Notes to Spinoza's Modal Metaphysics

1. Cf. Oldenburg's remark on behalf of others in Ep74, “If this [necessitarianism] is conceded and affirmed, they say, the sinews of all law, all virtue and religion are severed,” and Jonathan Bennett's remark: “This implies that every particular proposition is itself necessary, that being the dangerously false thesis towards which his explanatory rationalism is pushing him” (Bennett (1984), 121, emphasis mine).

2. For the most part, I will ignore the thorny issue of how to fit the attributes into Spinoza's ontology. Spinoza claims that attributes somehow constitute the essence of substance (Id4), and in Ip4d he even suggests that the attributes are identical to substance itself, though it is far from obvious how to understand this one-to-many identity claim.

3. See also Iax4, Iax5, and Ip3d. The pesky PSR question of what is it in virtue of which these conceptual relations obtain is a difficult one. Leibniz was inclined towards an answer in terms of asymmetrical containment: y conceptually depends on x in virtue of the containment of the concept of y in the concept of x. Spinoza once glosses conceptual relations in terms of containment in passing (C 245), but he fails to develop this idea further, and instead he usually relies on the more ambiguous description of conceptual “involvement.”

4. Spinoza's argument for (12) invokes an a posteriori claim that something or other exists (he uses “we exist” in Ip11d, but any existing thing will work). His argument is that (a) something exists; (b) everything that exists exists either in itself (substances) or in another (modes) (Iax1); (c) it is impossible for something that is in another to exist unless that in which it inheres also exists (Ip1 and Ip11d). Spinoza then runs a simple argument by cases: (d′) If a substance is among the things existing in (a), then a substance exists. (d″) If a mode is among the things existing in (a), then a substance exists. Conclusion: since, by (b) only substances and modes exist, it follows from (a)-(d) that at least one substance exists. (The basis for (d′) is obvious. The basis for (d″) is the fact that modes inhere in substances and (c).)

5. See Descartes' Principles I.53 (Descartes 1985, I/210) and Comments on a Certain Broadsheet (Descartes 1985, I/298).

6. This version is taken from Leibniz's early Confessio philosophi (Leibniz 2005, 29), but there are many variations of it across Leibniz's corpus. For a recent discussion of Leibniz's views on perfection and harmony, see Strickland (2006).

7. For the most well known version of the “category mistake” objection (as well a discussion of other problems with the property/mode reading), see Curley (1969). For a recent defense, see Melamed (2009).

8. For a recent attempt to connect Spinoza's infinite modes with other pieces of his ontology (notably formal essences), see Garrett 2009.

9. Although the terminology can be misleading, these are not two distinct species or kinds of necessity, whatever that may mean. The same distinction can be made using only the contemporary “□” to stand for the single kind of necessity. The important point is that y necessarily following from something else does not by itself make y's existence necessary. In propositional terms, the hypothetical/absolute distinction is sometimes expressed as the necessity of the consequence vs. the necessity of the consequent.

10. Spinoza will also need to rule out AP3, the possibility that infinite modes could not have had different characteristics than they in fact have. But Spinoza seems to think that effects are wholly determined by their causes in the sense that both their existence and their characteristics necessarily follow from their causes. There are no fully self-determining features of modes; everything about a mode is at least partly determined by its causes. In the case of infinite modes, since those causes are themselves absolutely necessary, this means that both the existence and characteristics of infinite modes are absolutely necessary. Hence AP3 will not be a genuine alternative possibility for infinite modes. If Curley is correct that the infinite modes are ontological expressions of the laws of nature (at different levels of generalization), denying AP3 would amount to denying that the laws of nature could have been different than they in fact are.

11. Leibniz appears to have read Spinoza's Ip28 in this way (Leibniz 1969, 203). For further discussion of Leibniz's reading of Spinoza, see Laerke 2008.

12. Curley develops his rejection of necessitarianism further in Curley and Walski, 1999. For an alternative defense of the non-necessitarian interpretation of Spinoza, see Martin 2010. Martin tries to restrict the scope of Ip16 to infinite modes and also defends what I called the “cursory reading” of Ip28.

13. Leibniz develops this PSR point nicely (Leibniz 1969, 486), though the conclusions he reaches from it are very different from Spinoza's.

14. Notice that, if the entire collection of finite modes is itself an infinite mode, a suggestion Garrett makes, the distinction between [ii] and [iii] would collapse.

15. This sentiment is nicely expressed by one J. Jackson in 1734: “When it appears that an absolute necessity in the nature of things themselves is the reason and ground of their being what they are, we must necessarily stop at this ground and reason; and to ask what is the reason of this reason which is in the nature of things the last of all reasons, is absurd” (quoted in Lovejoy 1936, 148).

16. Incidentally, this provides Spinoza a basis from which to criticize some forms of contemporary anti-essentialism, according to which cheaply made conceptual (or, more likely, analytical) connections between objects and properties are sufficient and jointly necessary for metaphysically determining modal facts (Newlands forthcoming).

17. Although it is a minority opinion today, interpreting Spinoza as denying the existence of finite things has a rich pedigree. For recent discussions of this charge of “acosmism,” see Melamed 2010 and Newlands 2011.

18. It also allows us to answer Bennett's similar questions (Bennett 1984, 123).

Copyright © 2013 by
Samuel Newlands <>

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