Republicanism

First published Mon Jun 19, 2006; substantive revision Tue Apr 15, 2014

In political theory and philosophy, the term ‘republicanism’ is generally used in two different, but closely related, senses. In the first sense, republicanism refers to a loose tradition or family of writers in the history of western political thought, including especially: Machiavelli and his fifteenth-century Italian predecessors; the English republicans Milton, Harrington, Sidney, and others; Montesquieu and Blackstone; the eighteenth-century English commonwealthmen; and many Americans of the founding era such as Jefferson and Madison. The writers in this tradition emphasize many common ideas and concerns, such as the importance of civic virtue and political participation, the dangers of corruption, the benefits of a mixed constitution and the rule of law, etc.; and it is characteristic of their rhetorical style to draw heavily on classical examples—from Cicero and the Latin historians especially—in presenting their arguments. (In light of the last point, this is sometimes referred to as the ‘classical republican’ or ‘neo-roman’ tradition in political thought.)

Beyond this brief sketch of the classical republican tradition, there exists considerable historiographical controversy—with respect to who the tradition's members are, and their relative significance; with respect to how we should interpret its underlying philosophical commitments; and with respect to its role (especially vis-à-vis liberalism) in the historical development of modern political thought. This brings us to the second sense of the term ‘republicanism’. In contemporary political theory and philosophy, it most often refers to a specific (and still contested) interpretation of the classical republican tradition, associated especially with the work of Quentin Skinner; together with a research program dedicated to developing insights from this tradition into an attractive contemporary political doctrine, associated especially with the work of Philip Pettit. According to republicans in this second sense (sometimes called ‘civic republicans’ or ‘neo-republicans’), the paramount republican value is political liberty, understood as non-domination or independence from arbitrary power. This entry will primarily discuss republicanism in this second sense.

In their interpretation of the classical republicanism tradition, civic republicans are often in debate with civic humanists, with whom they are often confused (see the entry on civic humanism). Developed as a contemporary political doctrine, civic republicanism is broadly speaking progressive and liberal, but not without important distinct features. Some of its policy implications diverge from mainstream liberalism in particular ways, and for this reason civic republicans are sometimes also confused with communitarians (see the entry on communitarianism). For the strengths or weakness of civic republicanism to be fairly assessed, both confusions should be assiduously avoided.


1. Political Liberty as Non-Domination

Absolutely central to the contemporary civic republican program is the conception of political liberty as non-domination or independence from arbitrary power, and so it makes good sense to begin with an explication of this idea.

1.1 Political Liberty, Positive and Negative

It is notorious that there are several competing conceptions of political liberty. The now standard account was laid down most influentially by Isaiah Berlin in his famous lecture on “Two Concepts of Liberty” (Berlin 1969). According to the first, ‘negative’ conception of liberty, people are free simply to the extent that their choices are not interfered with. There are many variations on this conception, depending on how exactly one wants to define ‘interference’, but they all have in common the basic intuition that to be free is, more or less, to be left alone to do whatever one chooses. This idea of negative liberty Berlin associates especially with the classic English political philosophers Hobbes, Bentham, and J. S. Mill, and it is today probably the dominant conception of liberty, particularly among contemporary Anglo-American philosophers. In Mill's well-known words, “the only freedom which deserves the name, is that of pursuing our own good in our own way, so long as we do not attempt to deprive others of theirs” (1859, 17).

The second, ‘positive’ conception of liberty is not quite so easy to define. Roughly speaking, a person or group is free in the positive sense to the extent that they exercise self-control or self-mastery. It is not agreed, however, what exactly constitutes this self-mastery in the relevant sense. According to one particularly influential account, to be free in the positive sense is to be able to act on one's second-order desires (Frankfurt 1982). For example, the addicted gambler may be free in the negative sense not to gamble—since no one actually forces him to—, but he is not free in the positive sense unless he can actually succeed in acting on his presumed second-order desire not to desire gambling. Berlin associates this second conception especially with such continental philosophers as Spinoza, Rousseau, and Hegel. Although it found some support among English Hegelians like T. H. Green, those who advocate the positive conception of liberty have generally been in the minority, particularly among contemporary Anglo-American philosophers.

The troubling implications of the positive conception of liberty are well-known, and need not be rehearsed here. For the most part, these stem from the problem that freedom in the positive sense would seem to license fairly extensive coercion on behalf of individuals’ allegedly ‘real’ interests—for example, coercively forcing the gambler to quit on the presumption that this is, in fact, what he really wants to do (even if he doesn’t say so). Regarding this danger, Berlin writes:

It is one thing to say that I may be coerced for my own good which I am too blind to see: this may, on occasion, be for my benefit … . [But] it is another to say that if it is my good, then I am not being coerced, for I have willed it, whether I know this or not, and am free (or ‘truly’ free) even when my poor earthly body and foolish mind bitterly reject it, and struggle against those who seek however benevolently to impose it … . (1969, 134)

Liberals like Berlin have thus understandably rejected the positive, and emphatically embraced the negative conception of liberty. The question remains, however, whether the received view of negative liberty as non-interference in particular adequately captures the political ideal we should be most interested in. Contemporary civic republicans argue that it does not.

