Śāntarakṣita

First published Wed Dec 3, 2008; substantive revision Wed Mar 26, 2014

Śāntarakṣita (725–788)[1] was one of the most important and pivotal thinkers in the history of Indian and Tibetan Buddhist philosophy.[2] His contributions to Buddhist thought were particularly noteworthy due to his historical position as one of the later Indian interpreters of the Madhyamaka thought of Nāgārjuna (ca. 1st–2nd c.). This was an historical position which allowed him to consider many important developments (both inside and outside the Madhyamaka tradition) that preceded him.[3] The central claim of the Madhyamaka School is that all phenomena are empty (śūnya) of any intrinsic nature, unchanging essence, or absolute mode of being. This was the central idea in Śāntarakṣita's thought as well, however, he was a commentator on both Nāgārjuna and Dharmakīrti in equal measure. In fact, Śāntarakṣita attempted to integrate the anti-essentialism of Nāgārjuna with the logico-epistemological thought of of Dignāga (ca. 6th c.) and Dharmakīrti (ca. 7th c.) along with facets of Yogācāra/Cittamātra[4] thought into one internally consistent, yet fundamentally Madhyamaka system. His innovative integration of facets of the three into a Madhyamaka framework of analysis are exemplary of the unique fruits which benefit from his historical local. The synthesis of these three major movements in Indian Buddhist philosophy was perhaps his most important contribution, among many, to the Indian Buddhist philosophical tradition. This synthesis, which was also taken up by his disciples (important philosophers in their own right) such as Kamalaśīla and to a lesser extent, Haribhadra, has been characterized as the last major development in Indian Buddhist philosophy. Śāntarakṣita was a dynamic thinker and a scholar with both breadth and depth of knowledge of the Indian philosophical traditions. He encouraged his readers to actively engage with a host of non-Buddhist and Buddhist philosophical positions as they ascended a sort of hierarchy of philosophical views, a hierarchy that—in his opinion—culminates in the Madhyamaka view.

However, Śāntarakṣita's contribution to Buddhist philosophy as a whole did not stop in India. He made two trips to Tibet and ultimately spent the last fifteen years of his life there. Śāntarakṣita was one of the most influential figures in the early dissemination of Buddhism in Tibet, founding the first Buddhist monastery at Samye, serving as its first abbot, ordaining the first seven Tibetan monks, and establishing a system of rigorous philosophical study based upon the traditions of learning at the great Indian Buddhist monastic universities such as Nalanda and Vikramaśīla. In affect, Śāntarakṣita (and later, his disciple Kamalaśīla) taught Tibetans how to do philosophy. He introduced Tibetans to a plethora of Indian philosophical views, both Buddhist and non-Buddhist, and taught them how to study, critically analyze, and meditate upon these ideas. Several important qualities of Śāntarakṣita's thought that were unique to him in India, became a fully integrated modus operandi of philosophy in Tibet including his dynamic engagement with competing philosophical views and his integration of Madhyamaka and logico-epistemological thought. As such his influence impacted the spectrum of Tibetan philosophical literature, from the earliest philosophical doxographies such as Yeshe De's (ca. 8th c.) Distinguishing the Views (lta ba khyad par) to the commentaries and treatises of towering indigenous Tibetan philosophers such as Chaba Chökyi Senge (phwya pa chos kyi seng ge) (1109–1169), Sakya Pandita (sa skya paṇḍita) (1182–1251), Tsongkhapa (tsong kha pa) (1357–1419) and Mipham Gyatso (mi pham rgya mtsho) (1846–1912).


1. Śāntarakṣita's Madhyamaka Thought

Śāntarakṣita is probably best known as one of the great Indian Madhyamaka commentators. His thought in this regard has several features that make it unique including: his integration of Yoācāra thought, his integration of Buddhist logico-epistemological developments (discussed below), and his dynamic engagement with other Buddhist and non-Buddhist views (discussed below). His Madhyamaka view is most clearly and succinctly articulated in his text Madhyamakālaṃkāra (The Ornament of the Middle Way, hereafter, MA) and his own commentary on that text, Madhyamakālamkāravṛtti (The Auto-Commentary on The Ornament of the Middle Way, hereafter, MAV).[5]

1.1 The Two Truths: Ultimate Truths

A presentation of the two truths is a standard way by which Madhyamaka philosophers explain their views on the ontological status of phenomena. It is seen as the most effective method for coursing a “middle way” between the philosophical extremes of asserting the absolute existence of phenomena on the one hand, and the non-existence of them on the other. Thus, Mādhyamikas will routinely claim that phenomena lack a certain mode of existence ultimately, but claim that such phenomena, or objects of knowledge, maintain another mode conventionally. Virtually all Indian Madhyamaka philosophers will claim, in some detail, that an ultimate truth is an object's emptiness, or lack of having a truly existent essence or nature. This claim, which runs the danger of leading to nihilism, is then tempered to some degree by claims about the conventional mode of existence of those phenomena. Though phenomena do not ultimately exist, they do exist conventionally. The precise way in which individual Madhyamaka thinkers define and describe these two truths gets at the core of what makes each of these important thinkers unique. Śāntarakṣita is famous for presenting his views on ultimate truths by way of one of the most famous Buddhist philosophical arguments on the ontological status of phenomena, the neither-one-nor-many argument.

