Normative Theories of Rational Choice: Expected Utility

First published Fri Aug 8, 2014

We must often make decisions under conditions of uncertainty. Pursuing a degree in biology may lead to lucrative employment, or to unemployment and crushing debt. A doctor's appointment may result in the early detection and treatment of a disease, or it may be a waste of money. Expected utility theory is an account of how to choose rationally when you are not sure which outcome will result from your acts. Its basic slogan is: choose the act with the highest expected utility.

This article discusses expected utility theory as a normative theory—that is, a theory of how people should make decisions. In classical economics, expected utility theory is often used as a descriptive theory—that is, a theory of how people do make decisions—or as a predictive theory—that is, a theory that, while it may not accurately model the psychological mechanisms of decision-making, correctly predicts people's choices. Expected utility theory makes faulty predictions about people's decisions in many real-life choice situations (see Kahneman & Tversky 1982); however, this does not settle whether people should make decisions on the basis of expected utility considerations.

The expected utility of an act is a weighted average of the utilities of each of its possible outcomes, where the utility of an outcome measures the extent to which that outcome is preferred, or preferable, to the alternatives. The utility of each outcome is weighted according to the probability that the act will lead to that outcome. Section 1 fleshes out this basic definition of expected utility in more rigorous terms, and discusses its relationship to choice. Section 2 discusses two types of arguments for expected utility theory: representation theorems, and long-run statistical arguments. Section 3 considers counterexamples to expected utility theory; section 4 discusses its applications in philosophy of religion, economics, ethics, and epistemology.

1. Defining Expected Utility

The concept of expected utility is best illustrated by example. Suppose I am planning a long walk, and need to decide whether to bring my umbrella. I would rather not tote the umbrella on a sunny day, but I would rather face rain with the umbrella than without it. There are two acts available to me: taking my umbrella, and leaving it at home. Which of these acts should I choose?

This informal problem description can be recast, slightly more formally, in terms of three sorts of entities. First, there are outcomes—objects of non-instrumental preferences. In the example, we might distinguish three outcomes: either I end up dry and unencumbered; I end up dry and encumbered by an unwieldy umbrella; or I end up wet. Second, there are states—things outside the decision-maker's control which influence the outcome of the decision. In the example, there are two states: either it is raining, or it is not. Finally, there are acts—objects of the decision-maker's instrumental preferences, and in some sense, things that she can do. In the example, there are two acts: I may either bring the umbrella; or leave it at home. Expected utility theory provides a way of ranking the acts according to how choiceworthy they are: the higher the expected utility, the better it is to choose the act. (It is therefore best to choose the act with the highest expected utility—or one of them, in the event that several acts are tied.)

Following general convention, I will make the following assumptions about the relationships between acts, states, and outcomes.

  • States, acts, and outcomes are propositions, i.e., sets of possibilities. There is a maximal set of possibilities, $\Omega$, of which each state, act, or outcome is a subset.
  • The set of acts, the set of states, and the set of outcomes are all partitions on $\Omega$. In other words, acts and states are individuated so that every possibility in $\Omega$ is one where exactly one state obtains, the agent performs exactly one act, and exactly one outcome ensues.
  • Acts and states are logically independent, so that no state rules out the performance of any act.
  • I will assume for the moment that, given a state of the world, each act has exactly one possible outcome. (Section 1.1 briefly discusses how one might weaken this assumption.)

So the example of the umbrella can be depicted in the following matrix, where each column corresponds to a state of the world; each row corresponds to an act; and each entry corresponds to the outcome that results when the act is performed in the state of the world.

it rains it does not rain
acts take umbrella encumbered, dry encumbered, dry
leave umbrella wet free, dry

Having set up the basic framework, I can now rigorously define expected utility. The expected utility of an act $A$ (for instance, taking my umbrella) depends on two features of the problem:

  • The value of each outcome, measured by a real number called a utility.
  • The probability of each outcome conditional on $A$.

Given these three pieces of information, $A$'s expected utility is defined as:

\[ EU(A) = \sum_{o \in O} P_{A}(o) U(o) \]

where $O$ is is the set of outcomes, $P_{A}(o)$ is the probability of outcome $o$ conditional on $A$, and $U(o)$ is the utility of $o$.

The next two subsections will unpack the conditional probability function $P_A$ and the utility function $U$.

1.1 Conditional Probabilities

The term $P_{A}(o)$ represents the probability of $o$ given $A$—roughly, how likely it is that outcome $o$ will occur, on the supposition that the agent chooses act $A$. (For the axioms of probability, see the entry on interpretations of probability.) To understand what this means, we must answer two questions. First, which interpretation of probability is appropriate? And second, what does it mean to assign a probability on the supposition that the agent chooses act $A$?

Expected utility theorists often interpret probability as measuring individual degree of belief, so that a proposition $E$ is likely (for an agent) to the extent that that agent is confident of $E$ (see, for instance, Ramsey 1926, Savage 1972, Jeffrey 1983). But nothing in the formalism of expected utility theory forces this interpretation on us. We could instead interpret probabilities as objective chances (as in von Neumann and Morgenstern 1944), or as the degrees of belief that are warranted by the evidence, if we thought these were a better guide to rational action. (See the entry on interpretations of probability for discussion of these and other options.)

What is it to have a probability on the supposition that the agent chooses $A$? Here, there are two basic types of answer, corresponding to evidential decision theory and causal decision theory.

According to evidential decision theory, endorsed by Jeffrey (1983), the relevant conditional probability $P_{A}(o)$ is the conditional probability $P(o \mid A)$, defined as the ratio of two unconditional probabilities: $P(A \amp o) / P(A)$.

Against Jeffrey's definition of expected utility, Spohn (1977) and Levi (1991) object that a decision-maker should not assign probabilities to the very acts under deliberation: when freely deciding whether to perform an act $A$, you shouldn't take into account your beliefs about whether you will perform $A$. If Spohn and Levi are right, then Jeffrey's ratio is undefined (since its denominator is undefined).

Nozick (1969) raises another objection: Jeffrey's definition gives strange results in the following Newcomb Problem. A predictor hands you a closed box, containing either \$0 or \$1 million, and offers you an open box, containing an additional \$1,000. You can either refuse the open box (“one-box”) or take the open box (“two-box”). But there's a catch: the predictor has predicted your choice beforehand, and all her predictions are 90% accurate. In other words, the probability that you one-box, given that she predicts you one-box, is 90%, and the probability that you two-box, given that she predicts you two-box, is 90%. Finally, the contents of the closed box depend on the prediction: if the predictor thought you would two-box, she put nothing in the closed box, while if she thought you would one-box, she put \$1 million in the closed box. The matrix for your decision looks like this:

\$1 million in closed box \$0 in closed box
acts one-box \$1,000,000 \$0
two-box \$1,001,000 $1,000

Two-boxing dominates one-boxing: in every state, two-boxing yields a better outcome. Yet on Jeffrey's definition of conditional probability, one-boxing has a higher expected utility than two-boxing. There is a high conditional probability of finding \$1 million is in the closed box, given that you one-box, so one-boxing has a high expected utility. Likewise, there is a high conditional probability of finding nothing in the closed box, given that you two-box, so two-boxing has a low expected utility.

Causal decision theory is an alternative proposal that gets around these problems. It does not require acts to have probabilities (though it permits them to have probabilities), and it recommends two-boxing in the Newcomb problem.

Causal decision theorists define expected utility using variants on a proposal by Savage (1972). Savage calculates $P_{A}(o)$ by summing the probabilities of states that, when combined with the act $A$, lead to the outcome $o$. Let $f_{A,s}(o)$ be a function that takes on value 1 if $o$ results from performing $A$ in state s, and value 0 otherwise. Then

\[ P_{A}(o) = \sum_{s\in S}P(s)f_{A,s}(o) \]

On Savage's proposal, two-boxing comes out with a higher expected utility than one-boxing. This result holds no matter which probabilities you assign to the states prior to your decision. Let $x$ be the probability you assign to the state that the closed box contains \$1 million. According to Savage, the expected utilities of one-boxing and two-boxing, respectively, are:

\[ x {\cdot} U(\text{\$1,000,000}) + (1 - x) {\cdot} U(\$0) \]


\[ x {\cdot} U(\text{\$1,001,000}) + (1 - x) {\cdot} U(\text{\$1,000}) \]

As long as the larger monetary amounts are assigned strictly larger utilities, the second sum (the utility of two-boxing) is guaranteed to be larger than the first (the utility of one-boxing).

Some versions of causal decision theory look superficially different from Savage's. For instance, Gibbard and Harper (1978/1981) and Stalnaker (1972/1981) propose that $P_{A}(o)$ be understood as the probability of the counterfactual conditional “If $A$ were performed, outcome $o$ would ensue”. But Lewis (1981) shows how the Gibbard/Harper/Stalnaker proposal, as well as a variety of other proposals, can be recast in Savage's terms.

