for two reasons, first, because his vivid sense of the aesthetic and imaginative beauty of the sensible universe, pervaded from the perspective of divine beauty by interrelatedness and harmony (see esp. DN 7), came to inspire Abbot Suger's program for a new architecture, the Gothic cathedral, and, second, because Dionysius also took account of ugliness, defect, resistance, and evil by his theory of evil as privation and non-being, a theory adopted from Plotinus (with significant changes) and Proclus and destined to have further influence upon Aquinas in medieval times and Ficino in the Renaissance.

For the long commentary tradition, from John of Scythopolis to Aquinas and Ficino, see bibliography 2 below. St. Gregory the Great refers to Dionysius in his own commentary on the angels and probably had the complete works at Rome. But the study of Dionysius did not take off in the Latin West until the Byzantine emperor Michael the Stammerer sent a copy of the Dionysian corpus as a gift to the Frankish king Louis the Pious in 827. This copy served as the source of the first translations of Dionysius into Latin. The first translation, made around 838 by Hilduin, abbot of a monastery near Paris (who identified Dionysius not only as St. Dionysius the Areopagite but also as the first bishop of Paris), was so unintelligible that Charles II asked the great Irish philosopher, John Scottus Eriugena, to make a new translation that he completed in 862 and that was subsequently revised with clarifications in 875. The influence of Dionysius is profound in Eriugena's own thought as it would be later in the Franciscan tradition (especially Grosseteste and Bonaventure) and also to a lesser extent in the Dominican (both Albert and Aquinas wrote commentaries). In fact, the abiding-procession-return triad may be said to form the essential structure of Aquinas' unfinished masterpiece, the Summa Theologica. The influence of Dionysius' ideas pervades not only the Italian and English Renaissance, but also the Rhineland mystical writers, such as Meister Eckhart (d. 1327), Tauler (d. 1361), Ruysbroeck (d. 1381), Gerson (d. 1429), and later Denis the Carthusian (d. 1471) and Nicholas of Cusa (d. 1464) (whose work On Learned Ignorance owes a debt to Dionysius' agnosia or unknowingness, as does also the anonymous author of the Cloud of Unknowing) and the great Spanish mystics, for example, St. John of the Cross (d. 1591). In the Greek East, Dionysius' On the Ecclesiastical Hierarchy inspired a series of liturgical commentaries, beginning with the Mystagogy of Maximus the Confessor (d. 662) and continuing with works by Germanus of Constantinople (d. 733) and Nicholas Cabasilas (d. 1390). Dionysius played a major role in the Palamite controversy of the 14th century, cited both by Gregory Palamas (d. 1359) and by his opponents. In the modern world, Dionysius has received less attention, though he is of some importance for 19th century German Idealist thought and also to a lesser extent for English and American Romanticism. In the so-called “postmodern” world, however, two thinkers who have written about Dionysius with great insight are Jean-Luc Marion and Jacques Derrida. Derrida, in particular, has been one of the few contemporary philosophical thinkers, if not the only one, to realize the importance of Dionysius in relation to deconstruction (a term he does not use himself) and to explore the complex nature of prayer, address, and denial in the context of the necessarily deceptive and open-ended possibilities of negative theology.

6. Outline of the Works

On the Divine Names

Chs. 1–3: methodological introduction: how the divine names do and do not know God (ch. 1); how they are a result of differentiation and unity in God (ch. 2); the necessity of prayer, and the degree of differentiation in Dionysius’ own treatise, compared with the scriptures and the work of his predecessors (ch. 3)
Ch. 4: the name of “good,” with its allied names of “light,” “beauty,” “love,” and “jealousy;” the nature of evil
Chs. 5–7: the names of the Neoplatonic triad: “being” (ch. 5), “life” (ch. 6), and “intellect” (ch. 7) with its allied name of “word”
Ch. 8: the name of “power” with its allied names of “righteousness” and “salvation”
Ch. 9: names derived from Neoplatonic categories of being: “same” and “different,” “rest” and “motion,” “similarity” and “dissimilarity,” and others
Ch. 10: names referring to time, such as “ancient of days” and “eternity”
Ch. 11: the name of “peace;” whether the names exist in themselves, and how they exist in God
Ch. 12: names of governance, such as “king of kings” and “lord of lords”
Ch. 13: the names “perfect” and “one”

