Supplement to School of Names

Life of Hui Shi

Early sources present us with three distinct traditions about Hui Shi, which no one source fully ties together. In one set of tales, he is a statesman and political persuader of varying rank and efficacy. The more reliable parts of the Han anthology Intrigues of the Warring States (Zhanguoce) depict him as a second-tier government official.[1] By contrast, Book 18 of The Annals of Lü Buwei (ca. 235 B.C.) portrays him as a major political figure, traveling with a large retinue and serving as chief minister to King Hui of Wei (370-319 B.C.), who respects him so much he titles him “Uncle to the King” (Annals, 18.6). Though conceding Hui Shi's cleverness, this part of the Annals vilifies him. One story (18.5) credits him with composing a widely praised law code only to have a rival dismiss it as excessively elaborate and impracticable. Another chapter (18.6) cites him as a model of intellectual arrogance and condemns him for incompetence, blaming him for the decline of Wei and claiming that his “stupid” policies were “laughed at by the whole world.” Depictions of him in the Zhuangzi (Book 17) and Hanfeizi (Book 9) are more neutral, however, and the Hanfeizi and a later book of the Annals (21) portray him as a brilliant political persuader. Indeed, even in passages framed to belittle him, bits of rhetorical brilliance shine through:

King Hui of Wei said to Hui Shi, “To govern a state in previous ages, one needed to be a worthy. Now I am really not the equal of you, sir. I wish to hand over the state to you.” Hui Shi refused. The King again pressed his request, saying, “If I do not keep the state here for myself, but hand it over to a worthy, the people's greedy and contentious mindset will stop. This is why I want you to obey me.” Hui Shi said, “If it is like what your majesty says, then I cannot obey. You are the lord of ten thousand chariots, yet your offering the state to another can bring this about. Now for me, a commoner, to have the chance to possess a state of ten thousand chariots yet refuse it, this would stop the greedy and contentious mindset even more.” (18.6/461)

A second set of tales, confined to the Zhuangzi, famously depict him as a friend of and intellectual straight man for the carefree nonconformist Zhuang Zhou. One story about the friendship ties Hui Shi to his political role (Book 17) and two to his role as a disputer (Books 5 and 24), but none link all three roles. A separate mention of Hui Shi alone (Book 2) also ties him to disputation. No passage gives us any specific information about his philosophical views or his skill as a politician. Indeed, far from being an incisive disputer or a shrewd statesman, the Hui Shi of the Zhuangzi is almost totally colorless, a dull, pedestrian foil against which to highlight Zhuangzi's wit and insight. The sharpest argument he gets to give is in their famous exchange about the happy fish, where Zhuangzi bests him by switching between senses of the word ‘whence’ (an):

Zhuangzi and Hui Shi were strolling on the bridge above the Hao river. Zhuangzi said, “Out swim the minnows so free and easy, this is the happiness of fish.” Hui Shi said, “You are not a fish. Whence do you know the happiness of fish?” Zhuangzi said, “You are not me. Whence do you know I don't know the happiness of fish?” Hui Shi said, “Granted that I am not you, I don't know about you. Then granted that you are not a fish, the case for your not knowing the happiness of fish is complete.” Zhuangzi said, “Let's trace back to the root of the issue. When you said, ‘Whence do you know the fish are happy?’, you asked me already knowing I knew it. I knew it from up above the Hao.” (cf. Graham 1981: 123)

Virtually nothing about the Hui Shi persona portrayed in the Zhuangzi hooks up with his reputation as a talented statesman or disputer. Indeed, the text gives us little reason to believe that the friendship between Zhuangzi and Hui Shi is anything more than a narrative device. The tradition of stories about the pair might suggest that the two historical figures were acquainted, but little more.

The third tradition about Hui Shi is that he was a disputer who propounded sophistries and paradoxes. Among the pre-Han texts that have come down to us, the basis for this tradition is surprisingly thin: the Xunzi passages discussed in connection with Deng Xi above, Xunzi's further remark that Hui Shi was “obscured by expressions and did not know reality” (shi, also “stuff” or “things”) (21.4), and a pair of passages in Zhuangzi (Books 2 and 5) that link him to the theme of “hard and white,” though reporting nothing of his thought. Indeed, since the Han History credits him with only a single scroll of writings, now lost, “Under Heaven” provides the only clear evidence that he was not just a skilled rhetorician but a thinker of significance. Unfortunately, this text is probably from the mid 2nd century B.C., 150 years or more after his death, so we cannot assume it is historically reliable. It could merely be presenting the latest stage in the evolution of the legend of Hui Shi, sharpest of the disputers.

If by chance both the statesman and disputer traditions about Hui Shi are true, or largely true, then he was a gifted polymath with a lively intellect, though he apparently wrote next to nothing. (“Under Heaven” says he had five cartloads of books, but these may have been his library, not his writings.) He may have been a quick-witted rhetorician, a judicious statesman, a thinker who addressed fundamental ontological questions, and perhaps even a proto-scientist:

In the south there was a strange man named Huang Liao, who asked why the sky does not fall nor the earth cave in and the reasons for the wind, rain, and thunder. Hui Shi responded without hesitation, answered without thinking, and explained all the myriad things. He explained without rest, going on without stopping, still thought it too little, and then added some marvel to it. (cf. Graham 1989: 77)

Unfortunately, since we lack any record of the details of Hui Shi's arguments or his accounts of the myriad things, this potentially fascinating chapter in Chinese intellectual history seems closed to us forever.

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Copyright © 2009 by
Chris Fraser <cjfraser@gmail.com>

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