Notes to Quantum Approaches to Consciousness

1. Examples for non-trivial quantum effects in biological systems are: coherent excitations of biomolecules, quantum tunneling of protons, van der Waals forces, ultrafast dynamics through conical intersections, phonon-assisted electron tunneling as the basis for smell, entangled states in photosynthesis, mechanisms for magnetoreception in the avian compass. For a competent review of these examples and more see Huelga and Plenio (2013).

2. This statement reflects a philosophical position which is known as incompatibilism. It is more or less implicitly shared by most scientists thinking about the options quantum theory offers for free will. On a compatibilist presumption, free will does not necessarily contradict determinism(see the entries on compatibilism and arguments for incompatibilism). For more details see the volume by Kane (1996), who invokes indeterministic quantum events in his own account of free will. Another, new approach toward a “stochastic libertarianism” is addressed in Section 4.7 (Müller and Briegel 2014).

3. Although materialism and physicalism are often used interchangeably, it is useful to distinguish them if one does not wish to commit oneself to the assumption that neurobiology is completely reducible to fundamental physics. For this reason, I will refer to the material rather than the physical throughout this entry.

4. See Atmanspacher and beim Graben (2007) for a more detailed discussion of contextual conditions in the description of emergent properties in physics and in cognitive neuroscience.

5. A less controversial notion in addressing this issue could be in terms of constraints that mental state impose on brain states.

6. The abbreviation NMDA refers to N-methyl-D-aspartate, the synthetic agonist that activates NMDA receptors.

7. Notice that von Neumann's chain of observing systems stays always in the material domain. When he refers to subjective (mental) experiences, he presupposes some psychophysical parallelism allowing him to treat these experiences as brain processes.

8. In his later writings, he repudiated this point of view about the role of consciousness, stating that "it is outside the realm of quantum mechanics" (Wigner, 1977).

9. A critical discussion of the problems for Wigner's approach to measurement, together with the presentation of alternatives, can be found in Esfeld (1999).

10. Margenau's notion of latent observables (Margenau, 1950) and d'Espagnat's notion of an independent reality (d'Espagnat, 1999) are similar ways to achieve such an ontological interpretation of quantum theory.

11. Related proposals based on a similar idea are due to Fröhlich (1968) and Pribram (1971).

12. Interestingly, a ecent study shows that gravitation seems to be necessary for the development of an ordered network of microtubuli (Papaseit et al., 2000). But there is no obvious relation between this result and objective state reduction.

13. This idea can be traced back to early work by Claude Bernard in the mid 19th century. It was backed up 50 years later by Hans Meyer and Charles Overton who found significant correlations between the potency of anesthetic gases in animals and their solubility in a hydrophobic environment resembling olive oil.

14. Emphatically, Spencer-Brown (1969, Chap. 1) proposed such a procedure as the basis of all cognitive activity: “We take as given the idea of distinction and the idea of indication, and that we cannot make an indication without drawing a distinction.”

15. The pioneering quantum conception of information is von Weizsäcker's ur-theory (Weizsäcker, 1985), most prominent is Wheeler's ‘it from bit’ (Wheeler 1994), most recent are proposals by Zeilinger (Brukner and Zeilinger 2003), Fuchs (2002), and Clifton etal. (2003). See also Chalmers (1996) for a discussion of information-based dual aspects.

16. It is obvious that the term ‘mental’ is used here with a connotation more general than that of consciousness. Preconscious, subconscious, and unconscious domains, personal and collective, are included as well.

Copyright © 2015 by
Harald Atmanspacher <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free

The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007. Readers who have benefited from the SEP are encouraged to examine the NEH’s anniversary page and, if inspired to do so, send a testimonial to