1.2 The Two Truths: The Neither-One-Nor-Many Argument

The first two-thirds of MA comprise what is perhaps the most well-known rendering of the neither-one-nor-many argument, one of the key philosophical arguments used by Madhyamaka philosophers to establish the emptiness, or lack of an inherent nature, in phenomena. It is by way of this argument and his summary that Śāntarakṣita offers his presentation of the two truths, ultimate truth (paramārthasatya) and conventional truth (saṃvṛtisatya). The two truths are not only the primary means by which Mādhyamika philosophers present their positions on ontology, but form the ground upon which issues of epistemology and logic are often discussed as well. The neither-one-nor-many argument is most succinctly presented in the first stanza of MA when he writes:

These entities, as asserted by our own [Buddhist schools] and other [non-Buddhist schools], have no inherent nature at all because in reality they have neither a singular nor manifold nature, like a reflected image.[6]

The point that Śāntarakṣita is attempting to make here is that no phenomena, including those which his philosophical rivals have claimed to have an inherently existent essence or nature, in fact do have such a nature. The reason they cannot have such a nature, according to the argument, is that they have neither a truly singular nature, nor a truly manifold nature, the two being exhaustive of all possibilities for entities that have a real nature.

Over the course of the next sixty stanzas in his ninety-seven stanza text, MA, and accompanying auto-commentary, MAV, Śāntarakṣita puts all those phenomena asserted by his Buddhist and non-Buddhist philosophical opponents to the test of the neither-one-nor-many reasoning. He begins by examining each instance in which some phenomena is asserted to be of a truly singular nature. Through an analysis that reveals that such phenomena must have parts and thus could not be truly singular, he makes his way through all such cases current in eighth century Indian philosophical discourse. For example, he begins his application of the argument with an analysis of the claim made by the non-Buddhist Sāṃkhya school that there is a Fundamental Nature (Prakṛti) or creator god which is the permanent, uncaused, unobstructed absolute cause of all phenomena and which is of a truly singular nature. He argues in the second stanza of MA:

Permanent, efficacious entities are not themselves singular because they contribute to the production of successive effects. If each successive effect is distinct, then [the argument in favor of] permanent efficacious entities [that are truly singular] degenerates.[7]

According to Śāntarakṣita, true singularity would be an absurd quality to claim for something which is permanent and has the ability to contribute to the periodic production of successive effects. If that were the case, there must be a part of the causal entity in moment #1 which contributes to the production of a seed, for example, a part in moment #2 which contributes to the production of the sprout, and a part in moment #3 which contributes to the production of a flower. Since the Fundamental Nature is described as the sole cause of the periodic arising of all effects, it must have all these parts, and more. It must have parts related with every entity for which it is a cause. The Fundamental Nature must include parts that cause entities to exist in one moment and parts that cause them to cease to exist or transform into something else in another. That which causes a seed to exist in moment #1 must have at least some quality or qualities that distinguish it from that which causes a sprout to exist in moment #2. At a bare minimum, his opponent must be forced to admit parts to such a Fundamental Nature. Something with manifold parts cannot, by definition, be truly singular. Śāntarakṣita thus considers that the application of this sort of reasoning undermines the existence of such a truly singular Fundamental Nature, as described in the Sāṃkhya system since it is illogical for there to be a permanent, truly singular, unobstructed cause of the successive effects of the manifold world. Arguments regarding the irrationality of asserting its permanence and those regarding its contradictions with our experience of causality in the world, are supplied in his own MAV on the above verse to strengthen his rejection of the notion of such a Fundamental Nature.

Śāntarakṣita is not only critical of his non-Buddhist philosophical opponents however. The bulk of the argument is addressed toward the views of philosophical opponents within in his own larger Buddhist camp that he feels have made errors in interpretation and logic. For example, he dedicates a lengthy portion of the neither-one-nor-many argument to criticisms of a variety of Buddhist claims about the true singularity of consciousness made by both Buddhists associated with the Sautrāntika schools and those associated with the Yogācāra/Cittamātra schools. In a variety of ways, proponents of these schools claim that consciousness is truly singular and yet can be a knower of a multiplicity of objects. For Śāntarakṣita, such claims are fraught with errors in logic. If consciousness knows a multiplicity of objects, then it must not be singular by definition. There must be a part of the consciousness that knows object A and another than knows object B. Various Buddhists who want to hold consciousness to be truly singular, have attempted to avoid these faults in a variety of ways. Some have attempted to claim they avoid the faults because they assert that there are an equal number of consciousnesses as objects. Others claim that they avoid these problems because they claim consciousness exists in a non-dual relationship with its objects. Each of these interpretive turns was met by Śāntarakṣita with logical analysis demonstrating what he considered to be the inevitable contradictions that ensue by the various attempts at claiming that consciousness is truly singular. In this manner, Śāntarakṣita analyzes a host of current claims of true singularity over the course of the first sixty stanzas of MA.

