Supplement to Instrumental Rationality

Problems for Wide-Scoping

When we combine the view that one ought to be instrumentally coherent as such with the wide-scope formulation of the rational requirement, it doesn't follow, in our example, that one ought to kill one's rival. Rather, it only follows that one ought to either revise the intention to stay in power, or revise the belief that one will do so only if one intends to kill one's rival, or intend to kill one's rival.

1. Unalterable Ends and Transmission

But now suppose that you are unable to alter your intention to stay in power and unable to alter your instrumental belief. So, the only way you can comply with the wide-scope ought—the claim that you ought to either revise the intention to stay in power, or revise the belief that you'll do so only if you intend to kill your rival, or intend to kill your rival—is by intending to kill your rival. In other words, intending to kill your rival is a necessary means for complying with the wide-scope ought. If we apply the transmission principle:

Ought Necessity:
If one ought to E, and M is a necessary means to E-ing, then one ought to M.

then we get the result that you ought to intend to kill your rival. The wide-scope strategy is thus also unable to avoid this implausible result when ends and means-end beliefs are unalterable. (See Setiya 2007, who draws upon Greenspan 1975. See also Schroeder 2009 and Bedke 2009).

A similar problem would arise if we say that there is a reason to be instrumentally coherent. Suppose we say that there is a reason to either revise the intention to stay in power or revise the belief that one will do so only if one intends to kill one's rival, or intend to kill one's rival. Now suppose that both the end and belief are unalterable, and we apply a similar transmission principle:

Weak Reasons Necessity:
If one has reason to E, and M is a necessary means to E-ing, then that is some reason to M. (Variations on this principle are defended in Bratman 2009c, §5 and Schroeder 2009, §5.)

We then get the implausible result that there is a reason to intend to kill one's rival. (If we accept Strong Reasons Necessity, then this transmitted reason to intend to kill one's rival would be at least as strong as the reason to be instrumentally rational.)

One could respond to these arguments by challenging the relevant transmission principles (see the discussion in §2 of the main text, and see Way 2010). Another strategy of response would be to argue that when one's ends and beliefs are unalterable, the reason to be instrumentally coherent is no longer in place. If that reason is no longer in place, then there is no reason to be transmitted, and hence no implausible result would follow from the application of a transmission principle. Bratman (2009c) presents an argument along these lines. In Bratman's view, we have a reason to be instrumentally coherent only because we have a reason to be self-governing. But when one is no longer capable of revising one's ends, one is no longer capable of self-governance in that domain. Hence, the reason to be instrumentally coherent disappears.

Bratman acknowledges that there are two potential difficulties facing such a strategy. First, even if it's true that the reason to be instrumentally coherent disappears in such cases, the rational requirement to be instrumentally coherent does not. So, this strategy involves conceding that there are some cases in which one does not have a reason to be instrumentally coherent. Second, it's not clear that an inability to revise one's ends always makes one incapable of self-governance. For instance, suppose that one is unaware that one is unable to revise one's ends, but, after careful reflection and deliberation, one decides to intend the means. That seems to involve self-governance. So, self-governance is possible here. But that means, on Bratman's view, there would be a reason to be instrumentally coherent that would transmit, yielding the implausible result (Brunero 2010).

2. Reasons for Disjunctions and Transmission

Joseph Raz argues that if one ought, or even just has a reason, to bring about a disjunctive state of affairs—that is, to bring it about that either P or Q—then one has a reason to bring it about that P and a reason to bring it about that Q. He argues that “[p]eople have reason to do what will bring them into conformity with reasons that apply to them” (Raz 2005a, 3). (This is roughly equivalent to Weak Reasons Sufficiency, formulated in §2 of the main text.) Since bringing it about that P will bring it about that one conforms to the reason one has to bring it about that either P or Q, one has a reason to bring it about that P. And, by the same reasoning, one has a reason to bring it about that Q.

So, if we say that one ought, or has a reason, to bring it about that either one doesn't intend to stay in power, or one doesn't believe intending to kill one's rival is necessary to stay in power, or one intends to kill one's rival, then it follows that one has a reason for each disjunct. In particular, it follows that one has a reason to intend to kill one's rival. And this seems implausible (see Bedke 2009, §2.a). So, the combination of Raz's transmission principle with the thesis that one ought, or has reason, to be instrumentally coherent yields an implausible result.

Raz's transmission principle can be challenged. The counterexample to Weak Reasons Sufficiency (in §1 of the main text) applies to it: suppose you have a reason to alleviate pangs of hunger and there are two ways to do this: eating the sandwich or killing yourself. It follows from Raz's principle that you have a reason to kill yourself (Broome 2005b). (See also Way 2010 and Rippon 2011 for critical discussion of Raz's transmission principle.)

One could respond by accepting the allegedly implausible result that one has a reason to kill oneself (Raz 2005a; Bedke 2009). And, as we noted in §2 of the main text, there may be a pragmatic explanation of why it sounds odd to say that there is a reason to kill oneself. Why bother to identify any reason to kill oneself when it is vastly outweighed by the reasons against doing so? (Raz 2005a; Schroeder 2005a, 2007).

A problem with this response, however, is that it would work equally well in defense of the claim that one has a reason to be instrumentally rational. Recall that the supposed problem here was that if there is a reason to be instrumentally rational, and Raz's transmission principle is correct, then it follows that the person who intends to stay in power, believes intending to kill his rival is necessary to do so, but doesn't intend to kill his rival, would have a reason to intend to kill his rival. But one could equally well accept this conclusion, emphasize that the reason here is greatly outweighed, and appeal to the pragmatics of reasons discourse to explain why it sounds odd to say there is such a reason (Schroeder 2005a).

3. Symmetry

The wide-scope interpretation of instrumental coherence is also subject to objections independently of its combination with the thesis that one ought, or has reason, to be instrumentally coherent. One objection concerns the “symmetry” among ways of escaping from instrumental incoherence on the wide-scope account. There are three ways an instrumentally incoherent agent could come to comply with the wide-scope requirement: by intending the means, by dropping the end, or by abandoning the belief that intending the means is necessary for achieving the end. Proceeding in any of these ways would bring an incoherent agent from violation of the wide-scope requirement to compliance with it. But, intuitively, not all of these ways of proceeding are on a par as far as rationality goes. Responding by giving up one's means-end belief seems less rational than giving up one's end or intending the means. And giving up an end may seem to be more like escaping from the requirement than coming to comply with it. The wide-scope interpretation of instrumental coherence seems unable to account for these asymmetries. (Symmetry objections to the wide-scope formulations of rational requirements are found in Schroeder 2004, 2005a, 2009; Kolodny 2005; Bedke 2009. For replies to some of these objections, see Way 2011; Brunero 2012; and Shpall forthcoming.)

Copyright © 2013 by
Niko Kolodny <kolodny@berkeley.edu>
John Brunero <bruneroj@umsl.edu>

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