Savage assumes that each act and state are enough to uniquely determine an outcome. But there are cases where this assumption breaks down. Suppose you offer to sell me the following gamble: you will toss a coin; if the coin lands heads, I win \$100; and if the coin lands tails, I lose \$100. But I refuse the gamble, and the coin is never tossed. There is no outcome that would have resulted, had the coin been tossed—I might have won \$100, and I might have lost \$100.

A number of proposals relax Savage's assumption by letting $f_{A,s}$ be a probability function. Lewis (1981), Skyrms (1980), and Sobel (1994) all suggest that $f_{A,s}$ is given by taking the function that would measure the objective chances if s obtained, and conditionalizing that function on $A$.

In some cases—most famously the Newcomb problem—the Jeffrey definition and the Savage definition of expected utility come apart. But whenever the following two conditions are satisfied, they agree.

  • Acts are probabilistically independent of states. In formal terms, for all acts $A$ and states $s$, \[ P(s) = P(s \mid A) = \frac{P(s \amp A)}{P(A)}. \] (This is the condition that is violated in the Newcomb problem.)
  • For all outcomes $o$, acts $A$, and states $s$, $f_{A,s}(o)$ is equal to the conditional probability of $o$ given $A$ and $s$; in formal terms, \[ f_{A,s}(o) = P(o \mid A \amp s) = \frac{P(o \amp A \amp s)}{P(A \amp s)}.\] (The need for this condition arises when acts and states fail to uniquely determine an outcome; see Lewis 1981.)

1.2 Outcome Utilities

The term $U(o)$ represents the utility of the outcome $o$—roughly, how valuable $o$ is. Formally, $U$ is a function that assigns a real number to each of the outcomes. (The units associated with $U$ are typically called utiles, so that if $U(o) = 2$, we say that $o$ is worth 2 utiles.) The greater the utility, the more valuable the outcome.

What kind of value is measured in utiles? Utiles are typically not taken to be units of currency, like dollars, pounds, or yen. Bernoulli (1738) argued that money and other goods have diminishing marginal utility: as an agent gets richer, every successive dollar (or gold watch, or apple) is less valuable to her than the last. He gives the following example: It makes rational sense for a rich man, but not for a pauper, to pay 9,000 ducats in exchange for a lottery ticket that yields a 50% chance at 20,000 ducats and a 50% chance at nothing. Since the lottery gives the two men the same chance at each monetary prize, the prizes must have different values depending on whether the player is poor or rich.

Classic utilitarians such as Bentham (1789), Mill (1861), and Sidgwick (1907) interpreted utility as a measure of pleasure or happiness. For these authors, to say $A$ has greater utility than $B$ (for an agent or a group of agents) is to say that $A$ results in more pleasure or happiness than $B$ (for that agent or group of agents).

One objection to this interpretation of utility is that there may not be a single good (or indeed any good) which rationality requires us to seek. But if we understand “utility” broadly enough to include all potentially desirable ends—pleasure, knowledge, friendship, health and so on—it's not clear that there is a unique correct way to make the tradeoffs between different goods so that each outcome receives a utility. There may be no good answer to the question of whether the life of an ascetic monk contains more or less good than the life of a happy libertine—but assigning utilities to these options forces us to compare them.

Contemporary decision theorists typically interpret utility as a measure of preference, so that to say that $A$ has greater utility than $B$ (for an agent) is simply to say that the agent prefers $A$ to $B$. It is crucial to this approach that preferences hold not just between outcomes (such as amounts of pleasure, or combinations of pleasure and knowledge), but also between uncertain prospects (such as a lottery that pays \$1 million dollars if a particular coin lands heads, and results in an hour of painful electric shocks if the coin lands tails). Section 2 of this article addresses the formal relationship between preference and choice in detail.

Expected utility theory does not require that preferences be selfish or self-interested. Someone can prefer giving money to charity over spending the money on lavish dinners, or prefer sacrificing his own life over allowing his child to die. Sen (1977) suggests that each person's psychology is best represented using the rankings: one representing the person's narrow self-interest, a second representing the person's self-interest construed more broadly to account for feelings of sympathy (e.g., suffering when watching another person suffer), and a third representing the person's commitments, which may require her to act against her self-interest broadly construed.

Broome (1991) interprets utilities as measuring comparisons of objective betterness and worseness, rather than personal preferences: to say that $A$ has a greater utility than $B$ is to say that $A$ is objectively better than $B$. Broome suggests that $A$ is better than $B$ just in case a rational person would prefer $A$ to $B$. Just as there is nothing in the formalism of probability theory that requires us to use subjective rather than objective probabilities, so there is nothing in the formalism of expected utility theory that requires us to use subjective rather than objective values.

Those who interpret utilities in terms of personal preference face a special challenge: the so-called problem of interpersonal utility comparisons. When making decisions about how to distribute shared resources, we often want to know if our acts would make Alice better off than Bob—and if so, how much better off. But if utility is a measure of individual preference, there is no clear, meaningful way of making these comparisons. Alice's utilities are constituted by Alice's preferences, Bob's utilities are constituted by Bob's preferences, and there are no preferences spanning Alice and Bob. We can't assume that Alice's utility 10 is equivalent to Bob's utility 10, any more than we can assume that getting an A grade in differential equations is equivalent to getting an A grade in basket weaving.

Now is a good time to consider which features of the utility function carry meaningful information. Comparisons are informative: if $U(o_1) \gt U(o_2)$ (for a person), then $o_1$ is better than (or preferred to) $o_2$. But it is not only comparisons that are informative—the utility function must carry other information, if expected utility theory is to give meaningful results.

To see why, consider the umbrella example again. This time, I've filled in a probability for each state, and a utility for each outcome.

it rains $(P = 0.6)$ it does not rain $(P = 0.4)$
acts take umbrella encumbered, dry $(U = 5)$ encumbered, dry $(U = 5)$
leave umbrella wet $(U = 0)$ free, dry $(U =10)$

The expected utility of taking the umbrella is

\begin{align} EU(\take)&= P_{\take}(\encumbered, \dry) \cdot 5 \\ & \quad + P_{\take}(\wet) \cdot 0 \\ & \quad + P_{\take}(\free, dry) \cdot 10 \\ &=5 \end{align}

while the expected utility of leaving the umbrella is

\begin{align} EU(\leave)&= P_{\leave}(\encumbered, \dry) \cdot 5 \\ & \quad + P_{\leave}(\wet) \cdot 0 \\ & \quad + P_{\leave}(\free, dry) \cdot 10 \\ &=4 \end{align}

Since $EU(\take) \gt EU(\leave)$, expected utility theory tells me that taking the umbrella is better than leaving it.

But now, suppose we change the utilities of the outcomes: instead of using $U$, we use $U'$.

it rains $(P=0.6)$ it does not rain $(P=0.4)$
acts take umbrella encumbered, dry $(U'=4)$ encumbered, dry $(U'=4)$
leave umbrella wet $(U'=2)$ free, dry $(U'=8)$

The new expected utility of taking the umbrella is

\begin{align} EU'(\take)&= P_{\take}(\encumbered, \dry) \cdot 4 \\ & \quad + P_{\take}(\wet) \cdot 2 \\ & \quad + P_{\take}(\free, dry) \cdot 8 \\ &= 4 \end{align}

while the new expected utility of leaving the umbrella is

\begin{align} EU'(\leave)&= P_{\leave}(\encumbered, \dry) \cdot 4 \\ & \quad + P_{\leave}(\wet) \cdot 2 \\ & \quad + P_{\leave}(\free, dry) \cdot 8 \\ &= 4.4 \end{align}

Since $EU'(\take) \lt EU'(\leave)$, expected utility theory tells me that leaving the umbrella is better than taking it.

The utility functions $U$ and $U'$ rank the outcomes in exactly the same way: free, dry is best; encumbered, dry ranks in the middle; and wet is worst. Yet expected utility theory gives different advice in the two versions of the problem. So there must be some substantive difference between preferences appropriately described by $U$, and preferences appropriately described by $U'$. Otherwise, expected utility theory is fickle, and liable to change its advice when fed different descriptions of the same problem.

When do two utility functions represent the same basic state of affairs? Measurement theory answers the question by characterizing the allowable transformations of a utility function—ways of changing it that leave all of its meaningful features intact. If we characterize the allowable transformations of a utility function, we have thereby specified which of its features are meaningful.

