Notes to Externalism and Self-Knowledge

1. There is an unfortunate polysemy in the term ‘thought’. Often, a “thought” is a contentful mental representation that is expressible by a declarative sentence. On other occasions, a “thought” is merely the content of said representation. Still other times, a “thought” is merely the vehicle for a content (as with the use of ‘thoughts’ that this note attaches to). This means that “thought” in the first sense denotes a composite of a content and a vehicle. In the literature, context normally makes clear which sense of ‘thought’ is intended on an occasion of use, and it is assumed that this holds for the present discussion as well

2. We shall see that this formulation of EXT is too weak (in section 2.1), though it is a standard formulation and suffices for present purposes.

3. Knowing “from the armchair” is knowing by means other than the five senses. Knowing pure mathematics and knowing mental states via introspection are examples. N.B., Macdonald (1995) helpfully separates two questions regarding SK: (q1) How is armchair knowledge of content possible, given EXT, and (q2) How is it that my knowledge of content is authoritative, given that it is gained from the armchair? This entry is focused on (q1), though sometimes it is assumed by writers that a satisfactory answer to (q1) must answer (q2) along the way.

4. This particular incompatibilist line is usually rejected, since it is agreed that the first premise is dubious; see Burge 1988, p. 651, 654-655; Boghossian 1989, p. 12. One can know what x is without knowing the enabling conditions that make such knowledge possible. Still, this initial argument captures what is most basically at issue, especially in slow switch arguments (section 3).

5. A “concept” here is understood to be a mental particular that has a content, which can be joined in accord with compositional rules to form thoughts. N.B., the discussion varies in speaking sometimes of the content of concepts, and other times of the content of thoughts. But EXT as formulated concerns the content of both concepts and thoughts, and the occasional variation in focus is assumed to be harmless.

6. ‘Twin water’ is stipulated to be the English translation of the Twin English term ‘water’. But ‘XYZ’ is not a strict translation of the Twin English term ‘water’ (just in the way that ‘H2O’ is not a strict synonym for ‘water’ in English). Consequently, since thought attributions are standardly intensional, the sentence ‘I am thinking that water is wet’ in Twin English ascribes the thought that I am thinking that twin water is wet. But it does not ipso facto ascribe the thought I am thinking that XYZ is wet.

7. The Frege-Carnap thesis may be rejected by some, but it is this sort of idea which underlies many of the thought-experiments. (Putnam 1975 is especially clear about this.)

8. In fact, water and other natural kinds can be problematic in illustrating the externalist's point; see Dupré (1981). Martinich & Stroll (2007, ch. 5) raise some further difficulties for the water example. But water will feature prominently here, since this is the example most used in the literature.

9. Since Oscar and his twin are ignorant of chemistry, it should be clear that EXT applies to the contents of Oscar's de dicto or opaquely ascribed thoughts (in addition to de re or transparently ascribed thoughts). Consider: Both Oscar and his twin assert ‘water is scrumptious’—but given their ignorance, Oscar would not assert ‘H2O is scrumptious’ nor would his twin assert ‘XYZ is scrumptious’. Even so, the de dicto belief expressed by ‘water is scrumptious’ differs between the twins, since there are different thought contents. Given only that Oscar refers to H2O and his twin refers to XYZ (albeit not under those descriptions), the Frege-Carnap view already implies that the twins must have different contents.

10. Ludlow himself uses ‘arugula’ in the example; however, I am told it is actually ‘endive’ that swaps extensions with ‘chicory’ between the dialects.

11. The term ‘water content’ refers to the content of the water concept, where the water concept is the concept that is expressed in English by ‘water’. (And in line with note 6, the water concept is assumed to be different from the H2O concept.)

12. Notably, McKinsey (2002, 2003, 2007) formulates another version of the reductio which avoids the apriority of (1). Instead, McKinsey invokes the “closure of apriority;” see n. 17.

13. The community disjunct from (4) is omitted for simplicity. Besides, EXT may require water's existence anyway in order for the community to obtain the water concept (Wright 2000, n. 4).