Mystical Theology

Ch. 1: introduction, and allegory of Moses’ ascent up Mt. Sinai
Ch. 2: mystical theology compared to carving a statue
Ch. 3: explanatory outline of Dionysius’ theological works; comparison of affirmative and negative theology
Chs. 4–5: negative theology in action, negating first sensible things and their characteristics (ch. 4), then divine names and theological representations (ch. 5)

On the Celestial Hierarchy

Chs.1–2: methodological introduction: how we receive divine illumination (ch. 1) and how we use names to describe God and the angels (ch. 2)
Ch. 3: general definition of hierarchy
Ch. 4: description of the celestial hierarchy
Ch. 5: the meaning of “angel”
Ch. 6–10: the nine ranks of angels identified (ch. 6), then explained one by one (chs. 7–9), then summed up in terms of their common mission (ch. 10)
Chs. 11–13: apparent violations of the hierarchic principle: all the angels are referred to as “heavenly powers” (ch. 11), human hierarchs are sometimes called “angels” (ch. 12), and the prophet Isaiah seems to have been purified directly by a seraphim, one of the higher ranks (ch. 13)

On the Ecclesiastical Hierarchy

Ch. 1: definition and explanation of hierarchy; how our hierarchy differs from the celestial hierarchy; origin of the ecclesiastical rites
Ch. 2: contemplation of baptism
Ch. 3: contemplation of communion; systematic description of catechumens, penitents, and possessed
Ch. 4: contemplation of the rite of the ointment
Ch. 5: contemplation of the consecration of bishops, priests, and deacons; description of legal hierarchy; triad of purification, illumination, and perfection
Ch. 6: contemplation of the consecration of a monk
Ch. 7: contemplation of funeral rites; brief comments on intercessory prayer, excommunication, and infant baptism


1–2: to Gaius, on negative theology: how God is beyond knowledge (letter 1) and beyond “God” and “goodness” (letter 2)
3–4: to Gaius, on the incarnation of Christ: its “suddenness” (letter 3) and how it manifests a single “theandric” activity of the divine and human natures (letter 4)
5: to Dorotheus, on negative theology, with scriptural references
6: to Sosipater, against polemics
7: to Polycarp, against polemics, and on miracles
8: to Demophilus, on obeying superiors in the hierarchy
9: to Titus, on symbolic theology
10: to John, on evil and suffering


Text and Translations

  • Patrologia Graeca, v. 3–4, ed. J. P. Migne, Paris 1857–66.
  • Corpus Dionysiacum I (DN), ed. B. R. Suchla, Berlin: De Gruyter, 1990.
  • Corpus Dionysiacum II (CH, EH, MT, Letters), eds. G. Heil and A. M. Ritter, Berlin: De Gruyter, 1991.
  • Dionysius the Areopagite: The Divine Names and Mystical Theology, trans. C. E. Rolt, London: Society for the Propagation of Christian Knowledge, 1920.
  • Pseudo-Dionysius: The Complete Works, trans. C. Luibheid and P. Rorem, London: Society for the Promotion of Christian Knowledge, 1987.
  • Pseudo-Denys l’Aréopagite. Oeuvres complètes. Traduction, préface et note, Paris: Aubier, 1980.
  • Pseudo-Dionysius: The Divine Names and Mystical Theology, trans. J. Jones, Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press, 1980.
  • Pseudo-Dionysius Areopagita. Die Namen Gottes, trans. B. R. Suchla, Stuttgart: Hiersemann, 1988.
  • Pseudo-Dionysius Areopagita. Uber die himmlische Hierarchie. Uber die Kirchliche Hierarchie, trans. G. Heil, Stuttgart: Hiersemann, 1986.
  • Pseudo-Dionysius Areopagita. Uber die mystische Theologie und Briefe, Stuttgart: Hiersemann, 1994.
  • The Works of Dionysius the Areopagite, trans. J. Parker, London: Parker, 1897.