Having examined all those phenomena which his philosophical opponents claim have or are of a truly singular nature and determined through reasoned analysis that they in fact, could not possibly have or be of a truly singular nature, Śāntarakṣita proceeds to consider the possibility of there being a truly manifold nature in phenomena. Because a manifold nature would depend upon the aggregation of true singularities, he concludes that just as there can be no inherently singular nature, there also can be no inherently manifold nature. And since there is no third alternative for entities with an inherent nature, there must be no phenomena that have an inherently existent nature at all. While elaborated upon in greater detail in his auto-commentary, MAV, his terse summary of the neither-one-nor many argument is found in the sixty-first and sixty-second stanzas of MA as follows:

We have found with analysis that no entity, whatsoever, has an [inherently] single nature. Those that have no single nature must also not have a manifold nature.

The existence of an entity belonging to a class other than that which has a single or manifold [nature] does not make sense because the two are exhaustive of all possible alternatives.[8]

Thus, an object's lack of, or emptiness of having an inherently existent nature is an ultimate truth for Śāntarakṣita. This position, he feels, has been logically established by way of the neither-one-nor-many argument.

1.3 The Two Truths: Conventional Truths

In a variety of ways, virtually all Mādhyamika's reject the existence of an ultimate, absolute, unchanging nature in things, as Śāntarakṣita has done in the first sixty-two stanzas of MA. This is a key component in their presentations of ultimate truths. The anti-essentialist position of rejecting an ultimate nature in phenomena enables a Mādhyamika, such as Śāntarakṣita in this case, to avoid the “extreme” of clinging to objects as permanent, or more precisely, as enduring for more than a moment. Though the arguments may vary, most Mādhyamika thinkers are similar in their descriptions of ultimate truths. Debates among Mādhyamikas tend to rise in relation to their presentations of conventional truths, the means by which the “extreme” of non-existence is avoided.

After concluding that phenomena do not ultimately exist, Śāntarakṣita offers his concise summation and definition of a conventional truth in the sixty-third and sixty forth stanzas of MA:

Therefore, these entities are characterized only by conventionality. If someone accepts them as ultimate, what can I do for that person?

Those phenomena that are only agreeable when not put to the test of

[ultimate] analysis, those phenomena that are generated and disintegrate and those that have the ability to function are known to be of a conventional nature.[9]

In these stanzas and in his accompanying auto-commentary, MAV, Śāntarakṣita presents the parameters for his definition of a conventional truth. They are:

  1. that which is known by a mind,
  2. that which has the ability to function (i.e., that it is causally efficacious),
  3. that which is impermanent, and
  4. that which is unable to withstand analysis which searches for an ultimate nature or essence in entities.

In addition, later in the text, Śāntarakṣita describes such objects in a manner previously only used by proponents of the Yogācāra/Cittamātra school, namely, that such objects are “mere consciousness only”. (This aspect will be discussed below in the section entitled “Yogācāra-Madhyamaka Synthesis”.)

Truths are objects of knowledge in Madhyamaka ontology, so the quality of being known by a mind is an imperative and to some degree a tautologous assertion. Being impermanent and causally efficacious implies, in Buddhist thought, that they are dependently-arisen, that they arise on the basis of impermanent causes and conditions that are themselves, dependently-arisen. In his own commentary on these stanzas, MAV, Śāntarakṣita explicitly describes conventional truths as dependently-arisen. He goes on to state that conventional truths are known with conceptual thought and designated by worldly convention (MAV, 88–93). Thus an object's lack of an inherent nature is an ultimate truth. Those impermanent, dependently arisen, causally efficacious objects of knowledge that are known by conceptual thinking are conventional truths. This is how Śāntarakṣita presents his views on the ontological status of phenomena in his texts MA and MAV.

