Notes to Quotation

1. To follow this text, pay close attention to the difference between single quotes and double quotes. Double quotes are used to quote quotations. Triple quotes to quote quotations of quotations. Etc.

2. See Munro (1982) for a challenge to the claim that the ‘says’ of direct reporting is transitive.

3. Partee (1971, p. 411) also discusses the phenomenon but does not go on to theorize about it since, according to her, ‘such sentences do not occur in ordinary spoken language’. We disagree. Were you to hear someone utter:

John said with a heavy Jersey accent that he ‘ain't gonna take it anymore’

you would almost certainly take some of the material after ‘he’ as mixed quoted

4. At least one author (Gomez-Torrente 2001), however, thinks that Q3 is ‘less important than the other two’ questions. He believes that distinct answers to Q1 and Q2 ‘can be supplemented with any of a series of different answers to’ Q3.

5. Note that this characterization of (D2) should be read as neutral over whether it is ‘Jim’ or the quoted expression, ‘’Jim’’ that is used to talk about ‘Jim’. An initial characterization of the use-mention distinction should remain neutral on that question.

6. For Quine and Tarski, the Description Theory was largely presented as an alternative to natural language quotation, and not as an analysis of natural language; this was not so for Geach.

7. Similar views are intimated in Prior (1971, pp. 60-61) and Christensen (1967); Partee (1973, pp. 416-18) was also an early adherent. An interesting historical factoid: Davidson's paper was drafted in the early 1960's and circulated among various philosophers and linguists. It is, for example, referenced in Partee 1973, some six years before its publication date.

8. There is a separate issue about how best to treat the semantics of indirect discourse. Davidson, of course, has a demonstrative view about that as well (cf., Davidson 1968).

9. For a defense of Davidson's theory of indirect discourse against its opponents, cf., Lepore and Loewer (1989).

10. For further criticisms surrounding the use of a demonstrative in the logical form of a quotation sentence, see Seymour (1994, pp. 16ff).

11. One possibility is to quantify over literally everything, or at least everything that can be put between quotation marks.

12. According to Washington, Searle endorses the same view when he writes that in quotation ‘a word is uttered…but not in its normal use. The word itself is presented and then talked about, and that it is to be taken as presented rather than used conventionally to refer is indicated by the quotes’ (Searle 1969, p. 76). (Gomez (2001) challenges Washington's claim that Searle is an Identity Theorist.)

13. Washington tries also to locate a commitment to the Identity Theory in this passage from Frege: ‘If words are used in the ordinary way, what one intends to speak of is what they mean. It can also happen, however, that one wishes to talk about the words themselves or their sense. This happens, for instance, when the words of another are quoted. One's own words then first designate words of the other speaker, and only the latter have their usual meaning. We then have signs of signs. In writing, the words are in this case enclosed in quotation marks. Accordingly, a word standing between quotation marks must not be taken as having its ordinary meaning’ Frege (1892, p. 58). We find this passage insufficiently clear to establish what Frege's view on quotation is. For an alternative interpretation of Frege on quotation, see Parsons (1982).

14. Saka summarizes the relationship between quotation and mention as follows:

As a consequence of my account, the mention of X and the use of ‘X’ quite properly secure the same reference. Further, whereas the use-mention distinction is characterized in terms of the speaker's intentions, the distinction between a quotation and a non-quotation is a formal, grammatical affair. Distinguishing between use and mention in a language without quote marks is a purely pragmatic affair, but in a language with quote marks mentioning can be explicitly marked (although such marking is not obligatory). Saka (1998, p.128)

15. A particularly interesting and illuminating consequence of this view is that quotations can be both used and mentioned. See Saka (1998, p. 128) for further discussion.

16. Or (given that several words are quoted) the more complex: Quine said that quotation Ted Sally Bill Jane Peter.

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Copyright © 2012 by
Herman Cappelen <h.w.cappelen@ifikk.uio.no>
Ernest Lepore <lepore@ruccs.rutgers.edu>

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