Conventionality of Simultaneity

First published Mon Aug 31, 1998; substantive revision Thu Jul 15, 2010

In his first paper on the special theory of relativity, Einstein indicated that the question of whether or not two spatially separated events were simultaneous did not necessarily have a definite answer, but instead depended on the adoption of a convention for its resolution. Some later writers have argued that Einstein's choice of a convention is, in fact, the only possible choice within the framework of special relativistic physics, while others have maintained that alternative choices, although perhaps less convenient, are indeed possible.

1. The Conventionality Thesis

The debate about the conventionality of simultaneity is usually carried on within the framework of the special theory of relativity. Even prior to the advent of that theory, however, questions had been raised (see, e.g., Poincaré 1898) as to whether simultaneity was absolute; i.e., whether there was a unique event at location A that was simultaneous with a given event at location B. In his first paper on relativity, Einstein (1905) asserted that it was necessary to make an assumption in order to be able to compare the times of occurrence of events at spatially separated locations (Einstein 1905, 38–40 of the Dover translation or 125–127 of the Princeton translation; but note Scribner 1963, for correction of an error in the Dover translation). His assumption, which defined what is usually called standard synchrony, can be described in terms of the following idealized thought experiment, where the spatial locations A and B are fixed locations in some particular, but arbitrary, inertial (i.e., unaccelerated) frame of reference: Let a light ray, traveling in vacuum, leave A at time t1 (as measured by a clock at rest there), and arrive at B coincident with the event E at B. Let the ray be instantaneously reflected back to A, arriving at time t2. Then standard synchrony is defined by saying that E is simultaneous with the event at A that occurred at time (t1 + t2)/2. This definition is equivalent to the requirement that the one-way speeds of the ray be the same on the two segments of its round-trip journey between A and B.

It is interesting to note (as pointed out by Jammer (2006, 49), in his comprehensive survey of virtually all aspects of simultaneity) that something closely analogous to Einstein's definition of standard simultaneity was used more than 1500 years earlier by St. Augustine in his Confessions (written in 397 CE). He was arguing against astrology by telling a story of two women, one rich and one poor, who gave birth simultaneously but whose children had quite different lives in spite of having identical horoscopes. His method of determining that the births, at different locations, were simultaneous was to have a messenger leave each birth site at the moment of birth and travel to the other, presumably with equal speeds. Since the messengers met at the midpoint, the births must have been simultaneous. Jammer comments that this “may well be regarded as probably the earliest recorded example of an operational definition of distant simultaneity.”

The thesis that the choice of standard synchrony is a convention, rather than one necessitated by facts about the physical universe (within the framework of the special theory of relativity), has been argued particularly by Reichenbach (see, for example, Reichenbach 1958, 123–135) and Grünbaum (see, for example, Grünbaum 1973, 342–368). They argue that the only nonconventional basis for claiming that two distinct events are not simultaneous would be the possibility of a causal influence connecting the events. In the pre-Einsteinian view of the universe, there was no reason to rule out the possibility of arbitrarily fast causal influences, which would then be able to single out a unique event at A that would be simultaneous with E. In an Einsteinian universe, however, no causal influence can travel faster than the speed of light in vacuum, so from the point of view of Reichenbach and Grünbaum, any event at A whose time of occurrence is in the open interval between t1 and t2 could be defined to be simultaneous with E. In terms of the ε-notation introduced by Reichenbach, any event at A occurring at a time t1 + ε(t2t1), where 0 < ε < 1, could be simultaneous with E. That is, the conventionality thesis asserts that any particular choice of ε within its stated range is a matter of convention, including the choice ε=1/2 (which corresponds to standard synchrony). If ε differs from 1/2, the one-way speeds of a light ray would differ (in an ε-dependent fashion) on the two segments of its round-trip journey between A and B. If, more generally, we consider light traveling on an arbitrary closed path in three-dimensional space, then (as shown by Minguzzi 2002, 155–156) the freedom of choice in the one-way speeds of light amounts to the choice of an arbitrary scalar field (although two scalar fields that differ only by an additive constant would give the same assignment of one-way speeds).