1.4 The Two Truths: Yogācāra-Madhyamaka Synthesis

In addition to presenting the two truths as described above, a presentation that is not particularly out of the ordinary for a Madhyamaka thinker, Śāntarakṣita elaborates further, in ways that must have made his presentation seem unorthodox to mainline Mādhyamikas in eighth century India. Although there were other Indian Mādhyamikas who attempted to incorporate dimensions of Yogācāra/Cittamātra (Mind-Only) thought into their Madhyamaka perspective (including Śāntarakṣita's own disciples Kamalaśīla and Haribhadra, as well as predecessors like Ārya Vimuktsena and Śrigupta), Śāntarakṣita is undoubtedly the most noteworthy and most famous Yocācāra-Madhyamaka synthesizer.[10] There are two primary areas where we find Yogācāra ideas incorporated into Śāntarakṣita's thought: his presentation of conventional truths where he describes them as being of the nature of consciousness, and his conventional acceptance of self-cognizing consciousness or reflexive awareness.

One of the fundamental tenets of the Yogācāra/Cittamātra schools of Buddhist thought is the assertion that phenomena are not of an utterly distinct nature from consciousness. The pan-Mahāyāna idea of emptiness is in fact described in this way Yogācāras/Cittamātras, by claiming that emptiness refers to an object's lack of a nature that is distinct from the consciousness perceiving it. This is contrasted with the common Madhyamaka description of emptiness as referring to an object's lack or emptiness of its own nature or essence in and of itself. Śāntarakṣita incorporates this Yogācāra line of thinking into his presentation of conventional truths when he writes in the ninety-first stanza of MA:

That which is cause and result is mere consciousness only. Whatever is established by itself abides in consciousness.[11]

This statement refers to his earlier descriptions of conventional truths (cited above) where he describes conventional truths as phenomena that have the ability to function and which generate and disintegrate. In Mādhyamika discourse, “That which is cause and result,” is simply another way of referring to conventional truths. It refers to that which is impermanent, dependently-arisen, and causally efficacious, the three being co-extensive with each other and with conventional truths in general. Thus, by stating that, “that which is cause and result is mere consciousness,” Śāntarakṣita is stating that conventional truths are of the nature of consciousness. This is an ultimate description of reality for proponents of the Yogācāra/Cittamātra systems, but for Śāntarakṣita here, this is part of his presentation of conventional truths, thus, incorporating a Yogācāra/Cittamātra orientation for his presentation of conventional truths.

A further development of this philosophical synthesis that Śāntarakṣita is putting forth is described even more explicitly in the next stanza, the ninety-second:

By relying on the Mind-Only (Cittamatra, Sems tsam pa) system, know that external entities do not exist. And by relying on this [Middle Way (Madhyamaka, dbU ma)] system, know that no self exists at all, even in that [mind].[12]

Here we find a particularly important and unique aspect of Śāntarakṣita's presentation of the two truths. It is not merely that he incorporates aspects of Mind-Only thinking into his presentation that makes it unique. It is unique because for virtually all of Śāntarakṣita's Madhyamaka predecessors in India, the two truths are utilized solely as a vehicle for presenting the ontological status of entities. It is done by way of describing the mode of being for various objects of knowledge (ultimate truths and conventional truths). This common Madhyamaka way of approaching the two truths is present in Śāntarakṣita as well, but there is more here. In addition to stating the ultimate truths exist in x way and conventional truths exist in y way, Śāntarakṣita is also using his presentation of conventional truths as a stepping stone for his readers. A proper understanding of conventional truths takes a person part of the way towards an understanding of the ultimate. Previous Madhyamaka presentations of conventional truths do not incorporate this practical dimension. For Śāntarakṣita, conventional truths are not completely mistaken. By properly understanding conventional truths (i.e., as a follower of Cittamatra tenets understands the ultimate), one is well on the way to a proper understanding of the ultimate from his Madhyamaka perspective—the most subtle and accurate philosophical presentation of reality. There is a dynamic step at work in Śāntarakṣita's presentation of the two truths; first one understands that entities are not of a distinct nature from that of the mind (as Mind-Only proponents claim) and then they progress to realize that nothing exists in and of itself (the Madhyamaka perspective), even the mind. This dynamic engagement with conventional truths is unique among Madhyamaka thinkers and a critical innovation in the thought of Śāntarakṣita.

