Supplement to Set Theory

Zermelo-Fraenkel Set Theory

Axioms of ZF

Extensionality:
$\forall x\forall y[\forall z (\left.z \in x\right. \leftrightarrow \left. z \in y\right.) \rightarrow x=y]$

This axiom asserts that when sets x and y have the same members, they are the same set.

The next axiom asserts the existence of the empty set:

Null Set:
$\exists x \neg\exists y (y \in x)$

Since it is provable from this axiom and the previous axiom that there is a unique such set, we may introduce the notation ‘$\varnothing$’ to denote it.

The next axiom asserts that if given any set x and y, there exists a pair set of x and y, i.e., a set which has only x and y as members:

Pairs:
$\forall x\forall y \exists z \forall w (w\in z \leftrightarrow w=x \lor w=y)$

Since it is provable that there is a unique pair set for each given x and y, we introduce the notation ‘{x,y}’ to denote it.

The next axiom asserts that for any set x, there is a set y which contains as members all those sets whose members are also elements of x, i.e., y contains all of the subsets of x:

Power Set:
$\forall x \exists y \forall z[z\in y \leftrightarrow \forall w(w\in z \rightarrow w\in x)]$

Since every set provably has a unique ‘power set’, we introduce the notation ‘$\mathscr{P}(x)$’ to denote it. Note also that we may define the notion x is a subset of y (‘$x \subseteq y$’) as: $\forall z(z\in x\rightarrow z\in y)$. Then we may simplify the statement of the Power Set Axiom as follows:

$\forall x \exists y\forall z(z\in y \leftrightarrow z \subseteq x)$

The next axiom asserts that for any given set x, there is a set y which has as members all of the members of all of the members of x:

Unions:
$\forall x\exists y\forall z[z\in y \leftrightarrow \exists w(w\in x \land z\in w)]$

Since it is provable that there is a unique ‘union’ of any set x, we introduce the notation ‘$\bigcup x$’ to denote it.

The next axiom asserts the existence of an infinite set, i.e., a set with an infinite number of members:

Infinity:
$\exists x[\varnothing\in x \land \forall y(y\in x \rightarrow \bigcup\{y,\{y\}\}\in x)]$

We may think of this as follows. Let us define the union of x and y (‘$x\cup y$’) as the union of the pair set of x and y, i.e., as $\bigcup \{x,y\}$. Then the Axiom of Infinity asserts that there is a set x which contains $\varnothing$ as a member and which is such that whenever a set y is a member of x, then $y\cup\{y\}$ is a member of x. Consequently, this axiom guarantees the existence of a set of the following form:

$\{\varnothing,\{\varnothing\},\{\varnothing,\{\varnothing\}\},\{\varnothing,\{\varnothing\},\{\varnothing,\{\varnothing\}\}\},\ldots\}$

Notice that the second element, $\{\varnothing \}$, is in this set because (1) the fact that $\varnothing$ is in the set implies that $\varnothing \cup \{\varnothing \}$ is in the set and (2) $\varnothing \cup \{\varnothing \}$ just is $\{\varnothing\}$. Similarly, the third element, $\{\varnothing,\{\varnothing\}\}$, is in this set because (1) the fact that $\{\varnothing\}$ is in the set implies that $\{\varnothing \} \cup\{\{\varnothing \}\}$ is in the set and (2) $\{\varnothing \} \cup \{\{\varnothing \}\}$ just is $\{\varnothing, \{\varnothing \}\}$. And so forth.

The next axiom is the Separation Schema, which asserts the existence of a set that contains the elements of a given set w that satisfy a certain condition $\psi$. That is, suppose that $\psi(x,\hat{u})$ has x free and may or may not have $u_1,\ldots,u_k$ free. And let $\psi_{x,\hat{u}}[r,\hat{u}]$ be the result of substituting r for x in $\psi(x,\hat{u})$. Then the Separation Schema asserts:

Separation Schema:
$\forall u_1 \ldots\forall u_k [\forall w\exists v\forall r(r\in v \leftrightarrow r\in w \land \psi_{x,\hat{u}}[r,\hat{u}])]$

In other words, if given a formula $\psi$ and a set w, there exists a set v which has as members precisely the members of w which satisfy the formula $\psi$.

The next axiom of ZF is the Replacement Schema. Suppose that $\phi(x,y,\hat{u})$ is a formula with x and y free, and let $\hat{u}$ represent the variables $u_1,\ldots u_k,$ which may or may not be free in $\phi$. Furthermore, let $\phi_{x,y,\hat{u}}[s,r,\hat{u}]$ be the result of substituting s and r for x and y, respectively, in $\phi(x,y,\hat{u})$. Then every instance of the following schema is an axiom:

Replacement Schema:
$\forall u_1 \ldots\forall u_k [\forall x\exists!y\phi(x,y,\hat{u})\rightarrow \forall w\exists v\forall r(r\in v\leftrightarrow \exists s(s\in w \land \phi_{x,y,\hat{u}}[s,r,\hat{u}]))]$

In other words, if we know that $\phi$ is a functional formula (which relates each set x to a unique set y), then if we are given a set w, we can form a new set v as follows: collect all of the sets to which the members of w are uniquely related by $\phi$.

Note that the Replacement Schema can take you ‘out of’ the set w when forming the set v. The elements of v need not be elements of w. By contrast, the Separation Schema of Zermelo only yields subsets of the given set w.

The final axiom asserts that every set is ‘well-founded’:

Regularity:
$\forall x[x\ne\varnothing\rightarrow\exists y(y\in x\land\forall z(z\in x \rightarrow\neg(z\in y)))]$

A member y of a set x with this property is called a ‘minimal’ element. This axiom rules out the existence of circular chains of sets (e.g., such as $x\in y \land y\in z \land$ and $z\in x$) as well as infinitely descending chains of sets (such as … $x_3\in x_2\in x_1\in x_0$).

Copyright © 2014 by
Joan Bagaria <joan.bagaria@icrea.cat>

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