Some analogies from Suppes (2002, 110–118) will be useful here. Consider Moh's scale of mineral hardness, which assigns mineral $m_1$ a higher score than mineral $m_2$ iff $m_1$ can scratch, but cannot be scratched by, $m_2$. Where $H(m)$ is the hardness of $m$ according to Moh's scale, $H(talc)=1$ while $H(topaz) = 8$. Thus, topaz can scratch talc, but talc cannot scratch topaz. Moh's scale is ordinal, meaning that only the order of the numbers is meaningful. Instead of measuring hardness in terms of $H$, we could just as easily measure hardness in terms of any of the following functions:

\begin{align} H'(m) &= 36^{H(m)} \\ H''(m) &= 5H(m) + 17 \\ H'''(m) &= \log(m) - 3 \end{align}

Transforming $H$ into $H'$, $H''$, or $H'''$ would leave all of its meaningful features intact. The allowable transformations of Moh's scale are all and only those that preserve ordering; hence it is called an ordinal scale.

Next, consider measures of length. Let $L$ be a function that assigns to each object its length in inches. $L$ provides information about which objects are longer than others: $L(a) \gt L(b)$ iff $a$ is longer than $b$. But $L$ is not merely an ordinal scale, since it provides additional information. Ratios between lengths are meaningful: $L(a) + L(b) = L(c)$ iff laying object $a$ end-to-end with object $b$ produces a new, composite object exactly as long as $c$. The allowable transformations of length in inches are those that preserve ratios—all and only those that result from multiplying every length by a constant. So the transformation $f$ that converts $L$ to a measure of length in centimeters, is allowable: $f(L(a)) = 2.54\cdot L(a)$. But the transformations that result from adding 7 to $L(a)$, or raising 10 to the power of $L(a)$, are not allowable. This type of scale is called a ratio scale.

Defenders of expected utility theory typically require that utility be measured by a linear scale. For linear scales, the allowable transformations are all and only the positive linear transformations, i.e., functions $f$ of the form

\[ f(U(o))=x {\cdot} U(o)+y \]

for real numbers $x \gt 0$ and $y$.

Positive linear transformations of outcome utilities will never affect the verdicts of expected utility theory: if $A$ has greater expected utility than $B$ where utility is measured by function $U$, then $A$ will also have greater expected utility than $B$ where utility is measured by any positive linear transformation of $U$.

Jeffrey (1983) is an exception to the generalization that expected utility theorists measure utility with a linear scale. Jeffrey requires that probability and utility together be measured by a fractional linear scale. Jeffrey's allowable transformations operate on probability and utility together: instead of mapping probability functions to probability functions and utility functions to utility functions, they map probability-utility pairs to probability-utility pairs.

2. Arguments for Expected Utility Theory

Why choose acts that maximize expected utility? One possible answer is that expected utility theory is rational bedrock—that means-end rationality essentially involves maximizing expected utility. For those who find this answer unsatisfying, however, there are two further sources of justification. First, there are long-run arguments, which rely on evidence that expected-utility maximization is a profitable policy in the long term. Second, there are arguments based on representation theorems, which suggest that certain rational constraints on preference entail that all rational agents maximize expected utility.

2.1 Long-Run Arguments

One reason for maximizing expected utility is that it makes for good policy in the long run. Feller (1968) gives a version of this argument. He relies on two mathematical facts about probabilities: the strong and weak laws of large numbers. Both these facts concern sequences of independent, identically distributed trials—the sort of setup that results from repeatedly betting the same way on a sequence of roulette spins or craps games. Both the weak and strong laws of large numbers say, roughly, that over the long run, the average amount of utility gained per trial is overwhelmingly likely to be close to the expected value of an individual trial.

The weak law of large numbers states that where each trial has an expected value of $\mu$, for any arbitrarily small real number $\epsilon \gt 0$, as the number of trials increases, the probability that the gambler's average winnings per trial fall within $\epsilon$ of $\mu$ converges to 1. In other words, as the number of repetitions of a gamble approaches infinity, the average gain per trial will become arbitrarily close to the gamble's expected value with probability 1. So in the long run, the average value associated with a gamble is virtually certain to equal its expected value.

The strong law of large number states that where each trial has an expected value of $\mu$, for any arbitrarily small real numbers $\epsilon \gt 0$ and $\delta \gt 0$, there is some finite number of trials $n$, such that for all $m$ greater than or equal to $n$, with probability at least $1-\delta$, the gambler's average gains for the first $m$ trials will fall within $\epsilon$ of $\mu$. In other words, in a long run of similar gamble, the average gain per trial is highly likely to become arbitrarily close to the gamble's expected value within a finite amount of time. So in the finite long run, the average value associated with a gamble is overwhelmingly likely to be close to its expected value.

There are several objections to these long run arguments. First, many decisions cannot be repeated over indefinitely many similar trials. Decisions about which career to pursue, whom to marry, and where to live, for instance, are made at best a small finite number of times. Furthermore, where these decisions are made more than once, different trials involve different possible outcomes, with different probabilities. It is not clear why long-run considerations about repeated gambles should bear on these single-case choices.

Second, the argument relies on two independence assumptions, one or both of which may fail. One assumption holds that the probabilities of the different trials are independent. This is true of casino gambles, but not true of other choices where we wish to use decision theory—e.g., choices about medical treatment. My remaining sick after one course of antibiotics makes it more likely I will remain sick after the next course, since it increases the chance that antibiotic-resistant bacteria will spread through my body. The argument also requires that the utilities of different trials be independent, so that winning a prize on one trial makes the same contribution to the decision-maker's overall utility no matter what she wins on other trials. But this assumption is violated in many real-world cases. Due to the diminishing marginal utility of money \$10 million on ten games of roulette is not worth ten times as much as winning \$1 million on one game of roulette.

A third problem is that the strong and weak laws of large numbers are modally weak. Neither law entails that if a gamble were repeated indefinitely (under the appropriate assumptions), the average utility gain per trial would be close to the game's expected utility. They establish only that the average utility gain per trial would with high probability be close to the game's expected utility. But high probability—even probability 1—is not certainty. (Standard probability theory rejects Cournot's Principle, which says events with low or zero probability will not happen. But see Shafer (2005) for a defense of Cournot's Principle.) For any sequence of independent, identically distributed trials, it is possible for the average utility payoff per trial to diverge arbitrarily far from the expected utility of an individual trial.

2.2 Representation Theorems

A second type of argument for expected utility theory relies on so-called representation theorems. We follow Zynda's (2000) formulation of this argument—slightly modified to reflect the role of utilities as well as probabilities. The argument has three premises:

The Rationality Condition.
The axioms of expected utility theory are the axioms of rational preference.

If a person's preferences obey the axioms of expected utility theory, then she can be represented as having degrees of belief that obey the laws of the probability calculus [and a utility function such that she prefers acts with higher expected utility].

The Reality Condition.
If a person can be represented as having degrees of belief that obey the probability calculus [and a utility function such that she prefers acts with higher expected utility], then the person really has degrees of belief that obey the laws of the probability calculus [and really does prefer acts with higher expected utility].

These premises entail the following conclusion.

If a person [fails to prefer acts with higher expected utility], then that person violates at least one of the axioms of rational preference.

If the premises are true, the argument shows that there is something wrong with people whose preferences are at odds with expected utility theory—they violate the axioms of rational preference. Let us consider each of the premises in greater detail, beginning with the key premise, Representability.

A probability function and a utility function together represent a set of preferences just in case the following formula holds for all values of $A$ and $B$ in the domain of the preference relation

\[ EU(A) \gt EU(B) \text{ if and only if } A \text{ is preferred to } B. \]

Mathematical proofs of Representability are called representation theorems. Section 2.1 surveys three of the most influential representation theorems, each of which relies on a different set of axioms.

No matter which set of axioms we use, the Rationality Condition is controversial. In some cases, preferences that seem rationally permissible—perhaps even rationally required—violate the axioms of expected utility theory. Section 3 discusses such cases in detail.

The Reality Condition is also controversial. Hampton (1994), Zynda (2000), and Meacham and Weisberg (2011) all point out that to be representable using a probability and utility function is not to have a probability and utility function. After all, an agent who can be represented as an expected utility maximizer with degrees of belief that obey the probability calculus, can also be represented as someone who fails to maximize expected utility with degrees of belief that violate the probability calculus. Why think the expected utility representation is the right one?

There are several options. Perhaps the defender of representation theorems can stipulate that what it is to have particular degrees of belief and utilities is just to have the corresponding preferences. The main challenge for defenders of this response is to explain why representations in terms of expected utility are explanatorily useful, and why they are better than alternative representations. Or perhaps probabilities and utilities are a good cleaned-up theoretical substitutes for our folk notions of belief and desire—precise scientific substitutes for our folk concepts. Meacham and Weisberg challenge this response, arguing that probabilities and utilities are poor stand-ins for our folk notions. A third possibility, suggested by Zynda, is that facts about degrees of belief are made true independently of the agent's preferences, and provide a principled way to restrict the range of acceptable representations. The challenge for defenders of this type of response is to specify what these additional facts are.

I now turn to consider three influential representation theorems. These representation theorems differ from each other in three of philosophically significant ways.

First, different representation theorems disagree about the objects of preference and utility. Of the three theories I discuss below, one claims that they are lotteries (which are individuated in explicitly probabilistic terms), one claims that they are acts (which are entirely up to the agent), and one claims that they are arbitrary propositions.