1.2 Liberty as Non-Domination

By way of illustration, consider the following scenarios (both are standard examples in the republican literature). In the first, imagine a group of slaves with a generally well-meaning master. While the latter has an institutionally-protected right to treat his slaves more or less as he pleases (he might start whipping them just for the heck of it, say), let us suppose that this master in particular leaves his slaves for the most part alone. Now to the extent that he does not in fact interfere with his slaves on a day-to-day basis, we are committed to saying—on the non-interference view of liberty—that they enjoy some measure of freedom. Some find this conclusion deeply counterintuitive: if there is anything to the idea of political liberty, one might think, surely it cannot be found in the condition of slavery!

Even if we are willing to accept this conclusion, the non-interference view of liberty commits us to others that are perhaps even more paradoxical. For one thing, notice that we are committed to saying that the slaves of our well-meaning master enjoy greater freedom than the slaves of an abusive master down the road. Of course, the former slaves are better off in some respect than the latter, but do we really want to say that they are more free? For another, consider the slave who, over time, comes to understand his master’s psychological dispositions better and better. Taking advantage of this improved insight, he manages to keep on his master’s good side, and is consequently interfered with less and less. Thus, on the non-interference view of liberty, we are committed to say that his freedom is increasing over time. Again, while it is clear that the slave’s greater psychological insight improves his well-being in some respect, do we really want to say that it increases his freedom specifically?

Now consider a second scenario. Imagine the colony of a great imperial power. Suppose that the colonial subjects have no political rights, and thus that the imperial power governs them unilaterally. But further suppose that the imperial power, for one reason or another, chooses not to exercise the full measure of its authority—that its policy towards the colony is one of more or less benign neglect. From the point of view of liberty as non-interference, we must conclude that the colonial subjects enjoy considerable freedom with respect to their government for, on a day-to-day basis, their government hardly ever interferes with them. Next suppose that the colonial subjects revolt with success, and achieve political independence. The former colony is now self-governing. We may imagine, however, that the new government is somewhat more active than its imperial predecessor, passing laws and instituting policies that interfere with people’s lives to a greater extent than formerly was the case. On the view of liberty as non-interference, we must therefore say that there has been a decline in freedom with independence. As in the first scenario, many find this counterintuitive. Surely, a nation that has secured its independence from colonial rule must have increased its political liberty.

What these examples are driving at is that political liberty might best be understood as a sort of structural relationship that exists between persons or groups, rather than as a contingent event. Whether a master chooses to whip his slave on any given day, we might say, is a contingent event: it all depends on the master’s mood, the slave’s behavior, and so forth. What is not contingent (or at least not in the same way) is the broader configuration of laws, institutions, and norms that effectively allow masters to treat their slaves however they please. As the ex-slave Frederick Douglass said of his former condition, “it was slavery—not its mere incidents—that I hated” (1855, 161).

The republican conception of political liberty aims to capture this insight as directly as possible. It defines freedom as a sort of structural independence—as the condition of not being subject to the arbitrary or uncontrolled power of a master. Pettit, who has done more than anyone else to develop this republican conception of freedom philosophically, puts it thus: a person or group enjoys freedom to the extent that no other person or group has “the capacity to interfere in their affairs on an arbitrary basis” (1999, 165; cf. Pettit 1996, 1997, 2001, 2003, 2012). On a plausible rendering of the term ‘domination’ as, roughly speaking, arbitrary or uncontrolled power (see Wartenberg 1990; Pettit 1996, 1997, 2012; Lovett 2001, 2010a), we might equivalently say that freedom in the republican sense consists in the secure enjoyment of non-domination. This view has since been widely embraced by republican-minded authors such as Skinner (1998, 2008), Viroli (2002), Maynor (2003), Laborde (2008, 2010), and Costa (2009, 2013).

1.3 Republican versus Negative Liberty

Notice that the republican view of freedom is, at least in the broad sense, a negative conception of political liberty. One need not do or become anything in particular to enjoy political liberty in the republican sense; one need not exercise self-mastery, on any view of what that entails, nor succeed in acting on one’s second-order desires (Skinner 1984; Spitz 1993). Republican freedom merely requires the absence of something, namely, the absence of any structural dependence on arbitrary power or domination. (Also like non-interference, non-domination comes in degrees: on the civic republican view, one is not either free or unfree, but rather more or less free depending on the extent of non-domination one securely enjoys.)

Despite these similarities, however, republican freedom is not equivalent to the received view of negative liberty as non-interference. In contrast to the non-interference view, it easily accounts for our intuitions in the two scenarios described above. The slave lacks freedom because he is vulnerable to the arbitrary power of his master; whether his master happens to exercise that power is neither here nor there. Likewise, what matters with respect to political freedom on the republican view is not how much the imperial power chooses to govern its colony, but the fact that the former may choose to govern the latter as much and however it likes. Thus Joseph Priestley described the lightly-governed American colonies as nevertheless in a condition of servitude because “by the same power, by which the people of England can compel them to pay one penny, they may compel them to pay the last penny they have” (1769, 140).