It might be argued that the definition of standard synchrony makes use only of the relation of equality (of the one-way speeds of light in different directions), so that simplicity dictates its choice rather than a choice that requires the specification of a particular value for a parameter. Grünbaum (1973, 356) rejects this argument on the grounds that, since the equality of the one-way speeds of light is a convention, this choice does not simplify the postulational basis of the theory but only gives a symbolically simpler representation.

2. Phenomenological Counterarguments

Many of the arguments against the conventionality thesis make use of particular physical phenomena, together with the laws of physics, to establish simultaneity (or, equivalently, to measure the one-way speed of light). Salmon (1977), for example, discusses a number of such schemes and argues that each makes use of a nontrivial convention. For instance, one such scheme uses the law of conservation of momentum to conclude that two particles of equal mass, initially located halfway between A and B and then separated by an explosion, must arrive at A and B simultaneously. Salmon (1977, 273) argues, however, that the standard formulation of the law of conservation of momentum makes use of the concept of one-way velocities, which cannot be measured without the use of (something equivalent to) synchronized clocks at the two ends of the spatial interval that is traversed; thus, it is a circular argument to use conservation of momentum to define simultaneity.

It has been argued (see, for example, Janis 1983, 103–105, and Norton 1986, 119) that all such schemes for establishing convention-free synchrony must fail. The argument can be summarized as follows: Suppose that clocks are set in standard synchrony, and consider the detailed space-time description of the proposed synchronization procedure that would be obtained with the use of such clocks. Next suppose that the clocks are reset in some nonstandard fashion (consistent with the causal order of events), and consider the description of the same sequence of events that would be obtained with the use of the reset clocks. In such a description, familiar laws may take unfamiliar forms, as in the case of the law of conservation of momentum in the example mentioned above. Indeed, all of special relativity has been reformulated (in an unfamiliar form) in terms of nonstandard synchronies (Winnie 1970a and 1970b). Since the proposed synchronization procedure can itself be described in terms of a nonstandard synchrony, the scheme cannot describe a sequence of events that is incompatible with nonstandard synchrony. A comparison of the two descriptions makes clear what hidden assumptions in the scheme are equivalent to standard synchrony. Nevertheless, editors of respected journals continue to accept, from time to time, papers purporting to measure one-way light speeds; see, for example, Greaves et al. (2009). Application of the procedure just described shows where their errors lie.

3. Transport of Clocks

A phenomenological scheme that deserves special mention, because of the amount of attention it has received over the course of many years, is to define synchrony by the use of clocks transported between locations A and B in the limit of zero velocity. Eddington (1924, 15) discusses this method of synchrony, and notes that it leads to the same results as those obtained by the use of electromagnetic signals (the method that has been referred to here as standard synchrony). He comments on both of these methods as follows (1924, 15–16): “We can scarcely consider that either of these methods of comparing time at different places is an essential part of our primitive notion of time in the same way that measurement at one place by a cyclic mechanism is; therefore they are best regarded as conventional.”

One objection to the use of the slow-transport scheme to synchronize clocks is that, until the clocks are synchronized, there is no way of measuring the one-way velocity of the transported clock. Bridgman (1962, 26) uses the “self-measured” velocity, determined by using the transported clock to measure the time interval, to avoid this problem. Using this meaning of velocity, he suggests (1962, 64–67) a modified procedure that is equivalent to Eddington's, but does not require having started in the infinite past. Bridgman would transport a number of clocks from A to B at various velocities; the readings of these clocks at B would differ. He would then pick one clock, say the one whose velocity was the smallest, and find the differences between its reading and the readings of the other clocks. Finally, he would plot these differences against the velocities of the corresponding clocks, and extrapolate to zero velocity. Like Eddington, Bridgman does not see this scheme as contradicting the conventionality thesis. He says (1962, 66), “What becomes of Einstein's insistence that his method for setting distant clocks — that is, choosing the value 1/2 for ε — constituted a ‘definition’ of distant simultaneity? It seems to me that Einstein's remark is by no means invalidated.”