Second, representation theorems differ in their treatment of probability. They disagree about which entities have probabilities, and about whether the same objects can have both probabilities and utilities.

Third, while every representation theorem proves that for a suitable preference ordering, there exist a probability and utility function representing the preference ordering, they differ how unique this probability and utility function are. In other words, they differ as to which transformations of the probability and utility functions are allowable.

2.2.1 Von Neumann and Morgenstern

Von Neumann and Morgenstern (1944) claim that preferences are defined over a domain of lotteries. Some of these lotteries are constant, and yield a single prize with certainty. (Prizes might include a banana, a million dollars, a million dollars' worth of debt, death, or a new car.) Lotteries can also have other lotteries as prizes, so that one can have a lottery with a 40% chance of yielding a banana, and a 60% chance of yielding a 50-50 gamble between a million dollars and death.) The domain of lotteries is closed under a mixing operation, so that if $L$ and $L'$ are lotteries and $x$ is a real number in the $[0, 1]$ interval, then there is a lottery $x L + (1-x) L'$ that yields $L$ with probability $x$ and $L'$ with probability $1-x$. They show that every preference relation obeying certain axioms can be represented by the probabilities used to define the lotteries, together with a utility function which is unique up to positive linear transformation.

2.2.2 Savage

Instead of taking probabilities for granted, as von Neumann and Morgenstern do, Savage (1972) defines them in terms of preference.

He begins with two separate domains for probability and utility. First, there are acts, which the agent can choose to perform, and which are objects of non-intrinsic preference and expected utility. Second, there are events, which are not dependent on the agent's choices, and which are objects of probability. Savage thinks of events as sets of states, but since we are thinking of states as sets of possibilities (see section 1), we can think of events as disjunctions of states. If there are four states, in which it rains, snows, drizzles, and stays sunny, then there will be sixteen events, including an event in which it rains, an event in which it rains or drizzles, a trivial event in which it rains, snows, drizzles, or stays sunny, and an empty event in which it does none of the above.

Savage also posits a third domain of outcomes, which are objects of intrinsic preference and utility. Outcomes have the same utility regardless of which state obtains. To illustrate the state-independence of outcomes, consider an example in which I am planning an outing with my friends, and have enough money for either a bathing suit or a tennis racquet but not enough for both. The following are not outcomes: “I have a bathing suit” and “I have a tennis racquet”. The bathing suit is worth more to me if the outing is to the beach, and less to me if the outing is to the tennis court, while for the tennis racquet, this relationship is reversed. A better way of individuating outcomes would be as follows: “I bring a bathing suit to the beach”; “I bring a bathing suit to the tennis courts”; “I bring a tennis racquet to the beach”; and “I bring a tennis racquet to the tennis courts”.

Acts, states, and outcomes are interrelated. Savage assumes that no state rules out the performance of any act, and that an act and a state together determine an outcome. He also assumes that for each outcome $o$, there is a constant act which yields $o$ in every state. (Thus, if “I bring a bathing suit to the beach” is an outcome, there is an act that results in my bringing a bathing suit to the beach, no matter what the state of the world.) Finally, he assumes for any two acts $A$ and $B$ and event $E$, there is a mixed act $A_E \amp B_{\sim E}$ that yields the same outcome as $A$ if $E$ is true, and the same outcome as $B$ otherwise. (Thus, if “I bring a bathing suit to the beach” and “I bring a tennis racquet to the tennis courts” are both outcomes, then there is a mixed act that results in my bringing a bathing suit to the beach in the event that my friends go to the tennis courts, and in my bringing a tennis racquet to the tennis courts otherwise.)

Savage postulates a preference relation over acts, and gives axioms governing that preference relation. He then defines subjective probabilities, or degrees of belief, in terms of preferences. The key move is to define an “at least as likely as” relation between events. (For convenience, I define “more likely than” and “equally likely” relations. Given that $E$ is at least as likely as $F$ if and only if either $E$ is more likely than $F$ or $E$ and $F$ are equally likely, my definition is equivalent to Savage's.)

Suppose $A$ and $B$ are constant acts such that $A$ is preferred to $B$. Then $E$ is more likely than $F$ just in case the agent either prefers $A_E \amp B_{\sim E}$ (the act that yields $A$ if $E$ obtains, and $B$ otherwise) to $A_F \amp B_{\sim F}$ (the act that yields $A$ if $F$ obtains, and $B$ otherwise); and $E$ and $F$ are equally likely just in case the agent is indifferent between $A_E \amp B_{\sim E}$ and $A_F \amp B_{\sim F}$.

The thought behind the definition is that the agent considers $E$ more likely than $F$ just in case she would rather bet on $E$ than on $F$, and considers $E$ and $F$ equally likely just in case she is indifferent between betting on $E$ and betting on $F$.

Savage then gives axioms constraining rational preference, and shows that any set of preferences satisfying those axioms yields an “at least as likely” relation that can be uniquely represented by a probability function. In other words, there is one and only one probability function $P$ such that for all $E$ and $F$, $P(E) \ge P(F)$ if and only if $E$ is at least as likely as $F$. Every preference relation obeying Savage's axioms is represented by this probability function $P$, together with a utility function which is unique up to positive linear transformation.

Savage's representation theorem gives strong results: starting with a preference ordering alone, we can find a single probability function, and a narrow class of utility functions, which represent that preference ordering. The downside, however, is that Savage has to build implausibly strong assumptions about the domain of acts.

Luce and Suppes (1965) point out that Savage's constant acts are implausible. (Recall that constant acts yield the same outcome and the same amount of value in every state.) Take some very good outcome—total bliss for everyone. Is there really a constant act that has this outcome in every possible state, including states where the human race is wiped out by a meteor? Savage's reliance on a rich space of mixed acts is also problematic. Savage has had to assume that any two outcomes and any event, there is a mixed act that yields the first outcome if the event occurs, and the second outcome otherwise? Is there really an act that yields total bliss if everyone is killed by an antibiotic-resistant plague, and total misery otherwise? Luce and Krantz (1971) suggest ways of reformulating Savage's representation theorem that weaken these assumptions, but Joyce (1999) argues that even on the weakened assumptions, the domain of acts remains implausibly rich.

2.2.3 Bolker and Jeffrey

Bolker (1966) proves a general representation theorem about mathematical expectations, which Jeffrey (1983) uses as the basis for a philosophical account of expected utility theory. Bolker's theorem assumes a single domain of propositions, which are objects of preference, utility, and probability alike. Thus, the proposition that it will rain today has a utility, as well as a probability. Jeffrey interprets this utility as the proposition's news value—a measure of how happy or disappointed I would be to learn that the proposition was true. By convention, he sets the value of the necessary proposition at 0—the necessary proposition is no news at all! Likewise, the proposition that I take my umbrella to work, which is an act, has a probability as well as a utility. Jeffrey interprets this to mean that I have degrees of belief about what I will do.

Bolker gives axioms constraining preference, and shows that any preferences satisfying his axioms can be represented by a probability measure $P$ and a utility measure $U$. However, Bolker's axioms do not ensure that $P$ is unique, or that $U$ is unique up to positive linear transformation. Nor do they allow us to define comparative probability in terms of preference. Instead, where $P$ and $U$ jointly represent a preference ordering, Bolker shows that the pair $\langle P, U \rangle$ is unique up to a fractional linear transformation.

In technical terms, where $U$ is a utility function normalized so that $U(\Omega) = 0$, $inf$ is the greatest lower bound of the values assigned by $U$, $sup$ is the least upper bound of the values assigned by by $U$, and $\lambda$ is a parameter falling between $-1/inf$ and $-1/sup$, the fractional linear transformation $\langle P_{\lambda}, U_{\lambda} \rangle$ of $\langle P, U \rangle$ corresponding to $\lambda$ is given by:

\begin{align} P_{\lambda} &= P(x)(1 + \lambda V(x)) \\ V_{\lambda} &= V(x)((1+\lambda)/(1 + \lambda V(x)) \end{align}

Notice that fractional linear transformations of a probability-utility pair can disagree with the original pair about which propositions are likelier than which others.

Joyce (1999) shows that with additional resources, Bolker's theorem can be modified to pin down a unique $P$, and a $U$ that is unique up to positive linear transformation. We need only supplement the preference ordering with a primitive “more likely than” relation, governed by its own set of axioms, and linked to belief by several additional axioms. Joyce modifies Bolker's result to show that given these additional axioms, the “more likely than” relation is represented by a unique $P$, and the preference ordering is represented by $P$ together with a utility function that is unique up to positive linear transformation.

