Notes to Gilbert Ryle

1. Anecdotal evidence (thanks to David Pears) is that Elizabeth Anscombe was scathing about The Concept of Mind when it was published. But what of Wittgenstein himself? On the one hand, in his letters he seemed dismissive of Ryle's work (McGuinness and Von Wright, 284); on the other, he is quoted (Monk, 436) as having told Ryle's cousin that Ryle was one of only two philosophers who understood his work. (Monk wonders whether this was a matter of mere politesse; I suspect not.)

2. Compare Wittgenstein:

The fundamental fact here is that we lay down rules, a technique, for a game, and that then when we follow the rules, things do not turn out as we assumed. That we are therefore entangled in our own rules.

This entanglement in our rules is what we want to understand (i.e. get a clear view of). (Wittgenstein, §125)

3. Compare Wittgenstein: “The preconceived idea of crystalline purity (of logic) can only be removed by turning our whole examination round…The philosophy of logic speaks of sentences and words in exactly the sense in which we speak of them in ordinary life…” (Wittgenstein, §108).

4. Ryle reminds us that there are various types of such indirect application which are not best construed as descriptions. Just as arithmetic does not describe inventories, but inventories satisfy arithmetical propositions, so does geometry not describe Asia, although geography is an application of geometry. For more discussion on various senses of ‘application’, see 1946b.

5. Kim describes in clear terms what the problem is and defends a (functional-reductive) version of physicalism as a solution to the problem.

6. Ryle's arguments against this supposition are in the chapters on Emotion and the Will (1949a). See Tanney 2008a for an attempt to capture the spirit of this critique.

7. The admission that there may be some mental states (as Freud has shown) that are not within the sight of our “mental eye” as such, is a mere variation, rather than a major deviation, Ryle points out, from the basic framework of the Official Doctrine.

8. Note that if the objects of perception and judgement are construed on the analogy with mental imagery (as, say, Lockean ideas) then the doctrine's underlying supposition about the function of language would lead not only to the essential privacy of mental language but to the necessary privacy of all language and eventually to idealism and solipsism.

9. In contemporary versions, this feature becomes a special mental property which is nonetheless tied (identical to, or realised by) physical properties (which are, in turn, widely supposed to depend upon the microphysical properties of the individuals). See Kim.

10. See Tanney 2008b for further discussion.

11. The qualifier ‘almost’ is needed in order to accommodate the idea that the inner processes are supposed to be content-bearing. Indeed, the category-error reaches its apex with the idea that mental predicates pick out inner, casually-efficacious, (probably at bottom) physical events with semantic or representational content.

12. A close reading of Fodor's (1968) criticism against “Rylean behaviourism” will show that, even though Fodor acknowledges that the conceptual link between mental predicates and behaviour is not one of translational or definitional equivalence but some elusive weaker (“criteriological”) relation, the “knock-down” arguments are against the definitional/translational behaviourism of the logical positivists; indeed, Fodor admits that he does not know what the weaker relation is supposed to be.

13. For Ryle's criticisms of verificationism see his 1936 and 1951a.

14. It is also usually conceded that the project of analysing actions in terms of muscular behaviour is doomed because there will be any number of different physical behaviours that could be involved, say, in an action (like paying a debt) and because identical physical behaviours admit of various action-descriptions.

15. Or, as he also puts it, the Occamist against the Platonist or Cartesian, or the deflators against the inflators.

16. Ryle does, however, want to deny that in imagining, pretending, and dreaming there is something shadowy that we see, hear, taste, smell, or feel (as we would deny, when a mock-murder is staged, that there is something shadowy that is really murdered). Actors who portray murderers do not commit murders with the elusive quality of being shams: they pretend to murder; they seem to murder. Just as stage-murders are not murders, imagined sights and sounds are not sights or sounds. Therefore they are not, as Hume suggested, vivid or less vivid sights or sounds. Nor, thus, are they private.

There is no answer to the spurious question ‘Where have you deposited the victim of your mock-murder?’ since there was no victim. There is no answer to the spurious question, ‘Where do the objects reside that we fancy we see?’ since there are no such objects. (1949a, 237)

17. The extent to which Ryle sides with the (then still unpublished work of) later Wittgenstein in rejecting descendents of Mill's theory of meaning is most stark in his “scolding” review of Carnap's Meaning and Necessity which he characterises as “an astonishing blend of technical sophistication with philosophical naïveté” (1949b, 235).

18. Ryle is here, as elsewhere, insisting on the idea that the primary role of certain (significant, affirmative) indicative sentences, even if they can be construed as having truth-values and as fact-stating, is often different. It is partly because of the multiplicity of jobs he accords to sentences in the region of discourses under consideration, but also for other reasons, that it is difficult to locate his position on the map charted by the realists and irrealists. This topic needs much more development, but see Tanney 2008a for additional discussion.

Copyright © 2009 by
Julia Tanney <>

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