Moreover, the republican conception captures in a more intuitively satisfying way what would improve either situation with respect to political liberty. Most people are not inclined to say that slaves enjoy increasing freedom just because, with experience, they improve their insight into their master’s psychological dispositions. But many would be inclined to say that their freedom is enhanced, other things being equal, if some effective reform in the laws, institutions, or norms sharply reduces their master’s authority over them. (This is not necessarily to say that the slaves will enjoy greater well-being, all things considered—only that because their domination is lessened, they enjoy greater freedom to that extent.) And of course, no matter how benevolent their particular master happens to be, no slave can be completely free until the institution of slavery itself is abolished.

Political freedom, in other words, is constituted by rightly-ordered laws, institutions, and norms: “to enjoy such non-domination, after all, is just to be in a position where no one can interfere arbitrarily in your affairs,” writes Pettit, “and you are in that position from the moment that the institutions are in place” inhibiting potential arbitrary interference (1997, 107). Political freedom is most fully realized, on this view, in a well-ordered self-governing republic of equal citizens under the rule of law, where no one citizen is the master of any other (Pettit 1989, 1997, 2003, 2012; Spitz 1993, 1995; Maynor 2003). In the classic expression of James Harrington, such a community would be an “empire of laws and not of men” (1656, 8).

2. Republican Liberty: Problems and Debates

The appeal of the republican conception of political liberty as independence from the arbitrary power of a master is perhaps understandable. This is not to say, however, that this conception is uncontroversial. Before discussing its role in developing contemporary civic republican arguments, we should consider various problems and debates surrounding the republican idea of freedom.

2.1 What about non-interference?

A common objection to the republican idea of freedom is that it fails to pick out an distinct conception at all. The suggestion here, first noted perhaps by Paley (1785), is that talking about non-domination is really just another (more obscure) way of talking about security of non-interference (Goodin 2003; Carter 2008; Kramer 2008). Contemporary civic republicans must reject this view. Pettit (1997, 73–4; 2008) observes that one might secure a low expected level of non-interference in more than one way, and the republican idea of freedom is by no means indifferent as to the method adopted. For example, to have a master with an exceptionally benevolent disposition is to be reasonably secure in one’s expectation that one will not often be adversely interfered with—but it is to have a master nonetheless. The republican idea of freedom specifically instructs us not to make our master a better person (the goal of the old ‘mirror for princes’ literature), but to render him less of a master (Lovett 2012b). This can only be done by curbing either his arbitrary power, or his subjects’ dependency on him.

Supposing then that non-domination and non-interference are indeed distinct ideas, one might wonder where this leaves the latter, on the civic republican view of things. Is obtaining freedom from arbitrary power the only thing we should care about? Roughly speaking, there are three possible answers civic republicans might give to this question.

The first is simply to answer yes. It was a mistake, one might argue, to ever think non-interference important or desirable in itself. Of course, as a contingent empirical fact, extensive arbitrary power often brings extensive interferences in train (slave masters and absolute monarchs just can’t help meddling in their subjects’ affairs, we might suppose), so it is understandable that our distaste for the former should influence our assessment of the latter. There are good reasons for rejecting this first answer, however. Imagine living in a community where our lives are regulated down to the tiniest detail, but always in strict accordance with commonly-known, non-arbitrary rules and procedures. Although we enjoy extensive freedom from arbitrary power, we have hardly any freedom of individual choice. Most would not want to live in such a community, and this suggests that we do indeed place some independent value on non-interference (cf. Wall 2001).

This leaves two other possible answers. On the one hand, we might try to incorporate some measure of non-interference into our idea of freedom as non-domination. Something like this approach was initially taken by Pettit (1997, 74–7): there he distinguished between factors that “compromise” liberty, and factors that “condition” it. Perhaps my republican freedom is compromised when someone gains arbitrary power over me, but it is merely conditioned when I lack the means or opportunities to make full use of it, and interferences might be one such conditioning factor. On the other hand, we might allow that republican freedom and non-interference are distinct goods, but hold that both are valuable in some degree. We might either regard them as having roughly equal value (Skinner 1998), or we might regard republican liberty as having greater importance than non-interference, other things being equal (Viroli 2002, Pettit 2012). Each of these options has its advantages and disadvantages, and there is no settled view in the contemporary civic republican literature on this point. 

2.1 What Counts as ‘Arbitrary’ Power?

A second major difficulty in developing the republican idea of freedom lies in giving precise meaning to the notion of arbitrariness. According to what criteria are we to consider power ‘arbitrary’? Not simply when its exercise is random or unpredictable. This view would undermine the whole point of the republican conception of political liberty. As discussed above, with long experience a slave is better able to predict his master’s behavior, and so it appears less random to him, but (the civic republican wants to argue) the slave does not enjoy greater freedom by that fact alone. Just because one is better able to cope with arbitrary power, it does not follow that one's domination is any less.