2.2.4 Summary

Together, the three representation theorems above can be summed up in the following diagram, where an arrow from $A$ to $B$ means that, given an $A$ satisfying the appropriate constraints, there is a $B$ that represents $A$. Solid lines indicate that there is a unique $B$ that represents each $A$; dashed lines that $B$ is unique only up to some allowable transformation weaker than the identity.

relations among the representation theorems

Thus, we can see that each pair consisting of a preference ordering and probability function which satisfy the appropriate axioms is represented by an expected utility function, unique up to positive linear transformation. (This is von Neumann and Morgenstern's representation theorem.) Likewise, we can see that each probability-utility pair is represented by a unique expected utility function. Each expected utility function determines a unique utility function over outcomes, as well as a unique preference ordering. Each preference ordering that obeys the appropriate axioms is represented by a probability function and a utility function that together are unique up to fractional linear transformations. (This is the Bolker-Jeffrey theorem.)

Suitably structured ordinal probabilities (the relations picked out by “at least as likely as”, “more likely than”, and “equally likely”) stand in one-to-one correspondence with the cardinal probability functions. Finally, the grey line from preferences to ordinal probabilities indicates that every probability function satisfying Savage's axioms is represented by a unique cardinal probability—but this result does not hold for Jeffrey's axioms.

Notice that it is often possible to follow the arrows in circles—from preference to ordinal probability, from ordinal probability to cardinal probability, from cardinal probability and preference to expected utility, and from expected utility back to preference. Thus, although the arrows represent a mathematical relationship of representation, they do not represent a metaphysical relationship of grounding. This fact drives home the importance of independently justifying the Reality Condition—representation theorems cannot justify expected utility theory without additional assumptions.

3. Counterexamples to Expected Utility Theory

A variety of authors have given examples in which expected utility theory seems to get things wrong. Sections 3.1 and 3.2 discuss examples where rationality seems to permit preferences inconsistent with expected utility theory. These examples suggest that maximizing expected utility is not necessary for rationality. Section 3.3 discusses examples where expected utility theory permits preferences that seem irrational. These examples suggest that maximizing expected utility is not sufficient for rationality. Section 3.4 discusses an example where expected utility theory requires preferences that seem rationally forbidden—a challenge to both the necessity and the sufficiency of expected utility for rationality—as well as examples where expected utility fails to yield any usable verdict at all.

3.1 Counterexamples Involving Transitivity and Completeness

Expected utility theory implies that the structure of preferences mirrors the structure of the greater-than relation between real numbers. Thus, according to expected utility theory, preferences must be transitive: If $A$ is preferred to $B$ (so that $U(A) \gt U(B)$), and $B$ is preferred to $C$ (so that $U(B) \gt U(C)$), then $A$ must be preferred to $C$ (since it must be that $U(A) \gt U(C)$). Likewise, preferences must be complete: for any two options, either one must be preferred to the other, or the agent must be indifferent between them (since of their two utilities, either one must be greater or the two must be equal). But there are cases where rationality seems to permit (or perhaps even require) failures of transitivity and failures of completeness.

An example of preferences that are not transitive, but nonetheless seem rationally permissible, is Quinn's puzzle of the self-torturer (1990). The self-torturer is hooked up to a machine with a dial with settings labeled 0 to 1,000, where setting 0 does nothing, and each successive setting delivers a slightly more powerful electric shock. Setting 0 is painless, while setting 1,000 causes excruciating agony, but the difference between any two adjacent settings is so small as to be imperceptible. The dial is fitted with a ratchet, so that it can be turned up but never down. Suppose that at each setting, the self-torturer is offered \$10,000 to move up to the next, so that for tolerating setting $n$, he receives a payoff of $n{\cdot}\text{\$10,000}$. It is permissible for the self-torturer to prefer setting $n+1$ to setting $n$ for each $n$ between 0 and 999 (since the difference in pain is imperceptible, while the difference in monetary payoffs is significant), but not to prefer setting 1,000 to setting 0 (since the pain of setting 1,000 may be so unbearable that no amount of money will make up for it.

It also seems rationally permissible to have incomplete preferences. For some pairs of actions, an agent may have no considered view about which she prefers. Consider Jane, an electrician who has never given much thought to becoming a professional singer or a professional astronaut. (Perhaps both of these options are infeasible, or perhaps she considers both of them much worse than her steady job as an electrician). It is false that Jane prefers becoming a singer to becoming an astronaut, and it is false that she prefers becoming an astronaut to becoming a singer. But it is also false that she is indifferent between becoming a singer and becoming an astronaut. She prefers becoming a singer and receiving a \$100 bonus to becoming a singer, and if she were indifferent between becoming a singer and becoming an astronaut, she would be rationally compelled to prefer being a singer and receiving a \$100 bonus to becoming an astronaut.

There is one key difference between the two examples considered above. Jane's preferences can be extended, by adding new preferences without removing any of the ones she has, in a way that lets us represent her as an expected utility maximizer. On the other hand, there is no way of extended the self-torturer's preferences so that he can be represented as an expected utility maximizer. Some of his preferences would have to be altered. One popular response to incomplete preferences is to claim that, while rational preferences need not satisfy the axioms of a given representation theorem (see section 2.2), it must be possible to extend them so that they satisfy the axioms. From this weaker requirement on preferences—that they be extendible to a preference ordering that satisfies the relevant axioms—one can prove the existence halves of the relevant representation theorems. However, one can no longer establish that the each preference ordering has a representation which is unique up to allowable transformations.

No such response is available in the case of the self-torturer, whose preferences cannot be extended to satisfy the axioms of expected utility theory. See the entry on preferences for a more extended discussion of the self-torturer case.

3.2 Counterexamples Involving Independence

Allais (1953) and Ellsberg (1961) propose examples of preferences that cannot be represented by an expected utility function, but that nonetheless seem rational. Both examples involve violations of Savage's Independence axiom:

Independence. Suppose that $A$ and $A^*$ are two acts that produce the same outcomes in the event that $E$ is false. Then, for any act $B$, one must have

  • $A$ is preferred to $A^*$ if and only if $A_E \amp B_{\sim E}$ is preferred to $A^*_E \amp B_{\sim E}$
  • The agent is indifferent between $A$ and $A^*$ if and only if she is indifferent between $A_E \amp B_{\sim E}$ and $A^*_E \amp B_{\sim E}$

In other words, if two acts have the same consequences whenever $E$ is false, then the agent's preferences between those two acts should depend only on their consequences when $E$ is true. On Savage's definition of expected utility, expected utility theory entails Independence. And on Jeffrey's definition, expected utility theory entails Independence in the presence of the assumption that the states are probabilistically independent of the acts.

The first counterexample, the Allais Paradox, involves two separate decision problems in which a ticket with a number between 1 and 100 is drawn at random. In the first problem, the agent must choose between these two lotteries:

  • Lottery $A$
  • \$100 million with certainty
  • Lottery $B$
  • \$500 million if one of tickets 1–10 is drawn
  • \$100 million if one of tickets 12–100 is drawn
  • Nothing if ticket 11 is drawn

In the second decision problem, the agent must choose between these two lotteries:

  • Lottery $C$
  • \$100 million if one of tickets 1–11 is drawn
  • Nothing otherwise
  • Lottery $D$
  • \$500 million if one of tickets 1–10 is drawn
  • Nothing otherwise

It seems reasonable to prefer $A$ (which offers a sure \$100 million) to $B$ (where the added 10% chance at \$500 million is more than offset by the risk of getting nothing). It also seems reasonable to prefer $D$ (an 10% chance at a \$500 million prize) to $C$ (a slightly larger 11% chance at a much smaller \$100 million prize). But together, these preferences (call them the Allais preferences) violate Independence. Lotteries $A$ and $C$ yield the same \$100 million dollar prize for tickets 12–100. They can be converted into lotteries $B$ and $D$ by replacing this \$100 million dollars with \$0.

Because they violate Independence, the Allais preferences are incompatible with expected utility theory. This incompatibility does not require any assumptions about the relative utilities of the \$0, the \$100 million, and the \$500 million. Where \$500 million has utility $x$, \$100 million has utility $y$, and \$0 has utility $z$, the expected utilities of the lotteries are as follows.

\begin{align} EU(A) &= 0.11y + 0.89y \\ EU(B) &= 0.10x + 0.01z + 0.89y \\ EU(C) &= 0.11y + 0.89z \\ EU(D) &= 0.10x + 0.01z + 0.89z \end{align}

It is easy to see that the condition under which $EU(A) \gt EU(B)$ is exactly the same as the condition under which $EU(C) \gt EU(D)$: both inequalities obtain just in case $0.11y \gt 0.10x + 0.01z$

The Ellsberg Paradox also involves two decision problems that generate a violation of the sure-thing principle. In each of them, a ball is drawn from an urn containing 30 red balls, and 60 balls that are either white or yellow in unknown proportions. In the first decision problem, the agent must choose between the following lotteries:

  • Lottery $R$
  • Win \$100 if a red ball is drawn
  • Lose \$100 otherwise
  • Lottery $W$
  • Win \$100 if a white ball is drawn
  • Lose \$100 otherwise

In the second decision problem, the agent must choose between the following lotteries:

  • Lottery $RY$
  • Win \$100 if a red or yellow ball is drawn
  • Lose \$100 otherwise
  • Lottery $WY$
  • Win \$100 if a white or yellow ball is drawn
  • Lose \$100 otherwise

It seems reasonable to prefer $R$ to $W$, but at the same time prefer $WY$ to $RY$. (Call this combination of preferences the Ellsberg preferences.) Like the Allais preferences, the Ellsberg preferences violate Independence. Lotteries $W$ and $R$ yield a \$100 loss if a yellow ball is drawn; they can be converted to lotteries $RY$ and $WY$ simply by replacing this \$100 loss with a sure \$100 gain.

