Notes to Socrates

1. All ancient dates, i.e., those pertaining to Socrates's life and the contemporaneous sources for his life, are B.C.E. (before the common era). All dates of modern and contemporary sources are C.E. (of the common era).

2. Two men are credited with initiating the genre of Socratic discourses: Alexamenos (Aristotle, fr. 72 Rose ap. Athenaeus 11.505c), doubted by many because no extant works or fragments mention him in connection with Socrates; and the Athenian Antisthenes, whom Plato's Phaedo includes among those present at Socrates's execution. There are several surviving fragments from Aeschines of Sphettus, also present at Socrates's execution, but none from Euclides of Megara, a speaker in Theaetetus and present at the execution—unless one takes Theaetetus 143b-c literally to mean that Euclides was the author of the dialogue, an implausible suggestion. Ancient librarians catalogued the titles of Socratic discourses in their possession supposedly written by others known through the dialogues—Aristippus of Cyrene, Cebes of Thebes, Crito of Alopece (Athens), Glaucon of Collytus (Athens), Phaedo of Elis, and Simmias of Thebes—as well as by the Athenian Simon (a leatherworker whose shop abutted the marketplace of Athens, unearthed by archaeologists in the early 1950s). Still other supposed writers are known only from the librarians' lists—Bryson, Polyaenus, Polyxenus—but by the time of the cataloguing, many forgeries were circulating as well as many discourses of uncertain authorship, so these should be viewed skeptically. In Plato's Academy, for example, it was a standard practice to write in dialogue form (Aristotle wrote dialogues in his days there, fragments of which are extant); but some of these dialogues became part of the Academy's collection and were in later years mistaken for dialogues written by Plato. They were not forgeries, for they were not written with the intent to deceive, but the works of some of the later Academics. On the other hand, there were forgeries: in the Hellenistic period (after the death of Alexander the Great), it was lucrative to compose and sell dialogues and treatises under the names of famous persons from the earlier time. In any case, the library copies of the works themselves are not extant; only the titles—and not all of those—are recorded.

3. Among comic playwrights known to have mentioned Socrates are Callias (who was earliest, in or before 429) and Teleclides, both of whom insinuated that Socrates helped Euripides to write tragedies—as did Aristophanes in a fragment of the earlier version of Clouds; Amipsias, whose Connus was named for Socrates's music teacher and who calls Socrates "barefoot"; and Eupolis, who accuses Socrates of splitting hairs and stealing a wine ladle.

4. Leo Strauss, an influential political theorist and adherent of the German tradition discussed below (§2.2), is the chief proponent of the superiority of Xenophon as a source, “Plato is not a historian. The only historian among Socrates's contemporaries on whose writings we must rely for our knowledge of Socrates is Xenophon, who continued Thucydides's history, and who vouches for the authenticity of at least some of his Socratic conversations by introducing them with expressions like ‘I once heard him say’” (1966, 4; cf. 1964, 56-57). When Strauss looks to Plato for support of Xenophon's Socrates, he is attracted to the Socrates of Theages (1968, 55), Minos (1968, 65-75), and Hipparchus (1968, 74-75) rather than to the Socrates of Plato's genuine dialogues. His insistence that all the works in the tetralogies of Thrasyllus (~36 C.E.) are those of Plato himself (1964, 55), and that Plato depicts Socrates only in association with men of higher social classes (1964, 57), is simply untenable; it would be uncharitable to assume that Strauss would now hold such views in light of more recent scholarship. In fact, he had no consistent account of Socrates until late in life, something his disciple, Allan Bloom (1974, 377), explains as the result of Strauss's late recognition that “the execution of Socrates for impiety is the threshold to the Platonic world,” which Strauss could not see before he discovered esoteric writing in Alfarabi and Maimonides and realized the irremediable conflict between reason and revelation. According to Bloom (1974, 382), “In his last writings, he finally felt free to try to grasp the way of Socrates, the archetype of the philosopher and the one whose teaching Nietzsche and Heidegger most of all tried to overthrow.”

5. The two dialogues with fluid dramatic dates, across the Peloponnesian wars (431-404), are Gorgias and Republic. A strong tradition in German scholarship of the nineteenth and twentieth centuries was to think of Xenophon as the accurate historian and Plato as the literary author, giving rise to claims that Plato shuffled dates around and invented named Athenian characters for his literary purposes, that the characters he invented had names coded to communicate subtle truths about their bearers, and that Plato would not use living Athenians as characters in his dialogues (impossible to claim, finally, because the gravestone of Lysis turned up in a construction trench northeast of the Piraeus in 1974, proving that Lysis lived to be at least sixty, having died a grandfather).

6. The term ‘developmentalism’ is used to distinguish the influential Vlastosian approach to Plato's dialogues from those of other analytic philosophers who addressed the Socratic problem and other issues in Plato's dialogues during the heyday of developmentalism. It should be noted, however, that—although Vlastos consolidated and promoted the first complete developmentalist program—he shared credit with a number of other philosophers (e.g., W. David Ross, Richard Robinson, G. E. L. Owen) who argued that Plato's views evolved. And it was Vlastos who took a special interest in Socrates.

Copyright © 2014 by
Debra Nails <nails@msu.edu>

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