‘Discretionary’ is much closer to the relevant meaning of arbitrary, but it is not quite right either. Discretionary power might be delegated to a public agency with a view to advancing certain policy goals or ends—as for example Congress has delegated discretionary authority to the Federal Reserve—but we would not want to say that this reduces our freedom (or, at any rate, not so long as that discretionary authority is appropriately answerable to a common knowledge understanding of the goals or ends it is meant to serve and the means it is permitted to employ). For reasons explained in the fourth section of this entry, contemporary civic republicans must be able to offer an account of non-arbitrary, yet discretionary authority.

How then should we define arbitrary power? Broadly speaking, two answers have been proposed. The first defines it procedurally. Power is arbitrary, on this view, to the extent that it is not reliably constrained by effective rules, procedures, or goals that are common knowledge to all persons or groups concerned (Lovett 2001, 2010a). To be reliably effective, on this view, constraints must be resilient over a wide range of possible changes or modifications in the relevant circumstances (Lovett 2012c). Roughly speaking, the procedural view equates republican freedom with the traditional idea of the rule of law, provided we are willing to extend the latter idea considerably (List 2006).

Alternatively, we might define arbitrariness substantively: power is arbitrary, on this second view, when it fails to track the “welfare and world-view” of those affected (Pettit 1997, 56). This substantive definition, however, is open to at least three possible interpretations, depending on whether we interpret the welfare and world-view of those affected as (a) their objectively-defined interests, (b) their subjective preferences, or (c) their shared ideas as expressed through suitably-structured deliberative procedures. These might be called the common good, welfarist, and democratic interpretations, respectively (see Richardson 2002). The disadvantages of the welfarist interpretation are obvious in light of well-known preference aggregation problems. In earlier work, Pettit (1997) seemed to many readers inclined towards some version of the common good interpretation, but this too has significant drawbacks. In particular, it would seem to collapse our conception of republican freedom into a general account of the human good (Larmore 2004; Costa 2007; Carter 2008). Thus many contemporary civic republicans have followed Pettit’s lead in latching on to the democratic interpretation (Pettit 1999, 2001; Richardson 2002; Maynor 2003; Bellamy 2007; Bohman 2008).

In an effort to bypass this often confusing debate, however, Pettit has recently proposed dropping the traditional language of arbitrary power altogether: instead, we should properly concern ourselves with powers of interference that are “uncontrolled” (2012, 58). This would reorient discussion towards the issue of whether republican freedom requires that such powers be controlled by those persons affected specifically (the democratic view), or whether control by impersonal laws or norms might be sufficient (the procedural view). It remains to be seen how the literature will evolve from here.

2.3 Republican Freedom and the Human Good

So far we have assumed that, however ultimately defined, republican freedom is always a good thing. Some have wondered whether this is the case, however. This objection is most often expressed via the example of benevolent care-giving relationships. On the republican view that one enjoys freedom only to the extent that one is independent from arbitrary power, it would seem that children do not enjoy republican freedom with respect to their parents. But surely, one might suppose, the parent-child relationship is (in most cases) an extremely valuable one, and so we would not want greater republican freedom in such a context. Republican freedom is, perhaps, not always a good thing (Ferejohn 2001).

As stated, this objection rests on a conceptual error, though (as we shall see) it points to an important set of issues as yet under-developed in the contemporary civic republican literature. The error in the above example stems from our confusing an overall evaluation of a whole with an evaluation of its parts considered separately. It is undeniable that, at least in the ordinary course of things, parent-child relationships are extremely valuable, considered as a whole; it does not follow from this, however, that this relationship is necessarily valuable in each and every part. For the objection to hold, it must be the case—not only that the parent-child relationship is valuable overall—but further, that that it would actually be worse if, holding all its other features constant, it involved less arbitrary power. But this is highly doubtful. Clearly, the introduction of children’s rights into western law was a boon, precisely because it reduced the degree of arbitrary power to which children are inevitably subject (which is to say, because it increased their republican freedom). That their republican freedom cannot be increased still further, perhaps, without destroying family life altogether, and thus losing its many other benefits, is neither here nor there.

What consideration of this faulty objection does reveal, however, is that republican freedom is simply one good among others, with which it might come into conflict (Markell 2008). The challenge for contemporary civic republicans, therefore, is not to show why the freedom from dependence on arbitrary power is an important human good (for which there are plenty of good arguments in the literature: see Pettit 1997; Maynor 2003; Labourde 2008; Lovett 2010a), but rather to show how republican freedom fits into a broader conception of human flourishing, and specifically, the comparative weight we should assign to republican freedom vis-à-vis other important human goods in the achievement of human flourishing. Pettit (2005) sketches a case for the relative priority of republican liberty on more or less pragmatic grounds: roughly speaking, he argues that political doctrines will be most effective when they concentrate of as few core values as possible, and accordingly that the best values to concentrate on are those whose promotion will service as wide a range of needs as possible. Republican freedom is just such a good, he claims, insofar as our efforts to promote it will necessarily have far-reaching beneficial consequences. It will be more clear why this might be so in light of the discussion in part four below, but regardless there remains considerable work to be done developing the foundations of republican theory.