Because they violate independence, the Ellsberg preferences are incompatible with expected utility theory. Again, this incompatibility does not require any assumptions about the relative utilities of winning \$100 and losing \$100. Nor do we any assumptions about where between 0 and 1/3 the probability of drawing a yellow ball falls. Where winning \$100 has utility $w$ and losing \$100 has utility $l$,

\begin{align} EU(R) &= \tfrac{1}{3} w + P(W)l + P(Y)l \\ EU(W) &= \tfrac{1}{3} l + P(W)w + P(Y)l \\ EU(RY)&= \tfrac{1}{3} w + P(W)l + P(Y)w \\ EU(WY)&= \tfrac{1}{3} l + P(W)w + P(Y)w \end{align}

It is easy to see that the condition in which $EU(R) \gt EU(W)$ is exactly the same as the condition under which $EU(RY) \gt EU(WY)$: both inequalities obtain just in case $1/3\,w + P(W)l \gt 1/3\,l + P(W)w$.

There are three notable responses to the Allais and Ellsberg paradoxes. First, one might follow Savage (101 ff) and Raiffa (1968, 80–86), and defend expected utility theory on the grounds that the Allais and Ellsberg preferences are irrational.

Second, one might follow Buchak (2013) and claim that that the Allais and Ellsberg preferences are rationally permissible, so that expected utility theory fails as a normative theory of rationality. Buchak develops an a more permissive theory of rationality, with an extra parameter representing the decision-maker's attitude toward risk. This risk parameter interacts with the utilities of outcomes and their conditional probabilities on acts to determine the values of acts. One setting of the risk parameter yields expected utility theory as a special case, but other, “risk-averse” settings rationalise the Allais preferences.

Third, one might follow Loomes and Sugden (1986), Weirich (1986), and Pope (1995) and argue that the outcomes in the Allais and Ellsberg paradoxes can be re-described to accommodate the Allais and Ellsberg preferences. The alleged conflict between the Allais and Ellsberg preferences on the one hand, and expected utility theory on the other, was based on the assumption that a given sum of money has the same utility no matter how it is obtained. Some authors challenge this assumption. Loomes and Sugden suggest that in addition to monetary amounts, the outcomes of the gambles include feelings of disappointment (or elation) at getting less (or more) than expected. Pope distinguishes “post-outcome” feelings of elation or disappointment from “pre-outcome” feelings of excitement, fear, boredom, or safety, and points out that both may affect outcome utilities. Weirich suggests that the value of a monetary sum depends partly on the risks that went into obtaining it, irrespective of the gambler's feelings, so that (for instance) \$100 million as the result of a sure bet is more than \$100 million from a gamble that might have paid nothing.

Broome (1991) raises a worry about this re-description solution. Any preferences can be justified by re-describing the space of outcomes, thus rendering the axioms of expected utility theory devoid of content. Broome rebuts this objection by suggesting an additional constraint on preference: if $A$ is preferred to $B$, then $A$ and $B$ must differ in some way that justifies preferring one to the other. An expected utility theorist can then count the Allais and Ellsberg preferences as rational if, and only if, there is a non-monetary difference that justifies placing outcomes of equal monetary value at different spots in one's preference ordering.

3.3 Counterexamples Involving Probability 0 Events

Above, we've seen purported examples of rational preferences that violate expected utility theory. There are also purported examples of irrational preferences that satisfy expected utility theory.

On a typical understanding of expected utility theory, when two acts are tied for having the highest expected utility, agents are required to be indifferent between them. Skyrms (1980, p. 74) points out that this view lets us derive strange conclusions about events with probability 0. For instance, suppose you are about to throw a point-sized dart at a round dartboard. Classical probability theory countenances situations in which the dart has probability 0 of hitting any particular point. You offer me the following lousy deal: if the dart hits the board at its exact center, then you will charge me \$100; otherwise, no money will change hands. My decision problem can be captured with the following matrix:

hit center (P=0) miss center (P=1)
acts accept deal $-100$ $0$
refuse deal $0$ $0$

Expected utility theory says that it is permissible for me to accept the deal—accepting has expected utility of 0. (This is so on both the Jeffrey definition and the Savage definition, if we assume that how the dart lands is probabilistically independent of how you bet.) But common sense says it is not permissible for me to accept the deal. Refusing weakly dominates accepting: it yields a better outcome in some states, and a worse outcome in no state.

Skyrms suggests augmenting the laws of classical probability with an extra requirement that only impossibilities are assigned probability 0. Easwaran (2014) argues that we should instead reject the view that expected utility theory commands indifference between acts with equal expected utility. Instead, expected utility theory is not a complete theory of rationality: when two acts have the same expected utility, it does not tell us which to prefer. We can use non-expected-utility considerations like weak dominance as tiebreakers.

3.4 Counterexamples Involving Unbounded Utility

A utility function $U$ is bounded above if there is a limit to how good things can be according to $U$, or more formally, if there is some least natural number $sup$ such that for every $A$ in $U$'s domain, $U(A) \le sup$. Likewise, $U$ is bounded below if there is a limit to how bad things can be according to $U$, or more formally, if there is some greatest natural number $inf$ such that for every $A$ in $U$'s domain, $U(A) \ge inf$. Expected utility theory can run into trouble when utility functions are unbounded above, below, or both.

One problematic example is the St. Petersburg game, originally published by Bernoulli. Suppose that a coin is tossed until it lands tails for the first time. If it lands tails on the first toss, you win \$2; if it lands tails on the second toss, you win \$4; if it lands tails on the third toss, you win \$8, and if it lands tails on the $n$th toss, you win \$ $2^{(n-1)}$. Assuming each dollar is worth one utile, the expected value of the St Petersburg game is

\[ (\tfrac{1}{2} \cdot 2) + (\tfrac{1}{4} \cdot 4) + (\tfrac{1}{8} \cdot 8) + \cdots + (\tfrac{1}{2^n} \cdot 2^n) + \cdots \] or \[ 1 + 1 + 1 + \cdots = \infty \]

It turns out that this sum diverges; the St Petersburg game has infinite expected utility. Thus, according to expected utility theory, you should prefer the opportunity to play the St Petersburg game to any finite sum of money, no matter how large. Furthermore, since an infinite expected utility multiplied by any nonzero chance is still infinite, anything that has a positive probability of yielding the St Petersburg game has infinite expected utility. Thus, according to expected utility theory, you should prefer any chance at playing the St Petersburg game, however slim, to any finite sum of money, however large.

Another puzzling example is the Pasadena game, proposed by Nover and Hájek (2004). Just as in the St Petersburg game, a coin is flipped until it lands tails. But in the Pasadena game, there are potential losses as well as positive wins. If the coin lands tails on the first toss, you win \$2; if it lands tails on the second toss, you lose \$2; if it lands tails on the third toss, you win \$8/3; if it lands tails on the fourth toss, you lose \$4; and if it lands tails on toss $n$, you win \$(−1)n–1 (2n /n), where winning a negative amount is equivalent to losing money.

Assuming again that each dollar is worth one utile, expected value of the Pasadena game is

\[ (\tfrac{1}{2} \cdot 2) - (\tfrac{1}{4} \cdot 2) + (\tfrac{1}{8} \cdot \tfrac{8}{3}) - (\tfrac{1}{16} \cdot 4) + \cdots + (\tfrac{1}{2^n} \cdot \tfrac{(-1)^{n-1} \cdot 2^n}{n}) + \cdots \]


\[ 1 - \tfrac{1}{2} + \tfrac{1}{3} - \tfrac{1}{4} + \cdots \]

This sum converges to $\ln(2)$; assuming that one dollar is worth one utile, this works out to about 69¢. But there is a catch. The sum only conditionally converges. If every term is replaced with its absolute value, the resulting series diverges:

\[ 1 + \tfrac{1}{2} + \tfrac{1}{3} + \tfrac{1}{4} + \cdots = \infty. \]

Then, by the Riemann rearrangement theorem, for every real value, the series can be rearranged so as to sum to that value; and other rearrangements of the series diverge to $\infty$, and to $-\infty$. So the Pasadena game seems to have no well-defined expected utility.