Ellis and Bowman (1967) take a different point of view. Their means of synchronizing clocks by slow transport (1967, 129–130) is again somewhat different from, but equivalent to, those already mentioned. They would place clocks at A and B with arbitrary settings. They would then place a third clock at A and synchronize it with the one already there. Next they would move this third clock to B with a velocity they refer to as the “intervening ‘velocity’”, determined by using the clocks in place at A and B to measure the time interval. They would repeat this procedure with decreasing velocities and extrapolate to find the zero-velocity limit of the difference between the readings of the clock at B and the transported clock. Finally, they would set the clock at B back by this limiting amount. On the basis of their analysis of this procedure, they argue that, although consistent nonstandard synchronization appears to be possible, there are good physical reasons (assuming the correctness of empirical predictions of the special theory of relativity) for preferring standard synchrony. Their conclusion (as summarized in the abstract of their 1967, 116) is, “The thesis of the conventionality of distant simultaneity espoused particularly by Reichenbach and Grünbaum is thus either trivialized or refuted.”

A number of responses to these views of Ellis and Bowman (see, for example, Grünbaum et al. 1969; Winnie 1970b, 223–228; and Redhead 1993, 111–113) argue that nontrivial conventions are implicit in the choice to synchronize clocks by the slow-transport method. For example, Grünbaum (Grünbaum et al. 1969, 5–43) argues that it is a nontrivial convention to equate the time interval measured by the infinitely slowly moving clock traveling from A to B with the interval measured by the clock remaining at A and in standard synchrony with that at B, and the conclusion of van Fraassen (Grünbaum et al. 1969, 73) is, “Ellis and Bowman have not proved that the standard simultaneity relation is nonconventional, which it is not, but have succeeded in exhibiting some alternative conventions which also yield that simultaneity relation.” Winnie (1970b), using his reformulation of special relativity in terms of arbitrary synchrony, shows explicitly that synchrony by slow-clock transport agrees with synchrony by the standard light-signal method when both are described in terms of an arbitrary value of ε within the range 0 < ε < 1, and argues that Ellis and Bowman err in having assumed the ε=1/2 form of the time-dilation formula in their arguments. He concludes (Winnie 1970b, 228) that “it is not possible that the method of slow-transport, or any other synchrony method, could, within the framework of the nonconventional ingredients of the Special Theory, result in fixing any particular value of ε to the exclusion of any other particular values.” Redhead (1993) also argues that slow transport of clocks fails to give a convention-free definition of simultaneity. He says (1993, 112), “There is no absolute factual sense in the term ‘slow.’ If we estimate ‘slow’ relative to a moving frame K′, then slow-clock-transport will pick out standard synchrony in K′, but this …corresponds to nonstandard synchrony in K.”

An alternative clock-transport scheme, which avoids the issue of slowness, is to have the clock move from A to B and back again (along straight paths in each direction) with the same self-measured speed throughout the round trip (Mamone Capria 2001, 812–813; as Mamone Capria notes, his scheme is similar to those proposed by Brehme 1985, 57–58, and 1988, 811–812). If the moving clock leaves A at time t1 (as measured by a clock at rest there), arrives at B coincident with the event E at B, and arrives back at A at the time t2, then standard synchrony is obtained by saying that E is simultaneous with the event at A that occurred at the time (t1 + t2)/2. It would seem that this transport scheme is sufficiently similar to the slow-transport scheme that it could engender much the same debate, apart from those aspects of the debate that focussed specifically on the issue of slowness.

4. Malament's Theorem

An entirely different sort of argument against the conventionality thesis has been given by Malament (1977), who argues that standard synchrony is the only simultaneity relation that can be defined, relative to a given inertial frame, from the relation of (symmetric) causal connectibility. Let this relation be represented by κ, let the statement that events p and q are simultaneous be represented by S(p,q), and let the given inertial frame be specified by the world line, O, of some inertial observer. Then Malament's uniqueness theorem shows that if S is definable from κ and O, if it is an equivalence relation, if points p on O and q not on O exist such that S(p,q) holds, and if S is not the universal relation (which holds for all points), then S is the relation of standard synchrony.

Some commentators have taken Malament's theorem to have settled the debate on the side of nonconventionality. For example, Torretti (1983, 229) says, “Malament proved that simultaneity by standard synchronism in an inertial frame F is the only non-universal equivalence between events at different points of F that is definable (‘in any sense of “definable” no matter how weak’) in terms of causal connectibility alone, for a given F”; and Norton (Salmon et al. 1992, 222) says, “Contrary to most expectations, [Malament] was able to prove that the central claim about simultaneity of the causal theorists of time was false. He showed that the standard simultaneity relation was the only nontrivial simultaneity relation definable in terms of the causal structure of a Minkowski spacetime of special relativity.”

