Supplement to Moral Skepticism

Practical Moral Skepticism

Practical moral skepticism answers the common question, “Why be moral?” This question, like many philosophical questions, is too short to be clear. It can be expanded and explained in several different ways.

The first word that needs to be clarified is “Why”. This interrogative asks for a reason, but reasons are understood in different ways. Some philosophers suggest that all reasons are self-interested. Then the question “Why be moral?” asks “Why is it in my interest to be moral?” Others, in contrast, argue that some reasons concern effects on others (rather than oneself) or do not concern any effects on anyone. Then the question “Why be moral?” is not just asking why it is in my interest to be moral. Instead, it asks what, if anything, makes it irrational to be immoral or at least keeps it from being irrational to be moral.

The next clarification concerns the phrase “be moral”. The question “Why be moral?” might seem to ask, “Why should I be a moral person?” This should be distinguished from the question, “Why should I do moral acts?”, if there can be isolated cases where I have no reason not to do a particular immoral act (such as hurting this friend or cheating on this exam) while I still have reason not to want a wider tendency to do immoral acts (such as hurting and cheating regularly). Only such wider tendencies or character traits make someone immoral as a person, but it seems harder to imagine how there could be no reason to avoid such widespread tendencies. If immoral tendencies always directly or indirectly hurt other people, and if some reasons are facts about interests of other people, then there will always be reason not to be an immoral person. Even if reasons are restricted to self-interest, widespread tendencies to immorality might always be dangerous to the agent's self-interest, and then, again, there will always be reason not to be an immoral person. Practical moral skeptics might try to describe cases where a widespread tendency to immorality is in one's self-interest, but critics will respond by calling such cases unrealistic. Whether or not a realistic example can be found, the focus on immoral people or character traits at least makes it easier to argue that real agents always have some reason to be moral people.

The other question, “Why should I do moral acts?”, can still be interpreted in different ways, including “Why should I do acts that are morally good?” or “Why should I do acts that are morally required?” These questions are distinct if some acts, such as giving to a particular charity, are morally good but not morally required. If I have no reason to do such an act, then I do not always have a reason to do what is morally good, but I still might always have a reason to do what is morally required. For simplicity, the rest of this entry will focus on practical moral skepticism about what is morally required.

What such practical moral skeptics deny is that I always have reason to do what is morally required. In other words, they deny that I always have reason not to do what is morally wrong. These claims are equivalent because it is morally wrong not to do what is morally required. Practical moral skeptics do not deny that there is sometimes reason not do what is morally wrong. After all, some wrongdoers are caught and punished. However, practical moral skeptics can still deny that there is always reason to do what is morally required or to avoid what is morally wrong.

How much reason? Some practical moral skeptics claim that sometimes there is no reason at all to do what is morally required. If all reasons are self-interested, this means that sometimes doing what is morally required does not serve the agent's interest in any way. That extreme position would be refuted if doing what is morally wrong always creates even a slight risk of some negative repercussion. A more plausible and common version of practical moral skepticism denies, instead, that there is always an adequate (or non-overridden) reason to do what is morally required. To establish this position, practical moral skeptics need only one case where there is overriding reason not to do what is morally required.

It is not hard to imagine such a case if reasons are restricted to self-interest. Just consider an agent who would receive great satisfaction from killing another person whom he hates and whom he can kill without cost because the killer will die soon anyway. Killing then serves that agent's self-interest, even if it is still morally wrong. Other cases would work as well. If overall self-interest ever conflicts with moral requirements, then there will be overriding reason not to do what is morally required, on the assumption that all reasons are self-interested.

Without that assumption, however, such practical moral skepticism becomes much less plausible. If harms to others give agents reasons for and against actions, then this agent has some reason not to kill the victim. If that reason overrides the agent's reason to kill, then the agent will not have an adequate reason to kill. Of course, the agent's reason not to kill might not be overriding. The reasons might be equal or incomparable in some way, in which case each is adequate, but neither is overriding.

This position is closely related to the claim that, when self-interest conflicts with moral requirements, neither alternative is irrational. If so, it is not always irrational to do what is morally wrong, but it still might never be irrational to do what is morally required. (Cf. Sidgwick 1966.) It does not matter much whether this position is classified as a version of practical moral skepticism. It is skeptical insofar as it denies that immoral actions are always irrational. It is anti-skeptical insofar as it claims that moral actions are never irrational.

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Copyright © 2011 by
Walter Sinnott-Armstrong <ws66@duke.edu>

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