Consequently, in a variety of situations where we want to rank options against each other, expected utility theory fails to give any result. Just as any gamble with a small chance of yielding the St Petersburg game as a prize has infinite expected utility, so any gamble with a small chance of yielding the Pasadena game as a prize has undefined expected utility. Furthermore, consider the a second game proposed by Nover and Hajek (2004): the Altadena game. The Altadena game is exactly like the Pasadena game, except that each of the payoffs is a dollar higher. Since the Altadena game dominates the Pasadena game, it should count as better, but expected utility theory fails to yield this result.

One response to these problematic infinitary games is to argue that the decision problems themselves are ill-posed. Jeffrey (1983, 154), for instance, writes that “anyone who offers to let the agent play the St Petersburg game is a liar, for he is pretending to have an indefinitely large bank”. Nover and Hájek (2004) rebut Jeffrey, arguing that even if all utility functions are bounded as a matter of contingent fact, unbounded utility functions are a conceptual possibility, and that they may be useful for developing idealized models of actual agents. In later work, Hájek and Nover (2008) argue at length that the Pasadena game is well posed.

Another response is to claim that the values of these infinitary games are not adequately captured by their expected utilities. This solution is compatible with accepting utility theory for a large class of ordinary gambles. Thalos and Richardson (2013), Fine (2008), Colyvan (2006, 2008), and Easwaran (2008) propose theories that coincide with expected utility theory in a wide range of gambles, but also let us give intuitively reasonable evaluations of the St. Petersburg, Pasadena, and Altadena games.

4. Applications

4.1 Philosophy of Religion

One of the earliest applications of expected utility theory is Pascal's wager, an argument for the conclusion belief in God is rationally obligatory. Pascal presents a number of distinct arguments (see the article on Pascal's wager), but one particularly notable version relies on expected utility considerations. We lack decisive evidence about whether God exists. However, the question of whether to believe in God can be understood as a decision problem, in which belief and disbelief are both acts. Pascal argues that belief in God is the better act: “there is here an infinity of an infinitely happy life to gain, a chance of gain against a finite number of chances of loss, and what you stake is finite.” This looks like an argument based on expected utility theory. The matrix for the decision problem looks like this (where outcomes are specified according to their utilities, and f1, f2, and f3 are all finite):

God existsGod does not exist
acts believe$\infty$$f_1$
do not believe$f_2$$f_3$

Where the probability that God exists is $g \gt 0$, the expected utility of of believing in God infinite $(g \infty + (1-g)f_1)$, while the expected utility of not believing in God is finite $(g f_2 + (1-g)f_3)$.

Many of the objections to Pascal's wager concern whether the decision matrix above correctly models the choice faced by someone deciding whether to believe in God. Are there acts which are alternatives to belief and disbelief (such as tossing a coin to decide whether to believe)? Are there states that the matrix fails to represent (such as states in which there are many gods)? Is the probability that God exists really greater than 0? Of particular decision interest to expected utility theory is the objection that no outcome can have infinite utility—a version of the issue with unbounded utility that arose for the St. Petersburg game. Pascal's Wager requires a stronger assumption than the St. Petersburg game—not just that there is a lottery with infinite expected value, but that there is an outcome with infinite value. (In St. Petersburg, all of the outcome values were finite.)

4.2 Economics

In economics, expected utility theory is often invoked as an account of how people actually make decisions in an economic context. These uses of expected utility theory are descriptive, and don't bear directly on the normative question of whether expected utility theory provides a good account of rationality.

However, there are some economic uses of expected utility theory which are normative. One—the application for which expected utility theory was originally designed—is setting prices for games of chance. The strong and weak laws of large numbers entail that charging more for a game than its expected monetary value is overwhelmingly likely to yield a profit for the casino in the long term, while charging less is overwhelmingly likely to result in a monetary loss. There is a complication, however: casinos have only finitely large banks, and will go out of business if it loses too much money in the short term. Therefore, the analysis of reasonable pricing for casino games must take into account not only the casino's expected profits or losses in the long run, but also its chance of going broke.

Another area where expected utility theory finds applications is in insurance sales. Like casinos, insurance companies take on calculated risks with the aim of long-term financial gain, and must take into account the chance of going broke in the short run.

4.3 Ethics

Consequentialists hold that the rightness or wrongness of an act is determined by the moral goodness or badness of its consequences. Some consequentialists, (Railton 1984) interpret this to mean that we ought to do whatever will in fact have the best consequences. But it is difficult to know with any degree of certainty what long-term consequences our acts will have. Lenman (2000) gives the example of an ancient Visigoth, Richard, who spares the life of an innocent citizen in a town he raids. But unknown to Richard, the citizen turns out to be a distant ancestor of Adolf Hitler. And as Lenman points out, “Hitler's crimes may not be the most significant consequence of Richard's action.” Perhaps, had Richard killed the innocent citizen, some even more murderous dictator would have been conceived. We have no way of determining whether the consequences of Richard's action are overall better or worse than the consequences of alternatives he might have chosen.

Howard-Snyder (1997) argues that in most cases, we cannot act so as to bring about the best consequences—we do not know how. (Similarly, I cannot beat Karpov at chess, since I do not know how—even though there is a sequence of moves I can perform that would constitute beating Karpov at chess.) Since “ought” implies “can”, it must be false that we ought to act so as to bring about the best consequences. Wiland (2005) argues that even if we can perform the acts with the best consequences, the view that we ought to do so yields strange consequences: even the morally best people act immorally most of the time.

Jackson (1991) argues that the right act is the one with the greatest expected moral value, not the one that will in fact yield the best consequences. Jackson defends this view using the example of a doctor choosing which of three drugs to prescribe for a skin illness. Drug A will relieve the condition without completely curing it, while of drugs B and C, one will cure the patient completely, and the other will kill him. The doctor has no way of distinguishing the killer drug from the cure. In this case, it seems morally obligatory for the doctor to take the safe option and prescribe drug A, even though she knows that one of the alternative drugs will produce a better result.

As Jackson notes, the expected moral value of an act depends on which probability function we work with. Jackson argues that, while every probability function is associated with an “ought”, the “ought” that matters most to action is the one associated with the decision-maker's degrees of belief at the time of action. Other authors claim priority for other “oughts”: Mason (2013) favors the probability function that is most reasonable for the agent to adopt in response to her evidence, given her epistemic limitations, while Oddie and Menzies (1992) favor the objective chance function as a measure of objective rightness. (They appeal to a more complicated probability function to define a notion of “subjective rightness” for decisionmakers who are ignorant of the objective chances.)

Still others (Smart 1973, Timmons 2002) argue that even if that we ought to do whatever will have the best consequences, expected utility theory can play the role of a decision procedure when we are uncertain what consequences our acts will have. Feldman (2006) objects that expected utility calculations are horribly impractical. In most real life decisions, the steps required to compute expected utilities are beyond our ken: listing the possible outcomes of our acts, assigning each outcome a utility and a conditional probability given each act, and performing the arithmetic necessary to expected utility calculations.

4.4 Epistemology

Expected utility theory can be used to address practical questions in epistemology. One such question is when to accept a hypothesis. In typical cases, the evidence is logically compatible with multiple hypotheses, including hypotheses to which it lends little inductive support. Furthermore, scientists do not typically accept only those hypotheses that are most probable given their data. When is a hypothesis likely enough to deserve acceptance?

Bayesians, such as Maher (1993), suggest that this decision be made on expected utility grounds. Whether to accept a hypothesis is a decision problem, with acceptance and rejection as acts. It can be captured by the following decision matrix:

hypothesis is true hypothesis is false
acts accept correctly accept erroneously accept
reject erroneously reject correctly reject

On Savage's definition, the expected utility of accepting the hypothesis is determined by the probability of the hypothesis, together with the utilities of each of the four outcomes. (We can expect Jeffrey's definition to agree with Savage's on the plausible assumption that, given the evidence in our possession, the hypothesis is probabilistically independent of whether we accept or reject it.) Here, the utilities can be understood as purely epistemic values, since it is epistemically valuable to believe interesting truths, and to reject falsehoods.

Critics of the Bayesian approach, such as Mayo (1996), object that scientific hypotheses cannot sensibly be given probabilities. Mayo argues that in order to assign a useful probability to an event, we need statistical evidence about the frequencies of similar events. But scientific hypotheses are either true once and for all, or false once and for all—there is no population of worlds like ours from which we can meaningfully draw statistics. Nor can we use subjective probabilities for scientific purposes, since this would be unacceptably arbitrary. Therefore, the expected utilities of acceptance and rejection are undefined, and we ought to use the methods of traditional statistics, which rely on comparing the probabilities of our evidence conditional on each of the hypotheses.

Expected utility theory also provides guidance about when to gather evidence. Good (1967) argues on expected utility grounds that it is always rational to gather evidence before acting, provided that evidence is free of cost. The act with the highest expected utility after the extra evidence is in will always be always at least as good as the act with the highest expected utility beforehand.