3. The Classical Republican Tradition

Contemporary civic republicans have drawn on insights from the classical republican tradition in developing their political doctrines. But their interpretation of this tradition is hardly uncontroversial. This section will discuss the relevant debates, and explain how they relate to the conception of political liberty outlined above.

3.1 The Neo-republican Revival

After long-standing neglect among historians of political thought, there has been a dramatic revival of interest in the classical republican tradition in the past fifty years or so. For the first few decades of this revival, a particular interpretation of that tradition prevailed. According to this view, the classical republicans held what would now be described as a perfectionist political philosophy—that is, a political philosophy centered on the idea of promoting a specific conception of the good life as consisting in active citizenship and healthy civic virtue on the one hand, while combating any sort of corruption that would undermine these values on the other. This distinctive vision of the good life is supposed to be rooted in the experience of the ancient Greek polis, especially as expressed in the writings of Aristotle. The goods of active political participation, civic virtue, and so on, are to be understood as intrinsically valuable components of human flourishing.

It is now standard to refer to this as the ‘civic humanist’ interpretation of the classical republican tradition. Major figures associated with this view include Arendt (1958, 1963, 1968), Wood (1969), Pocock (1975), Worden (1994), Rahe (1992), and Honohan (2002). The civic humanist program has left such an impression on political philosophers and theorists generally that it probably remains the more widespread view today, especially among those who are not themselves experts in the history of political thought. This no doubt largely accounts for the continuing confusion of civic republicanism with civic humanism.

Among the more specialized historians of political thought, however, civic humanism has largely, though not entirely, given way to civic republicanism. This has in large part been due to the path-breaking research of Skinner (1978, 1984, 1991). Following his lead, contemporary civic republicans have in recent years advanced revised interpretations of Machiavelli (Skinner 1981, 1983, 1984; Viroli 1990, 1998), the seventeenth-century English republicans (Skinner 1998, 2000; Dzelzainis 1995, 2001; Lovett 2005, 2012a), Rousseau (Viroli 1988; Spitz 1995), Wollstonecraft (Coffee 2012), and the Americans of the founding era (Sellers 1994), among others.

3.2 The Historiographical Debate

One relatively simple way to characterize the contemporary debate between civic humanists and civic republicans is as a debate regarding the meaning of political liberty in the classical republican tradition. If there is one overriding commitment shared by all the classical republicans, it is clearly their commitment to the paramount value of political liberty. This fact is obvious from even the most casual reading of the relevant texts and, naturally, is denied by no one; the question is only what to make of it.

As we have seen, civic humanists argue that the goods of active political participation, civic virtue, and so on, should be understood in the classical republican tradition as intrinsically valuable components of human flourishing. In order to reconcile this interpretation with the classical republican’s emphatic commitment to political liberty, however, one must interpret their view of freedom in a particular way. Specifically, freedom must be seen as consisting in an active participation in the political process of self-determination. In Arendt’s language, the polis is “a kind of theater where freedom could appear,” and the political sphere “is the realm where freedom is a worldly reality” (1968, 154). That is to say, to enjoy political freedom is to share in the good life, understood as active citizenship and civic virtue. Referring back to Berlin’s typology, this is clearly a sort of positive liberty.

It should come as no surprise that contemporary civic republicans interpret the classical tradition quite differently. A detailed examination of the source materials, in their view, illustrates that the classical republicans held a decidedly negative conception of political liberty—and indeed, the republican conception of freedom as independence from arbitrary or uncontrolled power in particular (see especially Skinner 1984, 1991, 1998, 2008; Spitz 1995; Pettit 1997; Viroli 2002). The idea of liberty in the classical republican tradition has its roots not in an Aristotelian vision of the ancient Greek polis, but rather in Roman jurisprudence with its fundamental and categorical distinction between free men and citizens on the one hand, and dependent slaves on the other (Skinner 1998, 2000).

Given the rhetorical prominence of liberty in the classical republican writings, it follows from their holding a negative conception of freedom that they cannot have been advancing a perfectionist political philosophy, as the civic humanists claim. This of course is not to deny the importance of active political participation, civic virtue, combating corruption, and so on to the classical republicans. But rather than viewing these as intrinsically valuable components of a particular vision of the good life, they must instead be viewed as instrumentally valuable for securing and preserving political liberty, understood as independence from arbitrary rule (Skinner 1984, 1991; Sunstein 1988; Spitz 1993; Maynor 2003; Lovett 2005; Costa 2009). Contemporary civic republicans argue that a careful reading of the classical republican texts firmly supports this instrumental view, rather than the intrinsic perfectionist view advanced by civic humanists.

3.3 Classical Republicanism and Liberalism

The contemporary civic republican interpretation carries with it what could be seen as an significant drawback, namely, it reduces dramatically the distance between classical republicanism and the mainstream liberal tradition. At one level, this should surprise no one. After all, classical republicans and classical liberals shared many political commitments (constitutionalism and the rule of law, for example), and many figures are regarded as central to both traditions (Montesquieu, for example). The difficulty arises, however, from the suggestion that on the new instrumental interpretation, republicanism for all intents and purposes collapses into liberalism (Herzog 1986; Haakonssen 1993; Patten 1996). Indeed, at one point in his Political Liberalism, Rawls explicitly states that his theory has “no fundamental opposition” with a non-perfectionist, instrumental interpretation of republicanism (1993, 205). What then could the advantage of civic republicanism over mainstream liberalism be?

