Supplement to School of Names

Pointing and Things

Less than 300 graphs long, the “Discourse on Pointing at Things,” has been the focus of intense interpretive attention yet remains profoundly obscure. A reasonable conjecture is that its author intended just this result. Interpreters have applied a variety of approaches to crack this enigmatic text. Some import exotic philosophical machinery; others resort to textual emendation. Despite their efforts, however, most accounts of the text are not clearly superior to the hypothesis that “Pointing” never fully made sense in the first place. The text may well be an ancient practical joke, one that still ensnares victims today, more than 2000 years after Gongsun Long used it to bewilder audiences.

“Pointing at Things” discusses the apparently self-contradictory thesis that “When no thing is not pointed out, pointing is not pointing.” The interpretive problems begin with the very structure of the text. It is not clear whether “Pointing” comprises several arguments for this thesis, a dialogue between a sophist and an objector, or an argument for the thesis followed by a refutation. The opening statement, the paradoxical thesis, appears to be a syntactic contradiction. The parsing of several lines near the beginning is uncertain. The motivation for many of the steps in the argument is hard to see. The key term, zhi, roughly “pointing,” can be rendered as “finger,” “to point,” “to refer,” or “referent,” each of which works well as an English equivalent in some contexts, but not all. The text slides back and forth between verbal and nominal uses of zhi, all the while embedding them in complex strings of quantifiers and negations whose scope is often vague. On top of these difficulties, from what we know of Gongsun Long, we should expect the text to trade in semantic ambiguity and to slip in a category mistake or two, the more to baffle and entertain the audience.

The following sample gives a taste of the original, leaving the key term zhi (pointing, what is pointed out) untranslated:

The world lacking zhi, things cannot be called zhi.

Not being able to be called zhi is not zhi.

Not zhi is no thing is not zhi.

The world lacking zhi and things not being able to be called zhi is there not being anything that's not zhi.

There not being anything that's not zhi is no thing is not zhi.

[Therefore] No thing is not zhi is zhi not being zhi.

The text opens with the claim that “No thing is not zhi, yet zhi is not zhi.” Some interpreters identify zhi with a Western, often Platonic, philosophical notion such as meaning, class, property, or universal. The opening claim, for instance, might be rendered “Every particular instantiates a universal, but universals do not instantiate universals.” Such interpretations are unconvincing, however, for they make sense of the text only by cutting it off from its intellectual context. Ancient Chinese theories of language as presented by the Mohists, Xunzi, the Analects, and The Annals of Lü Buwei employ no concept corresponding to meaning, property, or universal. Moreover, they clearly use zhi to mean simply “point” or “refer” as a verb and “what is pointed out” or “referent” as a noun (cf. Graham 1989: 91, Hansen 1992: 259-61).

One interpretation of the thesis consistent with the ancient Chinese intellectual context is that it concerns a paradoxical feature of “all-inclusive” general terms such as ‘things’ or ‘the world’. The extension of such terms includes everything there is, so when we use them, “no thing is not pointed to.” But precisely because their scope includes everything, they do not distinguish their referents from anything else. So “pointing out is not pointing out,” since by referring to everything, such terms fail to point anything out from anything else. Graham develops an interpretation along roughly these lines (1989: 91ff.). He proposes, partly on the basis of clues in the Zhuangzi and Liezi, that “Pointing at Things” concerns the issue of how the word ‘world’ functions as a name. According to Chinese theories of language, names designate things by distinguishing them from other things. But since ‘world’ refers to the whole comprising everything, it doesn't distinguish anything from other things. Interpreting the sample passage quoted above along these lines, we get:

There being no pointing out the world, things cannot be called the pointed out.

Not being able to be called the pointed out is not the pointed out.

Not the pointed out is no thing is not the pointed out.

There being no pointing out the world and things not being able to be called the pointed out is there not being anything that's not the pointed out.

There not being anything that's not the pointed out is no thing is not the pointed out.

[Therefore] No thing is not the pointed out is pointing not being pointing.

      (Translation modified from Graham 1989: 92.)

We can tentatively understand this as follows. The passage assumes the claim, previously established, that the world can't be pointed out from other things, because it is not a thing in itself distinct from the things that constitute it. The text claims that if the world can't be pointed out, then neither can things. Then it moves, in obscure steps, from that claim to the paradoxical conclusion of the last line. Perhaps the point is that when we refer to the world, we refer to everything: no thing is not pointed to. Yet in referring to the world, we do not point it out from anything, so pointing to it is not pointing out anything. The steps in the reasoning are confusing, however, and their justification murky. In the third line above, for instance, why is “not the pointed out” considered equivalent to “no thing is not the pointed out”? One would think it ought to be equivalent to “all things are not the pointed out.”

The core theme of Graham's interpretation is plausible, grounded as it is in the context of ancient Chinese philosophy of language. On his approach, the text concerns a category mistake: the error of demanding that, in addition to pointing out all the parts that constitute a whole, we also be able to point out the whole in itself, as if it were a thing of the same order as the parts. The mistake would be parallel to that in Gilbert Ryle's well-known example of someone being given a campus tour, shown the classrooms, library, administration building, and dormitories, and then asking to see the university as well. This interpretive approach explains the following passage particularly well:

There being no pointing out the world arises from things each having a name and not being deemed the pointed out.

Though they're not deemed the pointed out, we say they're the pointed out; this is collecting together the not deemed the pointed out.

It's inadmissible to move from there being the not deemed the pointed out to there not being the not deemed the pointed out.…

Moreover, pointed-outs are what the world collects together.

There being no pointing out the world, we can't say there's no pointing out things.

On a Graham-style interpretation, this passage refutes the paradox with which the text opens. Each kind of thing has its own name, such as ‘ox’ or ‘horse’. No distinct thing or kind of thing is deemed ‘the world’. Hence we cannot point the world out from things. But though no thing in the world is deemed or named ‘the world’—there is no one thing or kind of thing specifically “pointed out” by the name ‘the world’—we nevertheless say that ‘the world’ refers to all things. In doing so, we collect together all of the things in the world and “point to” them jointly. So there are things that are referred to by ‘the world’ but are not deemed ‘the world’; ‘the world’ is not their name, and they are not specifically deemed what is pointed out by ‘the world’. But it is illegitimate to claim on that basis that there's nothing that is not deemed what's pointed out by ‘the world’. Rather, ‘the world’ is the name of the sum of everything. Moreover, though ‘the world’ doesn't point out something distinct from things, we can't say there's no pointing out things. In that case, the paradox is wrong to claim that “pointing is not pointing.”

Even on this approach, however, the text remains so full of contradictions, circular arguments, and logical gaps that it is next to impossible to interpret the argument with any assurance. A satisfactory interpretation must provide an explanation of the text demonstrably superior to that of rival readings. While some interpretations of “Pointing at Things” can be ruled out as markedly inferior to alternatives, so many uncertainties surround the text that it is difficult to see how any one reading could be shown to be clearly better than plausible rivals.

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Copyright © 2009 by
Chris Fraser <cjfraser@gmail.com>

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