2. More Dynamic Aspects of Śāntarakṣita's Philosophical Enterprise

Śāntarakṣita was a towering figure in eighth century Indian philosophy. It appears from the little evidence we have that he was fully engaged in the philosophical arena of his day including the composition of polemical tracts against his rivals. We can assume that these were taken seriously by his opponents because some of his extant writings are only known today because they were preserved in Jain libraries. But Śāntarakṣita's philosophical style was richer than simple polemics. In texts like MA, he led his readers through a dynamic engagement with competing views. Competing views, particularly competing Buddhist philosophical views were utilized in his texts in ways that encouraged his readers to contemplate the full impact and import of those views. In other words, he seems to encourage a sort provisional acceptance of competing Buddhist views as he presents a philosophical hierarchy of tenets. This method makes for a quite dynamic engagement with those competing views where provisionally taking on the competing views serves to have a transformative affect on the mind of the student as they ascend the philosophical hierarchy. They were not simply used as vehicles for illuminating his own view by contrasting it with those of his Buddhist rivals, though he was certainly doing that as well. Śāntarakṣita was doing more than that; he was encouraging his readers to take on those philosophical tenet systems he considered to be hierarchically “lower” in order to facilitate what seems to be a dynamic philosophical enterprise of multi-tiered engagement with a host of philosophical positions and views. In a tradition where philosophical inquiry is a form of religious praxis, it appears that provisional acceptance of the tenets of lower schools was used to ripen the mind for increasingly more subtle and accurate philosophical descriptions of reality. In other words, since the cultivation of experiential wisdom knowing reality is at the heart of what facilitates the larger tradition's soteriological goals, this dynamic method can be said to serve soteriological aims.[13]

This process can be witnessed to a degree in Śāntarakṣita's encyclopedic tenets text, Tattvasaṃgraha, but is most clearly presented in MA. In his application of the neither-one-nor-many argument in MA (described above), the careful reader is drawn to notice that as Śāntarakṣita proceeds through his examination of competing views, he does so through the shifting lens of three philosophical perspectives.[14] In the first fifteen stanzas of the text, he seems to be analyzing non-Buddhist and Vaibhāṣika tenets as a holder of Sautrāntika tenets would. His criticisms of those views are of a type that a Sautrāntika would utilize and his forms of reasoning are as well. It is as if he is encouraging his readers to adopt a Sautrāntika outlook and all that entails. Though there may be polemics involved (If x view can even be refuted by Sautrāntikas, what need is there to discuss the superiority of the Madhyamaka?), it appears that what is at work in an actual encouragement of his readers to seriously take on a Sautrāntika position, at least provisionally.

When he begins to examine the various positions of Sautrāntikas, his perspective shifts and he starts to argue as a Yogācāra/Cittamātra would. He criticizes the varying Sautrāntika perspectives as a Yogācāra/Cittamātra would, by making criticisms about how knowledge of entities external to consciousness could be known. And he makes these arguments both in the context of the neither-one-nor-many framework and with the types of reasoning Yogācāra/Cittamātra thinkers such as Dharmakīrti, might utilize. One might think that the focus of his criticisms would be solely on Madhyamaka issues about own-essences (svabhāva), but a major focus at this point is on the separation of objects from consciousness. It is as if he Śāntarakṣita is encouraging his readers to take on a Yogācāra/Cittamātra perspective, for at this point Śāntarakṣita seems to feign acceptance of a Yogācāra/Cittamātra perspective. He does not qualify his acceptance as merely conventional. He argues against Sautrāntika positions, as a Yogācāra/Cittamātra. It is only later in the text, when he begins to discuss the two truths that we come to learn that his acceptance of Yogācāra/Cittamātra tenets is qualified and provisional. Finally, beginning in the forty-fifth stanza, when Śāntarakṣita begins to analyze various positions asserted by proponents of Yogācāra/Cittamatra tenet, he takes on his final position as a Mādhyamika. He then criticizes such positions from a Mādhyamika perspective and utilizes the sorts of reasoning a Mādhyamika would use to refute Yogācāra/Cittamatra tenets, focusing on a rejection of essences. Thus, he has made his final shift in frames or scales of analysis. As he concludes the neither-one-nor-many argument and discusses a host of issues of great import in the remainder of the text, he maintains his final position as a Mādhyamika.

In the process of these shifting provisionalities, or scales of analysis, Śāntarakṣita has led his readers through a dynamic engagement with a host of philosophical views. They are not merely presented to be refuted (though that is certainly happening), but through an apparent feigned acceptance of “lower” tenets as he makes his way up a hierarchical ladder of philosophical views, his readers are actively encouraged to engage fully by taking on these other views that will ultimately be rejected. Rather than refute and dismiss competing views, Śāntarakṣita seems to recognize a utility in their engagement, one that serves the teleological function of leading the reader to (in his opinion) the highest philosophical view, the Madhyamaka. For ultimately, the purpose of Buddhist philosophical inquiry has a soteriological function as well. Suffering, according to the Buddha, is caused by confusion and ignorance, by a misunderstanding of the world and its functions. Thus, the duty of the Buddhist philosopher is to attempt to indicate for the suffering masses, as clearly as possible, the precise nature of their confusions and misunderstandings that lay at the heart of their suffering. For Śāntarakṣita, it is attachment to a fixed nature or essence in things which is at the root of the problem. So a dynamic philosophical process that can skillfully lead readers to the Madhyamaka perspective, the one that both understands and undermines all clinging to fixed natures, is a critical and creative part of ascending the spiritual path.