The standard reply to this among contemporary civic republicans is to argue that there is indeed a connection between republicanism and liberalism, but that liberalism is “an impoverished or incoherent republicanism” (Viroli 2002, 61)—a bastard offshoot, so to speak, of what was originally a considerably more appealing political philosophy.

Republicanism does not collapse into liberalism if there is a real and substantial difference between the former’s view of liberty as independence from arbitrary or uncontrolled power, and the view of negative liberty as non-interference, generally embraced by the latter. Contemporary civic republicans, quite naturally, insist that there is. The significance of this difference will be easier to assess after the discussion below, but in the main it comes down to this: on the view of negative liberty as non-interference, any sort of public law or policy intervention counts by definition as an interference and, ergo, a reduction in freedom. Being committed to the received view of negative liberty, liberals thus tend to be overly hostile to government action (Pettit 1997, 2009).

On the republican view of political liberty, by contrast, public laws or policy interventions need not necessarily count as reductions in freedom. Provided that the law or policy is adopted and implemented in an appropriately non-arbitrary manner, the citizens’ freedom remains untouched. Indeed, if the law or policy ameliorates dependency, or curtails the arbitrary powers some exercise over others in the community, the freedom of citizens may be enhanced. In the classical tradition, this idea was often expressed as the idea that, as Blackstone for example puts it, “laws, when prudently framed, are by no means subversive but rather introductive of liberty” and thus “where there is no law, there is no freedom” (1765, 122). The grounds for this view will be explained further below.

4. The Contemporary Republican Program

However interesting the historiographical debates discussed in the previous section, one may still wonder whether republicanism has anything valuable to contribute to contemporary normative political theory and philosophy. One reason many people remain skeptical has to do with the fact that the classical republican writings often express views that are decidedly elitist, patriarchal, and militaristic. How could the basis for an appealing contemporary political program be found in such writings (Goldsmith 2000; Goodin 2003)?

That the classical republicans often expressed these very unappealing views is not disputed. But what are we to make of this fact? There are two possibilities. On the one hand, the parochialism of the classical republicans might reflect logical consequences of their core value commitments, in which case we cannot adopt the latter without taking on board the former. On the other hand, it might merely reflect the accidental prejudice of their day, in which case it can easily be dispensed with as we modernize the republican program. Now according to the civic humanist reading of the tradition, the classical republicans were committed to a perfectionist conception of the human good as active citizenship and civic virtue. On this view, it is clear that some individuals will be more successful than others in attaining the good so understood—some are more adept at politics than others, some are more capable of heroic displays of virtue than others, and so on. Indeed, political power and public honor are, to some extent, positional goods, meaning that their distribution among the members of a community will necessarily be unequal. It follows that, on the civic humanist reading of the tradition, the elitist bent of the classical republican writings is a consequence of their core values. As Arendt writes, it is “the sign of a well-ordered republic” that only the politically virtuous elite “would have the right to be heard in the conduct of the business of the republic” (1963, 279).

The civic republicans, naturally, reject this view. There is nothing inherently elitist about the ideal of freedom when this is understood negatively as independence from arbitrary or uncontrolled power. The classical republicans, to be sure, typically confined the extension of this ideal to a narrow range of propertied, native-born male citizens. But, on the civic republican reading of the tradition, this merely reflects an unnecessary prejudice we can easily dispense with. Suitably universalized, the classical republican ideal of freedom as non-domination is indeed a strikingly progressive political doctrine (Pettit 1997; Maynor 2003). Indeed, Pettit goes so far as to argue that the potentially radical nature of the ideal was itself partly the reason early liberals rejected it, in favor of a less demanding ideal of liberty as non-interference (1997, 49).

The remainder of this section will sketch some of the wide-ranging applications of a universalized republicanism, dedicated to the promotion of freedom as non-domination. Much of the contemporary republican program, as one would expect, bares some familial relationship with the political commitments of the classical republicans. There are also divergences, however. Contemporary civic republicans draw inspiration from the classical tradition, but they do not aim to anachronistically implement the republicanism of yore for its own sake.

4.1 Republican Public Policy

Contemporary civic republicans aim to promote freedom, understood as independence from arbitrary power. Roughly speaking, there are two directions from which republican freedom might be threatened. First, there is the obvious danger of an autocratic or despotic government assuming arbitrary powers over its subjects; this concern, and republican remedies for it, will be discussed below. But there is a second danger to republican freedom as well—one that concerns contemporary civic republicans just as much as the first. (Absent this second concern, republican policy would indeed often seem “indeterminate,” as observed by McMahon 2005 and Costa 2007.) This is the danger that some individuals or groups within civil society will succeed in assuming arbitrary or uncontrolled powers over others. A few examples will help clarify this second danger.

