Notes to Religion and Political Theory

1. Strauss borrows the phrase from Spinoza. Smith (2006) lucidly explores Strauss' views.

2. It proves tricky to distinguish religious from secular reasons. For our purposes, we'll assume that a secular reason is a set of claims that does not include among its members any claim that has more or less explicit theistic content, such as the claims that God exists, that the Bible has been inspired by God, or that the Pope accurately represents the divine will. A religious reason, by contrast, is a set of claims that does include as a member a claim that has such content. Far more complicated is what to make of the concept of a “plausible” or “adequate” secular rationale. Advocates of the standard position have articulated widely varying accounts. We broach this issue in the next section.

3. Three clarifying points: first, the DRR has been formulated in importantly different ways. In this essay, we consider what we take to be one of its most plausible formulations. Second, there is conceptual space for the view that coercive legislation requires the support of both religious and secular reasons. Since this view goes undefended, we will not explore it. Finally, there are correlates of the DRR that apply to occupants of social roles other than being a citizen. For example, there are correlates of the DRR that we could formulate for judges, legislators, military officers, and other public servants. For simplicity's sake, we focus on its application to citizens. That said, some theorists claim that citizens need not adhere to the DRR, or any relevant correlate, by virtue of the fact that their causal contribution to the enactment of coercive state measures is negligible. For discussion, see Kevin Vallier, (2014).

4. To be maximally explicit: we assume that if a citizen believes that she has only a religious rationale for supporting a coercive law, then she also believes that she does not have a plausible secular rationale for supporting that law, which she can offer to other citizens.

5. Habermas, it should be noted, gives citizens wide latitude to rely on their religious convictions in public political discourse, but also advocates expunging religious intrusions from the legislative record.

6. It is plausible to hold that the normative standards that apply to the political role of religious reasons are context sensitive. For example, religious reasons might play importantly different justificatory roles in liberal democracies that have relevantly different histories, traditions, levels of commitment to liberal democracy, and the like. To keep things manageable, in this essay, we'll have our eye on liberal democracies that bear a close resemblance to that found in the United States.

7. In that case, advocates of the DRR might require that citizens have a sufficiently wide spread of secular reasons, though there is room for considerable disagreement regarding how wide that spread must be.

8. Mar Aba's commitment to “free faith” has been echoed by many and varied religious thinkers, from the early church fathers Tertullian and Lactantius to the early modern theorists Sebastian Castellio, John Locke, and Roger Williams. This free faith argument is a religious argument insofar as it depends crucially on a claim about what makes for genuine piety, a claim that some religious traditions have rejected (Digeser, 2000).

9. For an expression of such a view, see Stout (2004).

10. It is important to stress, however, that the argument receives other formulations. For a nice summation, see Boettcher (2007).

11. For a probing treatment of Qutb's objections to liberal democracy, see Berman (2003).

12. A point of clarification: we assume that even laws that protect certain freedoms, such as the right to religious freedom, are coercive. For such laws prohibit figures such as Qutb from practicing their religion as they see fit; they are coercively prevented from, among other things, implementing shariah code as legally binding.

On a different note, it might seem that figures such as Qutb pose no threat to the standard view. For it might be claimed that Qutb is not reasonable in the relevant sense. Why not? To be reasonable in the relevant sense is to be willing to cooperate with others. And, thus, it is to agree to fair terms of social cooperation. Since coercion need be justifiable only to persons who are reasonable in this sense, the presence of figures such as Qutb does not undermine the legitimacy of government's coercive enforcement of the right to religious freedom.

Suppose, however, that what leads Qutb to reject a right to religious freedom has nothing to do with his lack of concern for fair cooperation and everything to do with a particular set of background theological commitments that determine how fair cooperation should take place. According to these background theological commitments, rejection of a robust right to religious freedom is essential to social harmony and communal flourishing. Those who insist on the coercive imposition of that right are a grave danger to both individual and communal well-being. If this is correct, it is precisely Qutb's willingness to cooperate with others that leads him to reject religious freedom.

Advocates of the standard view will not be satisfied with this response. The fact that Qutb relies in this way on his religious convictions to determine what counts as legitimate social cooperation is precisely what they regard as unreasonable. Suffice it to say that the role that appeals to reasonableness (and reciprocity) play in these discussions is vexed.

13. Perry further argues that the inviolability of the person can be defended satisfactorily only on theistic grounds. Other liberal critics, such as Stout, however, do not accept this claim.

14. Of course, advocates of the standard view have the option of reformulating the DRR in a manner that accords to religious and secular reasons exactly the same justificatory force. According to such a reformulation, a citizen may support only those coercive laws for which she has, and is prepared to offer, some spread of reasons that provide all affected parties with reason that they regard as plausible. According to this reformulation of the DRR, if a citizen knows that some of her compatriots have (what they regard as) compelling religious objections to a given coercive law, and if she cannot meet these objections, then she should not support that law. She should do so even if she has a plausible secular rationale for it. As we say, a version of the standard view that incorporates this thorough-going impartiality between the religious and the secular is a theoretical possibility, though we doubt that many advocates of the standard view will be inclined to embrace it. (So far as we know, only one has formulated a version of it; see Gaus, forthcoming.)

15. This is what Rawls calls “the proviso”: reasonable comprehensive doctrines (and so religious reasons) may be offered “in public reason at any time, provided that in due course public reasons … are presented sufficient to support whatever the comprehensive doctrines are introduced to support” (1993: li-lii).

16. By saying that the narrative is similar to MacIntyre's, we do not mean to claim that the New Traditionalists simply borrow their narrative from MacIntyre. It is true that New Traditionalists such as Hauerwas borrow liberally from MacIntyre. But, as best we can tell, New Traditionalists such as Milbank tell a narrative that is not so much indebted to MacIntyre's as isomorphic with it in crucial respects.

17. Thus, for example, Tertullian (2004): “It is a fundamental human right, a privilege of nature, that every man should worship according to his own convictions: one man's religion neither harms nor helps another man. It is assuredly no part of religion to compel religion—to which free will and not force should lead us—the sacrificial victims even being required of a willing mind. You will render no real service to your gods be compelling us to sacrifice. For they can have no desire of offerings from the unwilling, unless they are animated by a spirit of contention, which is a thing altogether undivine.”

Copyright © 2015 by
Chris Eberle <>
Terence Cuneo <>

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