3. Śāntarakṣita's Epistemological Thought

The spearheading of the Buddhist logico-epistemological tradition (pramāṇavāda )[15] by Dignāga and Dharmakīrti, at first in response to Indian thought in the area of philosophy of language and in dialogue with non-Buddhist philosophers, resulted in a tremendous impact on many dimensions of Buddhist philosophical discourse in the middle and late periods of Indian Buddhism. Though its impact could be seen before Śāntarakṣita (in facets of Bhāvaviveka's writings), he was the first major Madhyamaka thinker who was also a commentator on Dharmakīrti, a contributor to this discourse, and who attempted to integrate its insights into a Madhyamaka framework. (Both Dignāga and Dharmakīrti are more closely associated with the Mind-Only school). One can witness one dimension of the profound influence Śāntarakṣita had on Tibetan Buddhist thought, even given the differences in the details, when observing this integration of Madhyamaka and pramāṇavāda thought in towering Tibetan thinkers such as Sakya Pandita and Tsongkhapa among others. Śāntarakṣita's thought on logico-epistemological issues is primarily found in his encyclopedic doxography, Tattvasaṃgraha and in his commentary on Dharmakīrti's Vādanyāya entitled Vipañcitārthā. In order to properly situate Śāntarakṣita's thought on these issues, it is necessary to briefly discuss that of his two most important predecessors in this area: Dignāga and Dharmakīrti.

Central to the logico-epistemological tradition in general and Śantarakṣita in particular is the question of what constitutes a means by which one accrues an instance of indubitable knowing. In other words, how does one justify considering a moment of awareness or cognitive episode as valid knowledge (pramāṇa)? What constitutes trustworthy awareness? For Śāntarakṣita, the pramāṇa that is the means of justifying an instant of valid knowing is simultaneously indistinct from the instant of valid knowing itself (McClintock 2002, 57).

As with Dharmakīrti, Śāntarakṣita describes valid knowledge or valid cognitions as instants of new knowledge in the sense that the cognizer knows newly something which to that point was unknown. Generally speaking, Buddhist pramāṇavāda thinkers categorize two types of pramāṇa[16]: perception (pratyakṣa)[17] and inference (anumāna). Objects of perception are causally efficacious particulars (svalakṣaṇa), actual instance of things in the world with temporal and spatial location. It is only particulars that are considered to be real. Generally, it would be thought that words apply to universals (sāmānyalakṣaṇa) which are conceptual constructs that have no causal efficacy in the world. Thus the early pramāṇavāda thinkers like Dignāga and Dharmakīrti can be considered to hold a soft form of connotationism in that they would reject a denotationist view that considers words to apply directly to actual particulars. The intuition that a word points to a particular would be very objectionable. A word cannot express a particular because particulars are limitless and words have limits. Yet they are soft connotationists in that via a process of elimination or exclusion, they posit a way in which language is both not arbitrary and not a reference to particulars. Inferences are cognitions based on valid reasons that depend on this non-arbitrary use of language.[18]

Among the philosophical issues that are important here is the fundamental question of how, if the world is only directly accessibly by perception, can one come to valid knowledge by means of inference that relies on words that do not directly refer to particulars? How does one link the ineffable world of particulars to language, and thus to an inference that could produce valid knowledge? Since words do not apply to actual objects or particulars which are ineffable, Śāntarakṣita, like his predecessors Dharmakīrti and Dignāga, needs to explain how it is that we are talking about the world, while at the same time making it clear that we are not talking about the world, but our conceptual scheme. Yet he also must make clear that all conceptual schemes are not equal in that some can produce valid knowledge and some fail to do so. There must be a degree of non-arbitrariness to language if inference is to be considered as a source of valid knowledge. There are true and false statements and consequences for beliefs about them. So the challenge is: how does one link the ineffable world of particulars to language?

Each of the pramāṇavāda thinkers, including Śāntarakṣita, begin to address these questions with variations on a theory initiated by Dignāga and fine-tuned by Dharmakīrti and his followers, known as exclusion (apoha) theory. Dignāga's response to the problem begins by claiming that language does not refer to universals, as one might presume a Buddhist would argue, but rather, through a negative process of exclusions or apoha, eliminates that which contradicts the referred object. Words talk about entities in so far as they are qualified by the negation of other things. Though nothing affirmative is said about reality, by use of exclusions, there is a relationship between concepts and particulars. Apoha or exclusions typically involves a double negation. Because in Buddhism the absence of something is a fiction in that absences are not caused and do not function, exclusions can be used to explain away universals as the referents of words. Because negations are fictions, this lightens the ontological commitment. A distinction is drawn between entities and pseudo-entities. Only particulars are real; negations are not real, but they are also not universals. Universals are positive or affirmative, whereas exclusions are negative. Dignāga's position is explained quite succinctly by Bimal Matilal:

Each name, as Dignāga understands, dichotomizes the universe into two: those to which the name can be applied and those to which it cannot be applied. The function of a name is to exclude the object from the class of those objects to which it cannot be applied. One might say that the function of a name is to locate the object outside of the class of those to which it cannot be applied. (Matilal 1971, 45)

Dignāga argues for a way in which language can be construed to signify particulars, through a double negation that excludes that which contradicts the referent object while eliminating the philosophical commitment to universals. Though the process of exclusion seems quite cumbersome, in actuality our language formation and conceptual processes seem to engage in it quite naturally.

