Supplement to Singularities and Black Holes

Lightcones and Causal Structure

In attempting to diagram relativistic spacetimes, one of the most imporant features to capture is the causal structure of the spactime. This structure specifies which events (that is, which points of space and time) can be connected by trajectories that are slower than light, which events can be connected by trajectories traveling at the speed of light, and which events cannot be connected by anything travelling at or below light speed. Events in the first group are said to be "timelike related," because a physical clock could travel from one event to the other. Events in the second group are "lightlike related" because a light ray can travel from one to the other. Events in the third group are "spacelike related." Given that it is physically impossible (on the standard interpretation of relativity theory) for any causal process to exceed the speed of light, these three possible ways of being connected tell us whether one event is able to influence another.

We can depict these three spatiotemporal relationships by drawing in the "lightcone" of an event. Given an event p, the lightcone of p consists of all the points that can be connected to p by a straight ray of light. Imagine that event p is someone flashing a bright light from a particular location. Then one second later, there will be a sphere of points that is currently occupied by the outgoing light pulse. Two seconds later, a larger sphere, farther out, will be illuminated, and so on. We can depict these spheres at progressive times in a spacetime if we ignore one dimension of space so that we can draw in the points occupied by the light pulse as a circle, as in the following figure:

We can likewise depict the points in the past that are connected to point p by light rays. For a given time, these points will again form a sphere, which will grow larger the farther into the past we look. Thus the full light cone looks like this:

We can now use these lightcones to depict the causal structure of spacetime. Anything outside of the lightcone of p cannot causally interact with p. The "causal future" of p consists of the points on and inside the future half of the light cone (likewise, the causal past is picked out by the bottom half of the lightcone). Note that because nothing can go faster than light, the trajectory of any object will always remain within the lightcone of each event along that trajectory:

We depict flat spacetime by keeping all the lightcones oriented in the same direction, as in the following figure.

The curvature of spacetime, then, will be depicted by the tilting of these lightcones. This reflects the fact that the causal structure of such spacetimes is different from that of flat spacetimes. So, for example, the spacetime around a massive body like a star will be depicted as follows.

We have a black hole when the curvature of spactime becomes so severe that, for some region, there is no path out of that region that remains inside its own lightcones. That is, the causal structure of the spacetime is such that one cannot escape from that region without travelling faster than light. Such a region is by definition a black hole; the border of that region is the event horizon.

Return to main entry

Copyright © 2009 by
Erik Curiel <>
Peter Bokulich <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free

The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007.