Other commentators disagree with such arguments, however. Grünbaum (2009) has written a detailed critique of Malament's paper. He first cites Malament's need to postulate that S is an equivalence relation as a weakness in the argument, a view also endorsed by Redhead (1993, 114). Grünbaum's main argument, however, is based on an earlier argument by Janis (1983, 107–109) that Malament's theorem leads to a unique (but different) synchrony relative to any inertial observer, that this latitude is the same as that in introducing Reichenbach's ε, and thus Malament's theorem should carry neither more nor less weight against the conventionality thesis than the argument (mentioned above in the last paragraph of the first section of this article) that standard synchrony is the simplest choice. Grünbaum concludes “that Malament's remarkable proof has not undermined my thesis that, in the STR, relative simultaneity is conventional, as contrasted with its non-conventionality in the Newtonian world, which I have articulated! Thus, I do not need to retract the actual claim I made in 1963…” Somewhat similar arguments are given by Redhead (1993, 114) and by Debs and Redhead (2007, 87–92).

Havas (1987, 444) says, “What Malament has shown, in fact, is that in Minkowski space-time … one can always introduce time-orthogonal coordinates … , an obvious and well-known result which implies ε=1/2.” In a comprehensive review of the problem of the conventionality of simultaneity, Anderson, Vetharaniam, and Stedman (1998, 124–125) claim that Malament's proof is erroneous. Although they appear to be wrong in this claim, the nature of their error highlights the fact that Malament's proof, which uses the time-symmetric relation κ, would not be valid if a temporal orientation were introduced into space-time (see, for example, Spirtes 1981, Ch. VI, Sec. F; and Stein 1991, 153n).

Sarkar and Stachel (1999) argue that there is no physical warrant for the requirement that a simultaneity relation be invariant under temporal reflections. Dropping that requirement, they show that Malament's other criteria for a simultaneity relation are then also satisfied if we fix some arbitrary event in space-time and say either that any pair of events on its backward null cone are simultaneous or, alternatively, that any pair of events on its forward null cone are simultaneous. They show further that, among the relations satisfying these requirements, standard synchrony is the unique such relation that is independent of the position of an observer and the half-null-cone relations are the unique such relations that are independent of the motion of an observer. If the backward-cone relation were chosen, then simultaneous events would be those seen simultaneously by an observer at the cone's vertex. As Sarkar and Stachel (1999, 209) note, Einstein (1905, 39 of the Dover translation or 126 of the Princeton translation) considered this possibility and rejected it because of its dependence on the position of the observer. Since the half-null-cone relations define causally connectible events to be simultaneous, it would seem that they would also be rejected by adherents of the views of Reichenbach and Grünbaum.

Ben-Yami (2006) also argues against Malament's requirement of invariance under temporal reflections, but for different reasons than those of Sarkar and Stachel. Ben-Yami (2006, 461) takes his fundamental causal relation to be the following: “If event e1 is a cause of event e2, then e2 does not precede e1.” He thus allows events to be simultaneous with their causes, and consequently the range of Reichenbach's ε is extended to include both 0 and 1. Ben-Yami's causal relation is not time-symmetric, which is his reason for rejecting the requirement of invariance under temporal reflections. He concludes (Ben-Yami 2006, 469-470) that, with his modified causal relation, there are “infinitely many possible simultaneity relations: any space-like or light-like conic hypersurface of an event on O defines a simultaneity relation for that event relative to O, and then, by translations, for any event on O.” However he then goes on to argue against the assumption that an observer, represented by O, would remain inertial forever, and ultimately concludes not only that standard simultaneity cannot be defined but that the only two simultaneity relations that can be defined relative to an event are those determined by its future and past light cones.

