Notes to Social Choice Theory

1. When n is even, the first part of the theorem only holds for group sizes n above a certain lower bound (which depends on p), due to the possibility of majority ties. When n is odd, it holds for any n > 1.

2. If different individuals have different known levels of reliability, weighted majority voting outperforms simple majority voting at maximizing the probability of a correct decision, with each individual's voting weight proportional to log(p/(1−p)), where p is the individual's reliability as defined above (Shapley and Grofman 1984; Grofman, Owen, and Feld 1983; Ben-Yashar and Nitzan 1997).

3. Optionally, one can stipulate that the utility from a tie is 1/2.

4. Completeness requires that, for any x, yX, xRiy or yRix, and transitivity requires that, for any x, y, zX, if xRiy and yRiz, then xRiz.

5. In the classic example, there are three individuals with preference orderings xP1yP1z, yP2zP2x, and zP3xP3y over three alternatives x, y, and z. The resulting majority preferences are cyclical: we have xPy, yPz, and yet zPx.

6. Formally, {xX : xf(R1,R2,…,Rn) for some <R1,R2,…,Rn> in the domain of f}.

7. For present purposes, one can stipulate that the last clause (for all x in the range of f, yRix where yf(R1, R2, …, Rn)) is violated if f(R1, R2, …, Rn) is empty.

8. Formally, y′Piy, where y′ = f(R1, …, R′i, …, Rn) and y = f(R1, …, Ri, …, Rn), assuming that <R1, …, R′i, …, Rn> is in the domain of f. The definition presupposes that the social choice sets for the profiles <R1, …, Ri, …, Rn> and <R1, …, R′i, …, Rn> are singleton.

9. Sen, like Arrow in his definition of social welfare functions (as opposed to functionals), required R to be an ordering by definition.

10. Technically, this requires a domain restriction to positive welfare profiles.

11. Formally, X = {p, ¬p : pX+}, where X+ is a set of un-negated propositions. To avoid technicalities, we assume that X contains no contradictory or tautological propositions.

12. In principle, consistency can be defined relative to some side constraint such as the legal doctrine in the ‘doctrinal paradox’ example.

13. See also the remark on the relationship between path-connectedness and non-simplicity at the end of this subsection.

14. An earlier mathematically related, though interpretationally distinct contribution is Wilson's work on abstract aggregation (1975).

Copyright © 2013 by
Christian List <c.list@lse.ac.uk>

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