Patristic and medieval commentaries

  • John of Scythopolis et al., c. 530, Scholia, ed. P. Corderius, Patrologia Cursus Completus, Series Graeca 4, Paris: Migne 1857–91. (Annotations from the Patristic period)
  • Johannes Scottus Eriugena, c. 860–70, Expositiones in Ierarchiam coelestem (Commentaries on CH), ed. J. Barbet, Corpus Christianorum, Continuatio Mediaevalis 31, Turnhout: Brepols, 1975.
  • Hugh of St. Victor, c.1220–30, Commentariorum in Hierarchiam coelestem Sancti Dionysii Areopagitae (Commentary on CH), Patrologia Cursus Completus, Series Latinus 175, Paris: Migne, 1844–80.
  • Gallus, Thomas, 1242, Thomas Gallus: Grand commentaire sur la Théologie Mystique (Commentary on MT), ed. G. Thery, Paris: Haloua, 1934.
  • Grosseteste, Robert, c. 1240–3, Mystical Theology: The Glosses by Thomas Gallus and the Commentary of Robert Grosseteste on “De Mystica Theologia”, ed. J. McEvoy, Leuven: Peeters, 2003.
  • Albert the Great, c. 1250–60, Super Dionysium de divinis nominibus (Commentary on DN), ed. P. Simon in Opera omnia, vol. 37, part 1, Munster: Aschendorff, 1972.
  • Aquinas, Thomas, c. 1265–8, In librum beati Dionysii De divinis nominibus expositio (Commentary on DN), ed. C. Pera, Turin: Marietti, 1950.
  • Chevallier, P. (ed.), 1937–50, Dionysiaca: Receuil donnant l’ensemble des traditions latines des ouvrages attribués au Denys de l’Aréopagrite, Bruges: Desclée de Brouwer, 2 vols: repr. Stuttgart, 1989 (with translations by Hilduin, Eriugena, John Sarracenus, Grosseteste, Ficino and others.)

Secondary sources

  • de Andia, Y., 1996, L’union à Dieu chez Denys l’Aréopagite, Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • Beggiani, S. J., 1996, “Theology at the Service of Mysticism: Method in Pseudo-Dionysius,” Theological Studies, 57: 201–223
  • Brons, B., 1976, Gott und die Seienden. Untersuchungen zum Verhaltnis von neuplatonischer Metaphysik and christlicher Tradition bei Dionysius Areopagita (God and Beings: An Examination of the Relationship between Neoplatonist Metaphysics and Christian Tradition in Dionysius the Areopagite), Gottingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht.
  • Corrigan, K., 1996, ‘“Solitary” mysticism in Plotinus, Proclus, Gregory of Nyssa, and Pseudo-Dionysius,’ The Journal of Religion, 28–42.
  • –––, 2004, Reading Plotinus: A Practical Introduction to Neoplatonism, Indiana: Purdue University Press
  • Finan, T. and Twomey, V. (eds.), 1992, The Relationship Between Neoplatonism and Christianity, Dublin.
  • Gersh, S., 1978, From Iamblichus to Eriugena: An Investigation of the Prehistory and Evolution of the Pseudo-Dionysian Tradition, Leiden: Brill.
  • Harrington, L. M., 2004, A Thirteenth-Century Textbook of Mystical Theology at the University of Paris, Leuven: Peeters.
  • –––., 2004, Sacred Place in Early Medieval Neoplatonism, New York: Palgrave.
  • Hathaway, R., 1969, Hierarchy and the Definition of Order in the Letters of Pseudo-Dionysius, The Hague.
  • Koch, J., 1956–7, ‘Augustinischer und Dionysischer Neuplatonismus und das Mittelalter’ (Augustinian and Dionysian Neoplatonism in the Middle Ages), Kantstudien 48: 117–33; repr. in W. Beierwaltes, Platonismus in der Philosophie des Mittelalters, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1969, 317–42.
  • Louth, A., 1989, Denys, the Areopagite, Wilton, CT: Morehouse-Barlow
  • McGinn, B., 1994, The Foundations of Mysticism. Origins to the Fifth Century, New York: Crossroads, 157–82. (and also see appendixes)
  • O’Daly, G., 1981, ‘Dionysius Areopagita’, Theologische Realenzyklopadie, 8: 772–80
  • Perl, E. D., 2008, Theophany: The Neoplatonic Philosophy of Dionysius the Areopagite, Albany: SUNY.
  • O’Rourke, F., 1992, Pseudo-Dionysius and the Metaphysics of Aquinas, Leiden: Brill.
  • Roques, R., 1954, L’univers Dionysien. Stucture hierarchique du monde selon le Pseudo-Denys (The Dionysian Universe: The Hierarchical Structure of the World According to Pseudo-Dionysius), Paris: Aubier; repr. Paris: Editions du Cerf, 1983.
  • Roques, R. et al., 1954, ‘Denys l’Areopagite (le Pseudo-)’, Dictionnaire de spiritualite ascetique et mystique doctrine et histoire, vol. 3, 244–429.
  • Rorem, P., 1993, Pseudo-Dionysius: A Commentary on the Texts and an Introduction to their Influence, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Sheldon-Williams, I. P., 1970, ‘The Pseudo-Dionysius’, in A. H. Armstong (ed.) The Cambridge History of Later Greek and Early Medieval Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Stang, C., 2012, Apophasis and Pseudonymity in Dionysius the Areopagite: ‘No Longer I’, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Turner, Denys, 1995, The Darkness of God. Negativity in Christian Mysticism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 19–49.
  • Vanneste, J., 1959, Le mystère de Dieu, Brussels: Desclée de Brouwer.
  • Völker, W., 1958, Kontemplation und Ekstase bei Pseudo-Dionysius Areopagita, Wiesbaden.
  • Wallis, R. T., 1972, Neoplatonism, 2nd edition with a foreward and bibliography by Lloyd P. Gerson (1995) London, UK; Indianapolis, Indiana, USA: Duckworth, Hackett.