Another application of expected utility theory, discussed in (Greaves 2013) is the evaluation of probabilities themselves—where these probabilities are understood as individual degrees of belief. If we think of belief formation as a mental act, facts about the contents of the agent's beliefs as events, and closeness to truth as a desirable feature of outcomes, then we can use expected utility theory to evaluate degrees of belief in terms of their expected closeness to truth. Greaves and Wallace (2006) this approach to justify updating by conditionalization; Leitgeb and Pettigrew (2010) use it to justify a new rule for updating on uncertain evidence that conflicts with the more orthodox “probability kinematics” due to Jeffrey (1983).


  • Allais M., 1953, “Le Comportement de l'Homme Rationnel devant le Risque: Critique des Postulats et Axiomes de l'École Americaine”, Econometrica 21, 503–546.
  • Bernoulli, D., 1738, “Specimen theoriae novae de mensura sortis”, Commentarii Academiae Scientiarum Imperialis Petropolitanae 5. Translated by Louise Somer and reprinted as “Exposition of a New Theory on the Measurement of Risk” 1954, Econometrica, 22: 23–36.
  • Bentham, J., 1961. An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, Garden City: Doubleday. Originally published in 1789.
  • Bolker, E., 1966, “Functions Resembling Quotients of Measures”, Transactions of the American Mathematical Society, 2: 292–312.
  • Buchak, L., 2013, Risk and Rationality, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Colyvan, M., 2006, “No Expectations”, Mind, 116, 695–702.
  • Colyvan, M., 2008, “Relative Expectation Theory”, Journal of Philosophy, 105, 37–44.
  • Easwaran, K., 2014, “Regularity and Hyperreal Credences”, The Philosophical Review, 123, 1–41.
  • Easwaran, K., 2008, “Strong and Weak Expectations”, Mind, 117, 633–641.
  • Ellsberg, D., 1961, “Risk, Ambiguity, and the Savage Axioms”, Quarterly Journal of Economics, 75: 643–669.
  • Feldman, F. 2006, “Actual utility, the objection from impracticality, and the move to expected utility”, Philosophical Studies, 129 : 49–79.
  • Fine, T., 2008, “Evaluating the Pasadena, Altadena, and St Petersburg Gambles”, Mind, 117: 613–632.
  • Gibbard, Allan and William Harper. [1978] 1981. “Counterfactuals and Two Kinds of Expected Utility.” In William Harper, Robert Stalnaker, and Glenn Pearce, eds., Ifs: Conditionals, Belief, Decision, Chance, and Time, pp. 153–190, Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • Good, I.J., 1967, “On the Principle of Total Evidence”, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 17, 319–321
  • Greaves, H., 2013, “Epistemic Decision Theory”, Mind, 122 (488): 915–952.
  • Greaves, H. and Wallace, D., 2006, “Justifying conditionalization: Conditionalization maximizes expected epistemic utility”, Mind, 115: 607–632.
  • Hampton, J., “The Failure of Expected-Utility Theory as a Theory of Reason”, Economics and Philosophy, 10: 195–242.
  • Howard-Snyder, F., 1997, “The Rejection of Objective Consequentialism”, Utilitas, 9: 241–248.
  • Jackson, F., 1991, “Decision-theoretic consequentialism and the nearest and dearest objection”, Ethics, 101: 461–482.
  • Jeffrey, R., 1983, The Logic of Decision, 2nd edition, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Jevons, W.S., 1866, “A General Mathematical Theory of Political Economy”, Journal of the Royal Statistical Society, 29: 282–287.
  • Joyce, J., 1999, The Foundations of Causal Decision Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kahneman, D. & Tversky A., Judgment Under Uncertainty: Heuristics and Biases, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kolmogorov, A. N., 1933, Grundbegriffe der Wahrscheinlichkeitrechnung, Ergebnisse Der Mathematik; translated as Foundations of Probability, New York: Chelsea Publishing Company, 1950.
  • Leitgeb, H., & Pettigrew, R., 2010, “An objective justification of Bayesianism II: The consequences of minimising inaccuracy”, Philosophy of Science, 77: 236–272.
  • Lenman, J., 2000. “Consequentialism and cluelessness”, Philosophy and Public Affairs 29 (4):342–370.
  • Lewis, D., 1981, “Causal Decision Theory”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 59: 5–30.
  • Levi, I., 1991, “Consequentialism and Sequential Choice”, in M. Bacharach and S. Hurley (eds.), Foundations of Decision Theory, Oxford: Basil Blackwell Ltd, 92–12.
  • Loomes, G. And Sugden, R., 1986, “Disappointment and Dynamic Consistency in Choice Under Uncertainty”, The Review of Economic Studies, 271–282.
  • Maher, P., 1993, Betting on Theories, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Mason, E., 2013, “Objectivism and Prospectivism About Rightness”, Journal of Ethics and Social Philosophy, 7: 1–21.
  • Mayo, D., 1996, Error and the Growth of Experimental Knowledge, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Meacham, C. and Weisberg, J., 2011, “Representation Theorems and the Foundations of Decision Theory”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 89, 641–663.
  • Menger, K., 1871, Grundsätze der Volkswirtschaftslehre, translated by James Dingwall and Bert F. Hoselitz as Principles of Economics, New York: New York University Press, 1976; reprinted online, Ludwig von Mises Institute, 2007.
  • Mill, J. S., 1861. Utilitarianism. Edited with an introduction by Roger Crisp. New York: Oxford University Press, 1998.
  • von Neumann, J., and Morgenstern, O., 1944, Theory of Games and Economic Behavior, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Nover, H. & Hájek, A., 2004, “Vexing expectations”, Mind, 113, 237–249.
  • Nozick, R., 1969, “Newcomb's Problem and Two Principles of Choice,” in Nicholas Rescher (ed.), Essays in Honor of Carl G. Hempel, Synthese Library (Reidel), 114–115.
  • Oliver, A., 2003, “A quantitative and qualitative test of the Allais paradox using health outcomes”, Journal of Economic Psychology 24, 35–48.
  • Pope, R., 1995, “Towards a More Precise Decision Framework: A Separation of the Negative Utility of Chance from Diminishing Marginal Utility and the Preference for Safety”, Theory and Decision, 39, 241–265.
  • Raiffa, H., 1968, Decision analysis: Introductory lectures on choices under uncertainty, Reading, MA: Addison-Wesley.
  • Ramsey, F. P., 1926, “Truth and Probability”, in Foundations of Mathematics and other Essays, R. B. Braithwaite (ed.), London: Kegan, Paul, Trench, Trubner, & Co., 1931, 156–198; reprinted in Studies in Subjective Probability, H. E. Kyburg, Jr. and H. E. Smokler (eds.), 2nd edition, New York: R. E. Krieger Publishing Company, 1980, 23–52; reprinted in Philosophical Papers, D. H. Mellor (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990.
  • Savage, L.J., 1972, The Foundations of Statistics, 2nd edition, New York: Dover Publications, Inc.
  • Sen, A., 1977, “Rational Fools: A Critique of the Behavioral Foundations of Economic Theory”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 6, 317–344.
  • Shafer, G., 2007, “From Cournot’s principle to market efficiency”, in Augustin Cournot: Modelling Economics, Jean-Philippe Touffut (ed.), 55–95, Cheltenham: Edward Elgar.
  • Sidgwick, H., 1907. The Methods of Ethics, Seventh Edition. London: Macmillan. First Edition 1874.
  • Simon, H., 1956, “A Behavioral Model of Rational Choice”, The Quarterly Journal of Economics, 69, 99–118.
  • Skyrms, B., 1980. Causal Necessity: A Pragmatic Investigation of the Necessity of Laws, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • Sobel, J.H., 1994, Taking Chances: Essays on Rational Choice, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Spohn, W., 1977, “Where Luce and Krantz do really generalize Savage's decision model”, Erkenntnis, 11: 113–134.
  • Stalnaker, R. [1972] 1981. “Letter to David Lewis.” In William Harper, Robert Stalnaker, and Glenn Pearce, eds., Ifs: Conditionals, Belief, Decision, Chance, and Time, pp. 151–152, Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • Suppes, P., 2002, Representation and Invariance of Scientific Structures. Stanford: CSLI Publications.
  • Thalos, M. and Richardson, O., 2013, “Capitalization in the St. Petersburg game: Why statistical distributions matter”, Politics, Philosophy & Economics, 1–22.
  • Weirich, P., 1986, “Expected Utility and Risk”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 37, 419–442.
  • Wiland, Eric, 2005, “Monkeys, typewriters, and objective consequentialism”, Ratio, 18: 352–360.
  • Zynda, L., 2000, “Representation Theorems and Realism about Degrees of Belief”, Philosophy of Science 67: 45–69.

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2014 by
Rachael Briggs <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free