Notes to The Hole Argument

1. The form of the argument follows that originally laid out in Earman and Norton (1987). For a development of the hole argument at a technical level intermediate between the body of this article and these notes, see Norton (1992a, Section 5.12).

In general, the class of theories in which the hole argument is mounted are “local spacetime theories.” These are theories whose models consist of n+1 tuples

(M, O1, …, On)

where the O1, …, On are geometric object fields defined on a differential manifold M. The class of models in the theory is delimited by some set of invariant (e.g. tensorial) equations, which are the laws of the theory:

L1=0, …, Lm=0

where the quantities Li are functions of the geometric objects Oi.The theory is presumed complete in the sense that any model satisfying these laws will be in the model set of the theory. This characterization of local spacetime theories is sufficiently general to include formulations of virtually all common spacetime theories, including general relativity, special relativity and Newtonian theories.

2. In brief, the distinction between the passive and active general covariance is as follows. Passive general covariance allows use of all coordinate charts of the differential manifold and is conferred automatically on theories formulated by modern methods. Active general covariance considers the dual point transformations induced by coordinate transformations. These amount to diffeomorphisms on the manifold M and the transformations of the fields correspond to maps that associate an object field O with its carry along h*O under diffeomorphism h.

The need to convert Einstein's original analysis from passive to active transformations is awkward. I have argued that the distinction between them was not so clear cut when Einstein originally formulated the hole argument because of the more impoverished mathematical environment in which he worked and that this is responsible for much of the present confusion in interpreting Einstein's pronouncements on coordinate systems. See Norton (1989, 1992).

3. That is, a hole transformation is a diffeomorphism on M that is the identity outside some arbitrarily selected neighborhood but comes smoothly to differ from the identity within that neighborhood. For explicit constructions of such transformations, see Muller (1995) and Macdonald (2006).

The notion of general covariance has been the subject of a protracted dispute that extends to the earliest years of general relativity, when Kretschmann argued that the requirement of general covariance was merely a mathematical condition with no physical content. See Norton (1993) for an extensive survey. In my view, as explained in Norton (2003), Kretschmann's objection has merit, as long we allow reformulations of our theory. Then noting that a physical theory admits a generally covariant reformulation places no physical constraint on the theory. Once the formulation is fixed, however, then the general covariance of the theory, like most of its formal properties, will have some physical meaning. That physical meaning is what is at issue in the present discussion of the hole argument.

4. More generally, manifold substantivalism asserts that the manifold M of local spacetime theories is the mathematical structure that represents spacetime.

5. For any spacetime model (M, O1, …, On) and any diffeomorphism on M, Leibniz equivalence asserts that the two models

(M, O1, …, On) and (hM, h*O1, …, h*On)

represent the same physical system.

6. The general form of the argument is essentially identical. The first sentence is generalized to read:

1. If one has two models of a local spacetime theory (M, O1, …, On) and (hM, h*O1, …, h*On) related by a hole transformation h, manifold substantivalists must maintain that the two systems represent two distinct physical systems.

Note also that statements 1 and 2 are premises. Statement 3 is the conclusion drawn from them. There is a suppressed premise that it is inadmissible to load up a physical theory with hidden properties that outstrip both observation and the determining power of the theory.

7. The computation that justifies these claims is this. The potential field U is fixed in Newtonian theory by Poisson's equation

ΔU = −4πρ

where ρ is the density of matter. If this equation is satisfied by U(r) then it is also satisfied by U(r)+K(t), since ΔK(t) = 0, so that Δ(U(r)+K(t)) = ΔU(r).

8. The observable electromagnetic field strengths E and B are related to the scalar potential φ and vector potential A by the relations

B = × A

E = −φ − ∂A/∂t

It now follows that the B and E are unaltered by a gauge transformation

A′ = Aλ

φ′ = φ + ∂λ/∂t

The gauge transformation is generated by the scalar field λ, which can be any function of space and time. To create a hole type transformation, we select a λ that is zero everywhere excepting in some sufficiently small region of space and time where it comes smoothly to differ from zero. The resulting sets of potentials (φ, A) and (φ′, A′) will agree everywhere outside the hole, but will smoothly come to differ within the hole.

As before, any attempt to suggest that the differences between the two sets represents something physically real face the same problems. Those differences are not expressed in anything observable. All the observables derive from the field strengths E and B and the two sets agree on the fields E and B. Further, Maxwell's equations cannot pick between the two sets. For Maxwell's equations are expressed fully in terms of these same E and B fields.

Copyright © 2011 by
John D. Norton <>

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