#### Supplement to Defeasible Reasoning

## Semantic Inheritance Networks

A path is a sequence of links in a graph *G*, with the final node of
each link being the initial node of the next, where all the links, with
the possible exception of the last one, are positive. A
*generalized* path is a sequence of links that can contain
negative links anywhere, and more than one. Each path has both an
initial node and a final node. A path can be taken as representing an
assertion about an individual: that the individual corresponding to the
initial node belongs to the category corresponding to the final node.
The *degree* of a path is the length of the longest generalized
path connecting the path's initial node to its final node.

Horty, Thomason, and Touretzky define the relation of
*support* between graphs (cognitive states) and paths
(assertions) by mathematical induction on the degree of the path.
Direct links (paths of length one) are always supported by the
graph.

- If σ is a positive path,
*x*→ σ¹ →*u*→*y*, then*G*supports σ iff:*G*supports path*x*→ σ¹ →*u*.*u*→*y*is a direct link in*G*.- The negative link
*x*→⁄*y*does not belong to*G*. - for all
*v*, τ such that*G*supports*x*→ τ →*v*, with the negative link*v*→⁄*y*in*G*, there exist*z*, τ¹, τ² such that*z*→*y*is in*G*, and either*z*=*x*, or*G*supports the path*x*→ τ¹ →*z*→ τ² → v.

- If σ is a negative path,
*x*→ σ¹ →*u*→⁄*y*, then*G*supports σ iff:*G*supports path*x*→ σ¹ →*u*.*u*→⁄*y*is a direct negative link in*G*.- The positive link
*x*→*y*does not belong to*G*. - for all
*v*, τ such that*G*supports*x*→ τ →*v*, with the positive link*v*→*y*in*G*, there exist*z*, τ¹, τ² such that*z*→⁄*y*is in*G*, and either*z*=*x*, or*G*supports the path*x*→ τ¹ →*z*→ τ² →*v*.

The definition ensures that each potentially conflicting path be preempted by a path with a specificity-based priority.