Dharmakīrti adds several components to the thought of Dignāga on these issues concerning valid knowledge. In defining perception as a source or means of valid knowledge, Dharmakīrti describes it as that cognition that is free from conceptuality and non-erroneous. The inclusion of the qualification of it being non-erroneous eliminates erroneous non-conceptual cognitions, such as mistakenly seeing two moons, from the category of valid knowledge. Dharmakīrti further distinguishes two ways of apprehending objects: through perceptions which apprehend real objects positively, as they are, through the mediation of images (ākāra) which perfectly reflect them, and through concepts which get at their objects negatively, through the elimination of their opposites. Dharmakīrti's insight is found in the connection he draws between reality and the conceptual realm of universals. For Dharmakīrti, experience and representations are the bridge. We construct concepts out of our experiences and representations of functional resemblances of real entities. In other words, we can validly group together representations of actually unique entities on the basis that they can be excluded from the class of things that do not perform a given function. Georges Dreyfus put it well:

For Dharmakīrti, the conceptual process is neither arbitrary nor groundless, even though it does not reflect reality. Conceptuality does not arise out of nothing but results from experience. As we may recall, things such as trees, for instance, have functional similarities. In dependence on our experiences in which the functional resemblances of things are registered, we construct concepts. Thus, conceptuality arises as a result of our experiences. In this way conceptual thoughts are connected indirectly to reality. (Dreyfus 1997, 226)

In other words, there are several components to Dharmakīrti's exclusion theory: the entity or particular, the image or representation, and the exclusion. First there are real events of real entities. Then there is a perception that has the mark of a real entity because it is caused by something real. It is a mirror-like image of the real. This is followed by a conceptual representation superimposed on a real image. This is part real, part concept. Finally, after this is done, there is an assumption of commonality with other conceptual representations. This assumption is unreal and is the basis of the exclusion or universal. It derives not from the reality of common characteristics, but judgments of similarity. This is where concepts are conceived of as representing properties that are thought to exist in the world, such as permanence, which in fact do not. But it is through this process of exclusion that one can utilize positive language with the understanding that that language only refers to a common negation.

Śāntarakṣita's treatment of these issues largely revolves around a response to the criticisms of non-Buddhists such as Kumārila and Uddyotakara. Kumārila levels three criticisms of apoha theory in particular: that it is circular, that it is counter-intuitive, and that it is redundant. Śāntarakṣita's response to these criticisms begins by describing three primary types of negations which he equates with exclusions: non-implicative negations (niṣedha, med dgag) and two types of implicative negations (paryudāsa, ma yin dgag): mental exclusions and object exclusions. A non-implicative negation is a negation that does not imply the existence of some other thing. For example, the negation of the existence of flowers that grows in the sky does not imply the existence of other plants that grow in the sky. It is a mere negation with nothing implied. On the other hand, implicative negations, while denying the existence of one thing, imply the existence of another. An example of an implicative negation would be if we were told that either my aunt or my uncle came over last night. If my aunt did not come, it implies that my uncle did. Thus, there is something implied by the negation. Among the types of implicative negations, Śāntarakṣita includes mental exclusions. It is important to point out here that for Śāntarakṣita, negations and exclusions are virtually synonymous. Mental exclusions are conceptual representations that relate to the appearances or representations of entities, as discussed by Dignāga. Object exclusions are not conceptual representations of mere appearances or representations, but rather can relate to the real world. Thus, this form of exclusion is a real thing for Śāntarakṣita. It is these three types of exclusions that form the basis of Śāntarakṣita's thought on this topic, the basis of his psychological interpretation of apoha, and the basis of his response to the critics of Dharmakīriti's apoha theory, such as Kumārila.

In addition to the three types of exclusions, central to Śāntarakṣita's thought on the topic is his unique presentation of representations and the psychological dimensions to his exclusion theory.[19] According to Śāntarakṣita, it is our experiences of unifying similarities among representations that gives rise to our conceptual constructs. Mental representations of objects are exclusions because they exclude other representations. These conceptual representations are misconstrued to be the actual objects since the actual objects do not exist in them. For Śāntarakṣita, both the exclusion of that which is other than real particular and the exclusion of that which is other than the representation are both apohas or exclusions. The psychological dimension to exclusion is particularly important in Śāntarakṣita's apoha theory in that he emphasizes the role of negation in relation to mental representations and mental events in the conceptualizing process. For Dharmakīrti, universals are the objects of concepts. Śāntarakṣita agrees with this point but stresses that the concept is the mental representation or mental event and that is an exclusion, whereas for Dharmakīrti the representations are the basis which supports the exclusions and concepts. For Dharmakīrti, exclusions are conceptual fictions, whereas for Śāntarakṣita they can be real entities.