Imagine for a moment there were no system of domestic criminal and civil law. In this case, citizens would not know where they stood with one another; their interrelations would be governed simply by force—which is to say, by the arbitrary whim of the momentarily stronger party. In order to enjoy some degree of republican freedom, therefore, it is absolutely essential to introduce a domestic legal system so as to govern the citizens’ mutual relations. Notice that, on the republican view of freedom, the laws do not merely protect some freedoms at the expense of others (as on the non-interference view), but rather themselves actually introduce or enable that freedom. On this view, only when their interrelations are mutually governed by a system of commonly-known and stable rules is it possible for fellow citizens to enjoy some measure of independence from arbitrary rule (Pettit 1989, 1997, 2012; Viroli 2002; Dagger 2009).

This connection between the rule of law and freedom is a common theme in the classical republican literature. Contemporary civic republicans observe, however, that even when the rule of law is firmly established, there remain many other potential dangers of which the classical republicans were less well aware. For example, there is the danger that basic needs deprivations will place the least advantaged members of society in a position of economic vulnerability (Spitz 1993; Pettit 1997; Viroli 2002). In order to satisfy their basic needs, individuals may well submit themselves to the arbitrary power of exploitative employers or become dependent on the whims of voluntary charity (Dagger 2006; Lovett 2009, 2010a). Ensuring the enjoyment of republican freedom may therefore require some public provision for otherwise unmet basic needs.

Yet another danger to republican freedom arises in the context of family life and gender relations. Traditional family law subjected both wives and children to considerable arbitrary power: circumstances in the case of the latter, circumscribed opportunities in the case of the former, ensured the nearly complete dependency of both on the family they happened to be in. The contemporary civic republican program is thus congenial to both an expansion of children’s rights, and the elimination of sex domination (Pettit 1997; Phillips 2000; Costa 2013).

It is always important from a civic republican point of view to be on guard against the introduction of new forms of dependency and arbitrary power through those very laws and policies designed to enhance individual freedom, however. In the area of criminal and civil law, for example, freedom might be threatened by legal uncertainty or prosecutorial discretion; and, of course, there are grave republican concerns with respect to the existing system of punishment in many western nations (Braithwaite and Pettit 1990). These dangers might suggest the need for a more democratized system of criminal justice (Martí 2009). Similarly, in the public provision of basic needs, there are republican concerns with respect to dependence on government aid and arbitrariness in the distribution of benefits that might point to the introduction of an unconditional basic income (Lovett 2009, 2010a). In many of these areas, however, there remains considerable work for contemporary civic republicans in determining the appropriate public policy implications of a universalized concern for republican freedom.

4.2 Republican Political Institutions

Turning from questions of public policy to the form of government, we return to issues more familiar to the writers in the classical tradition. Protecting citizens from the arbitrary or uncontrolled power of their government through good institutional design represents perhaps the signature classical republican concern. Many of the standard devices for achieving this aim—the rule of law, the separation of powers, federalism, constitutionally entrenched basic rights, and so on—have been adopted by liberals and others. Contemporary civic republicans, naturally, remain committed to these institutional devices in some measure (Pettit 1997, 2001, 2012; Maynor 2003).

However, contemporary civic republicans also recognize that these sorts of devices can only go so far. The basic reason for this is that, no matter how carefully designed, the operation and functioning of government necessarily entails considerable discretion on the part of public authorities (Pettit 1997; Richardson 2002). There are two especially prominent instances of this. First, it is clear that no matter how detailed and carefully-crafted it is, no system of explicit rules and regulations can possibly cover all contingencies and circumstances. It follows that discretionary authority must inevitably be left in the hands of courts, public agencies, and administrative bureaucracies. Second, even apart from this, there remains extensive discretion in the hands of legislatures to set public law and policy in the first place. A daily-changing system of rules is no better than having no rules at all.  

The standard republican remedy for this problem is enhanced democracy. It must, however, be democracy of the right sort. Most contemporary civic republicans reject the populist model of democracy according to which all public laws and policies must express the collective will of the people in order to be considered legitimate. Instead, they generally endorse some form of “qualified populism” (Richardson 2002) or “contestatory democracy” (Pettit 1997, 1999, 2001, 2012; Maynor 2003). Roughly speaking, the idea is that properly-designed democratic institutions should give citizens the effective opportunity to contest the decisions of their representatives. This possibility of contestation will make government agents wielding discretionary authority answerable to a public understanding of the goals or ends they are meant to serve and the means they are permitted to employ. In this way, discretionary power can be rendered non-arbitrary in the sense required for the secure enjoyment of republican liberty.

Next, of course, we will want to know what, pragmatically speaking, the requirements of suitable democratic contestation turn out to be. These are commonly addressed under three headings, outlined by Pettit (1997). The first and most thoroughly discussed is the requirement that discretionary decision-making be guided by the norm of deliberative public reasoning. This means that the relevant decision-makers (legislatures, courts, bureaucrats, etc.) must be required to present reasons for their decisions, and those reasons must be subject to open public debate (see Sunstein 1988, 1993; Pettit 1997; Richardson 2002). So, for example, legislative processes should be designed so as to discourage back-room bargaining on the basis of sectional interests, and to encourage open public deliberation instead. Similarly, bureaucratic agencies should not be allowed to merely issue determinations on the basis of technocratic expertise without offering reasons for their decisions that are open to public challenge.