Suggestions for further reading

On the Celestial Hierarchy

  • Battisti, G. S., 1983, “Strutture e figure retoriche nel ‘de Caelesti Hierarchia’ dello Pseudo-Dionigi: Un mezzo di espressione dell’ ontologia Neoplatonica,” Archivio di Filosofia, 51: 293–319.
  • Duclow, D. F., 1994, “Isaiah meets the seraph: Breaking ranks in Dionysius and Eriugena?” Eriugena: East and West, Notre Dame: Notre Dame University Press, 233–52.
  • Lilla, S., 1986, “Note sulla Gerarchia Celeste dello Ps. Dionigi l’Areopagita,” Augustinianum, 26: 519–73.
  • Sheldon-Williams, I. P., 1972, “Henads and Angels: Proclus and the Pseudo-Dionysius,” Studia Patristica, 11: 65–71.

Dionysian Sources: Neoplatonic or Christian?

  • Golitzin, A., 1993, “The Mysticism of Dionysius Areopagita: Platonist or Christian?” Mystics Quarterly, 19: 98–114.
  • Louth, A., 1986, “Pagan Theurgy and Christian Sacramentalism in Denys the Areopagite,” Journal of Theological Studies 37: 432–8.
  • Rist, J., 1992, “Pseudo-Dionysius, Neoplatonism and the Weakness of the Soul,” in H. J. Van Westra (ed.) From Athens to Chartres: Neoplatonism and Medieval Thought, Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • Saffrey H. D., 1982, ‘New Objective Links between the Pseudo-Dionysius and Proclus’, in D. J. O’Meara (ed.) Neoplatonism and Christian Thought, Norfolk, VA: International Society for Neoplatonic Studies, 65–74.
  • Shaw, G., 1999, “Neoplatonic Theurgy and Dionysius the Areopagite,” Journal of Early Christian Studies, 7: 573–99.

On the Divine Names

  • Corsini, E., 1962, Il trattato ‘De divinis nominibus’ dello Pseudo-Dionigi e i commenti neoplatonici al Parmenide, Torino.
  • Janowitz, N., 1991, “Theories of Divine Names in Origen and Pseudo-Dionysius,” History of Religions, 30 May: 359–372.
  • Suchla, B. R., 1996, “Wahrheit über jeder Wahrheit: Zur philosophischen Absicht der Schrift ‘De Divinis Nominibus’ des Dionysius Areopagita,” Theologische Quartalschrift 176: 205–17.

