Supplement to Sextus Empiricus

The example from PH I 13

You might have thought that it would be easy to settle the question of whether the Skeptic has any beliefs by looking at the example Sextus gives of the kind of assent the Skeptic can engage in. But the problem is that, for all the attention the example has had (see esp. Frede 1979: 20–21; Burnyeat 1980: 48–50; Barnes 1982: 75), it remains exasperatingly indeterminate. For Sextus tells us only that when the Skeptic is heated (or feels hot), he will not say ‘I think I am not heated’. He does not tell us what the Skeptic would say—if anything. If Barnes is right, the Skeptic would avow his warmth (‘phew!’, he would say, fanning himself); if Burnyeat and Fine are right, the Skeptic would acknowledge that he seems to be hot (‘I appear to be hot!’); if Frede is right, the Skeptic would happily assert that he is hot (‘I'm hot!’). But Sextus does not tell us which of these he would say or do. Thus the key to understanding Sextus' position does not lie in analyzing the example.

Copyright © 2014 by
Benjamin Morison <bmorison@princeton.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free