The other two requirements have not received as much attention as the first, perhaps because both are relatively obvious. The second is that of inclusiveness. Opportunities for democratic contestation must be equally open to all persons and groups in the society. This requirement follows naturally from a universalized concern for republican liberty, and it has implications for the design of representative institutions, campaign financing, and so on (Pettit 1997; Bellamy 2007). And the third requirement is that there exist institutionalized forums for contestation—impartial ‘courts of appeal,’ so to speak, where citizens can raise objections to public laws and policies (Pettit 1997, 1999, 2012). Whether these forums should include constitutional courts with strong powers of judicial review remains a subject of debate in the republican literature, however (Bellamy 2007; Honohan 2009).

4.3 Civic virtue and corruption

Among the more salient themes in the classical republican tradition are the importance of civic virtue and the dangers of corruption. We may understand the term ‘corruption’ simply to mean the advancement of personal or sectional interest at the expense of the public good, and ‘civic virtue’ as its opposite—that is, a willingness to do one’s part in supporting the public good. Critics of republicanism often fear that this implies extensive self-sacrifice and frugality, a renunciation of individuality and self-identification with the community (Goodin 2003). These fears are no doubt encouraged by the civic humanist reading of the classical tradition along perfectionist lines. Civic republicans accordingly have been at pains to show the contrary—that civic virtue should be understood as a strictly instrumental good, useful in establishing and maintaining republican liberty. Far from calling for the subjection of individual to collective aims, they argue, republican liberty is desirable in part because it enables citizens to pursue their private aims with assurances of security (Skinner 1984, 1991; Spitz 1993; Viroli 2002; Maynor 2003).

Broadly speaking, there are two topics to consider under the heading of civic virtue. On the one hand, there is the civic virtue and danger of its corruption on the part of public officials; on the other, there is the civic virtue and danger of its corruption on the part of citizens in general. With respect to the former, republicans typically reject the view (common in the liberal tradition) that public officials are by nature corrupt, and instead view individuals as potentially corruptible, but not necessarily corrupt (Pettit 1997). Working from this assumption, it is a strictly pragmatic and empirical question what configuration of public laws, institutions, and norms is most likely to minimize the danger of corruption, and enhance the civic virtue of public officials. Options here include screening procedures on the selection of officials, rules and norms keeping some policy options out of bounds, and both positive and negative sanctions. In designing such institutions, it is important not to assume the worst of people, for otherwise we might inadvertently encourage (through an evident lack of trust) the very corrupt behavior one aims to guard against.

Promoting civic virtue on the part of the citizens in general, however, is just as important from a republican point of view. There are a variety of possible reasons for this. For the most part, they stem from the observation that the widespread enjoyment of republican liberty is most likely to be maximized in a community where the citizens are committed to that ideal, and each is willing to do his or her part in realizing it. For example, through collective political action, citizens can bring instances of domination to public attention; they can support laws and policies that would expand republican freedom; and they can do their part in defending republican institutions when called upon to do so. Promoting this sort of commitment to republican ideals will require a fairly robust program of civics education, together with a culture that rewards virtue with public esteem (Dagger 1997; Pettit 1997; Brennan and Pettit 2003; Maynor 2003; Costa 2009). Again, it should be emphasized here that citizens do not enjoy republican freedom, on the civic republican view, by being virtuous. Indeed, this could not be the case since, as argued earlier, the degree of republican freedom enjoyed is rather a question of how the laws, institutions, and norms of the community are ordered. Civic virtue is, however, instrumentally useful both in bringing about the right sorts of laws, institutions, and norms, and in ensuring their durability and reliability on the other.

Finally, it is worth mentioning the connection between civic virtue (both on the part of public officials and citizens in general) and the rule of law. The significance of the rule of law for republican liberty was discussed above; in the classical republican tradition, this was expressed as the “empire of law” ideal—the notion that in a free republic laws, not men, rule. Of course this cannot ever be literally true, but it can be approximated in a sort of artificial way, so that life can be experienced as if it were true within a given community. This requires, however, that the law be widely regarded as clear, predictable, and legitimate, and this in turn is possible only when there is a generally high level of compliance and when legal rules are embedded in a shared network of informal social norms (Pettit 1997).

5. Conclusion

In many respects, civic republicanism remains a still underdeveloped political doctrine. Further work is required in all the areas discussed above, and there are many issues central to the concerns of contemporary political theorists and philosophers that civic republicans have only recently begun to examine. Among the latter, there are now at least initial treatments of multiculturalism (Laborde 2008; Lovett 2010; Bachvorova 2013a), distributive justice (Dagger 2006; Lovett 2009), conservation and the environment (Slaughter 2008), and international relations and global justice (Bohman 2008; Laborde 2010; Pettit 2010; Lovett 2010b; Bochvorova 2013b), though substantial work certainly remains to be done. Nevertheless, civic republicanism is a dynamic and growing field, which stands to make continuing positive contributions to debate in contemporary social and political theory.

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