Giulini (2001, 653) argues that it is too strong a requirement to ask that a simultaneity relation be invariant under causal transformations (such as scale transformations) that are not physical symmetries, which Malament as well as Sarkar and Stachel do. Using “Aut” to refer to the appropriate invariance group and “nontrivial” to refer to an equivalence relation on spacetime that is neither one in which all points are in the same equivalence class nor one in which each point is in a different equivalence class, Giulini (2001, 657–658) defines two types of simultaneity: Absolute simultaneity is a nontrivial Aut-invariant equivalence relation on spacetime such that each equivalence class intersects any physically realizable timelike trajectory in at most one point, and simultaneity relative to some structure X in spacetime (for Malament, X is the world line of an inertial observer) is a nontrivial AutX-invariant equivalence relation on spacetime such that each equivalence class intersects any physically realizable timelike trajectory in at most one point, where AutX is the subgroup of Aut that preserves X. First taking Aut to be the inhomogeneous (i.e., including translations) Galilean transformations, Giulini (2001, 660–662) shows that standard Galilean (i.e., pre-relativistic) simultaneity is the unique absolute simultaneity relation. Then taking Aut to be the inhomogeneous Lorentz transformations (also known as the Poincaré transformations), Giulini (2001, 664–666) shows that there is no absolute simultaneity relation and that standard Einsteinian synchrony is the unique relative simultaneity when X is taken to be a foliation of spacetime by straight lines (thus, like Malament, singling out a specific inertial frame, but in a way that is different from Malament's choice of X).

5. Other Considerations

Since the conventionality thesis rests upon the existence of a fastest causal signal, the existence of arbitrarily fast causal signals would undermine the thesis. If we leave aside the question of causality, for the moment, the possibility of particles (called tachyons) moving with arbitrarily high velocities is consistent with the mathematical formalism of special relativity (see, for example, Feinberg 1967). Just as the speed of light in vacuum is an upper limit to the possible speeds of ordinary particles (sometimes called bradyons), it would be a lower limit to the speeds of tachyons. When a transformation is made to a different inertial frame of reference, the speeds of both bradyons and tachyons change (the speed of light in vacuum being the only invariant speed). At any instant, the speed of a bradyon can be transformed to zero and the speed of a tachyon can be transformed to an infinite value. The statement that a bradyon is moving forward in time remains true in every inertial frame (if it is true in one), but this is not so for tachyons. Feinberg (1967) argues that this does not lead to violations of causality through the exchange of tachyons between two uniformly moving observers because of ambiguities in the interpretation of the behavior of tachyon emitters and absorbers, whose roles can change from one to the other under the transformation between inertial frames. He claims to resolve putative causal anomalies by adopting the convention that each observer describes the motion of each tachyon interacting with that observer's apparatus in such a way as to make the tachyon move forward in time. However, all of Feinberg's examples involve motion in only one spatial dimension. Pirani (1970) has given an explicit two-dimensional example in which Feinberg's convention is satisfied but a tachyon signal is emitted by an observer and returned to that observer at an earlier time, thus leading to possible causal anomalies.

A claim that no value of ε other than 1/2 is mathematically possible has been put forward by Zangari (1994). He argues that spin-1/2 particles (e.g., electrons) must be represented mathematically by what are known as complex spinors, and that the transformation properties of these spinors are not consistent with the introduction of nonstandard coordinates (corresponding to values of ε other than 1/2). Gunn and Vetharaniam (1995), however, present a derivation of the Dirac equation (the fundamental equation describing spin-1/2 particles) using coordinates that are consistent with arbitrary synchrony. They argue that Zangari mistakenly required a particular representation of space-time points as the only one consistent with the spinorial description of spin-1/2 particles.

Another argument for standard synchrony has been given by Ohanian (2004), who bases his considerations on the laws of dynamics. He argues that a nonstandard choice of synchrony introduces pseudoforces into Newton's second law, which must hold in the low-velocity limit of special relativity; that is, it is only with standard synchrony that net force and acceleration will be proportional. Macdonald (2005) defends the conventionality thesis against this argument in a fashion analagous to the argument used by Salmon (mentioned above in the first paragraph of the second section of this article) against the use of the law of conservation of momentum to define simultaneity: Macdonald says, in effect, that it is a convention to require Newton's laws to take their standard form.

The debate about conventionality of simultaneity seems far from settled, although some proponents on both sides of the argument might disagree with that statement. The reader wishing to pursue the matter further should consult the sources listed below as well as additional references cited in those sources.


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