Śāntarakṣita considers that he is fully able to respond to the criticisms of Kumārila with his presentation of exclusions. For example, Kumārila charges that the Buddhist apoha theories are counter-intuitive in that our intuition is not that words and concepts refer to negations or exclusions. Śāntarakṣita argues that Kumārila misunderstands apoha to always be non-implicative negations. He misses the two types of implicative negations that Śāntarakṣita clearly specifies as included among forms of exclusions. For Śāntarakṣita, when we use words, the objects of such conceptual thoughts are the real objects. They are the indirect object of the exclusion that is a form of implicative negation, which includes negative aspects by implication. Thus, words can be indicative of positive elements. The external object implies the image plus the exclusion of that which is other. The words or concepts thus take external objects as their objects and imply the conceptual exclusions. Thus when Kumārila mistakes all exclusions to be non-implicative negations, he misses this key component to the psychological functions at work and mistakes apoha theory to be counter-intuitive.

Kumārila's charge of circularity in apoha theory is one of the most critical for its defenders to answer. The main thrust of the argument was already found in Uddyotakara's Nyāyavārttika, where he argues that apoha entails the problems of circularity and denotationism (which apoha theorists consider it is imperative to avoid). This is the case because there must be an affirmative denotation between words and particulars since the negation of an object implies that one first have a positive understanding of the object. One must first have an affirmative understanding before one can negate its exclusion. Dreyfus summarizes Kumārila's presentation of the argument succinctly as follows:

If conceptual understanding involves negation of x, then understanding of x will presuppose that of non-x, which in turn presupposes that of non-non-x. And this is nothing but an understanding of x. (Dreyfus 1997, 242)

In other words, Kumārila argues that since a conceptual understanding of a cow is simply an understanding of non-non-cow according to apoha theory, that in order to understand non-non-cow, one must already understand cow. Thus, apoha theory must resort to circularity, or perhaps even more precisely, it lacks a beginning point for the circle in the first place. Uddyotakara emphasizes that the only way out is to resort to a linguistic denotationism that apoha theorists want to avoid. Kumārila stresses the interdependence of knowing cow and knowing non-cow and not non-cow. Both question how a double negation is something other than a positive universal.

The crux of Śāntarakṣita's response, again, relies on his presentation of three types of exclusions, specifically the mental exclusion that is signified by words, a point he feels both Uddyotakara and Kumārila fail to recognize. According to Śāntarakṣita, there is a conceptual image that is an exclusion that is generated in the mind of one who hears the words, “This animal is a cow,” for example, but that this idea is an implicative negation that only implies that this animal is not a non-cow. According to Śāntarakṣita, the problem of circularity is thus avoided by a proper understanding of implicative negations: to understand cow one need not understand non-cow, but rather the mere idea of cow. Like Dharmakīrti, Śāntarakṣita relies on a judgment of similarity in functional efficacy among distinct particulars as conceptually construed to generate the idea. For Śāntarakṣita the emphasis is on similarity among the mental representations of them. Śāntarakṣita and Dharmakīrti both argue that there is not a problem with grouping things as x and non-x. The distinction between similar and dissimilar classes is made and the word merely applied to indicate this understood distinction. For Śāntarakṣita, based on judgments of similarity, the classes of cows and non-cows are established. It is the word that is applied to them which is not established. It is the word that is used to indicate this judgment of similarity at the discretion of the speaker. Thus, for Śāntarakṣita, the perceived problem of circularity by Uddyotakara and Kumārila is due to their misunderstanding of exclusions and negations.

Śāntarakṣita's response to Hindu critics of apoha and the interpretive innovations that spring from it represent a critical juncture in Buddhist logico-epistemological thought. Though we see examples of integration of pramāṇavāda thinking into the ideas of a Mādhyamika philosopher, most notably with Bhavaviveka, it is not until Śāntarakṣita that we see this marriage of ideas fully integrated and spelled out in a sophisticated way. It is difficult to overstate the tremendous impact this marriage of two major strands of late Indian philosophical thought in Śāntarakṣita had on the philosophical traditions of Tibet.

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asanga-vasubandhu | Dharmakīrti | mind: in Indian Buddhist Philosophy | navya-nyaya | Tibetan epistemology and philosophy of language | two truths in India, theory of | two truths in Tibet, theory of | Yogācāra

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