14. Boghossian first uses Dry Earth to show the thought-experiments do not need the empirical premise that ‘water’ names a natural kind. Yet though this would support apriority, Dry Earth also threatens the truth of (1). Thus Boghossian also uses Dry Earth to oppose empty-concept externalism.

15. Segal formulates the externalist's dilemma slightly differently on p. 32ff : Either deny that ‘unicorn’ expresses a concept, or allow it expresses a descriptive concept. (Boghossian 1997 notes the “no concept” option as well.) Yet as Sawyer (2003) shows, those choices are not exhaustive. In contrast, the above formulation indeed presents exhaustive options.

16. Wright offers a “disjunctive template” to describe when transmission failure generally occurs; similarly, Davies provides us two “limitation principles.” Besides the reductio, these are also applied to Moorean anti-skeptical arguments, Putnam's “brains-in-vats” argument, and others. Wright's template in particular has generated an interesting literature, e.g., McLaughlin (2003), Brown (2004), Brueckner (2006). (See also Kallestrup 2011 for some overview of the issues.) However, this material is omitted, given that our interest in transmission is not so general; it concerns only the reductio.

17. For the advocate, the difference between (TW) and (CW) would be important to resisting McKinsey (2003). McKinsey suggests that the reductio does not rest on (TW), so it does no good to deny transmission. He suggests that the reductio instead requires only “closure of apriori warrant”:

(CAW) If S is apriori warranted in believing p and p entails q, then S is also apriori warranted in believing q (or at least is able to be thus warranted).

But again, the closure of warrant does not imply that the deduction created the warrant for (3). (Indeed, W. ordinarily posits a non-empirical warrant for (3), independently of any deductions.) Yet the incompatibilist needs to show not merely that (3) has a warrant, but rather that the deduction can create a new warrant for (3), entirely apriori. For that to follow, the incompatibilist must say that a new warrant transmits onto (3), and (CAW) is insufficient for that.

18. As with (TW), an approximation here will do for introductory purposes. But n.b., Davies sometimes implies that the antecedent would have the *premises actually having a warrant, besides being granted one. Relatedly, as we will see, Wright would have the consequent saying that (3) is warranted, not just that a warrant is assumed. Wright's modification makes for a notable difference; see the final paragraph of this section. But otherwise, the two authors levy the presupposition-charge in roughly the same way.

19. Hawthorne himself illustrates the point in relation to mathematical concepts, but in order to make clear the relevance of his point, this has been changed to sofas.

20. It is important that Sawyer bases her externalism in a causal theory of content—and as we saw at the start of section 2, such an externalism would seem to rob (1) of an apriori status. So notably, Sawyer's view that warrant can transmit to (3) in the deduction may not even concern a purely apriori warrant.

21. The “self-referential” element seems absent from Davidson (1987; 1988) and Heil (1988); they seem to describe how a second order judgment tracks the first order thought in more causal terms. (It thus may be unfair to call Heil and Davidson infallibilists about second-order judgments, since the causal connections might only hold ceteris paribus.)

22. Unlike the others, Braun thinks the purpose-relativity in ascribing “S knows what x is” lies not in the semantics of the ascription, but rather in its pragmatics. The idea is that goals or purposes do not affect the truth conditions of “S knows what x is,” but rather affects under what conditions it is “felicitous” to assert such a sentence, vis-à-vis Gricean norms of conversation.

Notes to Supplements

Supplement 2

1. Some externalists try to elude this inconsistency, arguing that the addition of Fregean sense to externalist contents allows them to do so. See, e.g., Brown (2004), ch. 6; Wikfoss (2006). This literature is especially difficult to get clear on, however, and given our introductory aims, it is thus omitted.

2. Though we have discussed occurrent second-order judgments mainly via Burge's (1988) view, Boghossian's (1992a) and (1994) are addressed to Heil (1988) and to Davidson (1987; 1988), respectively. Boghossian's official reply to Burge consists in the memory argument, noted at the start of section 3.

Supplement 3

1. Following Kaplan, it is becoming increasingly popular to call one's metaphysics of meaning a “metasemantics,” but this can be misleading. (It is not as if it is the metatheory for a formal semantics, which is of interest in its own right.)

Copyright © 2013 by
T. Parent <parentt@vt.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free