Ecclesiastical Hierarchy

  • Golitzin, A., 1994, Et Introibo ad Altare Dei, Thessalonica: Patriarchikon Idruma Paterikon Meleton; George Dedousis.
  • Harrington, L. M., 2004, Sacred Place in Early Medieval Neoplatonism, New York: Palgrave.
  • Perl, E., 1994, “Hierarchy and Participation in Dionysius the Areopagite and Greek Neoplatonism,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, 68: 15–30.
  • Wesche, P., 1989, “Christological Doctrine and Liturgical Interpretation in Pseudo-Dionysius,” St. Vladimir’s Theological Quarterly, 33: 53–73.

Influence on Medieval Philosophy

  • de Andia, Y., 1997, Denys l’aréopagite et sa postérité en Orient et en Occident, Paris: Institut d’Études Augustiniennes.
  • Boiadjiev, T.; Kapriev, G.; and Speer, A. (eds.), 2000, Die Dionysius-Rezeption im Mittelalter, Turnhout: Brepols.
  • Dondaine, H. F., 1953, Le corpus dionysien de l’université de Paris au XIIIe siècle, Rome: Edizioni di Storia e Letteratura.
  • Harrington, L. M., 2004, A Thirteenth-Century Textbook of Mystical Theology at the University of Paris, Leuven: Peeters.
  • Rorem, P. and Lamoreaux, J., 1998, John of Scythopolis and the Dionysian Corpus: Annotating the Areopagite, Oxford: Clarendon Press.


  • Bader, G., 1989, “Gott nennen: Von Götternamen zu göttlichen Namen: Zur Vorgeschichte der Lehre von den göttlichen Eigenschaften,” Zeitschrift für Theologie und Kirche, 86: 306–54.
  • Breton, S., 1994, “Superlatif et négation: Comment dire la Transcendance?” Revue des sciences philosophiques et théologiques, 78: 193–202.
  • Gersh, S., 1978, From Iamblichus to Eriugena: An Investigation of the Prehistory and Evolution of the Pseudo-Dionysian Tradition, Leiden: Brill.
  • Scazzoso, P., 1967, Ricerche sulla Struttura del Linguaggio dello Pseudo-Dionigi Areopagita, Milan: Società Editrice Vita e Pensiero.
  • Turner, Denys, 1995, The Darkness of God. Negativity in Christian Mysticism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 19–49.


  • Osborne, C., 1994, Eros Unveiled, Oxford: Clarendon.
  • Rist, J., 1966, “A Note on Eros and Agape in the Pseudo-Dionysius,” Vigiliae christianae, 20: 235-43.
  • de Vogel, C. J., 1981, “Greek Cosmic Love and the Christian Love of God,” Vigiliae christianae, 35: 57–84.

Mystical Theology

  • Carabine, D., 1995, The Unknown God: Negative Theology in the Platonic Tradition: Plato to Eriugena, Louvain: Peeters.
  • Lossky, V., 1939, “La théologie négative dans la doctrine de Denys l’Aréopagite,” Revue des sciences philosophiques et théologiques, 28: 204–21.
  • Rist, J., 1964, “Mysticism and Transcendence in Later Neoplatonism,” Hermes, 92: 213–25.
  • Williams, J., 1999, “The Apophatic Theology of Dionysius the Pseudo-Areopagite,” Downside Review, 117: 157-172.

Postmodern Dionysians

  • Derrida, J., 1987, “Comment ne pas parler: Dénégations,” Psyché: Inventions de l’autre, Galilée: 584–95.
  • Marion, J.-L., 1977, L’idole et la distance, Paris: Editions Bernard Grasset.
  • Marion, J.-L., 1982, Dieu sans l’être: Hors-texte, Paris: Librairie Arthème Fayard.

Symbolic Theology

  • Roques, R., 1957, “Symbolisme et theologie negative chez le Pseudo-Denys,” Bulletin de l’association Guillaume Budé.
  • Rorem, P., 1984, Biblical and Liturgical Symbols within the Pseudo-Dionysian Synthesis, Toronto.
  • Schmemann, A., 1981, “Symbols and Symbolism in the Orthodox Liturgy,” Orthodox Theology and Diakonia, Brookline, Massachusetts: Hellenic College Press.

Other Internet Resources

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