Spinoza's Physical Theory

First published Fri Sep 22, 2006; substantive revision Mon Jan 30, 2012

Spinoza's thought stands at an uneasy and volatile period in the development of physical theory. His physical science is largely Cartesian, both in content and rationalistic method. It is harshly dismissive of the “occult qualities, intentional species, substantial forms, and a thousand other trifles” (letter 60, to Boxel) of pre-revolutionary scholastic natural philosophy. It is likewise antagonistic to the new Baconian experimentalism, holding that empirical findings can at best present examples of what reason itself demonstrates.   Spinoza neither perceives the particular difficulties for Cartesian physical theory that lead Leibniz to revive both finalism and substantial forms, nor foresees the Newtonian theory of universal gravitation whose mathematical and empirical superiority to the Cartesian vortex theory lead to its universal acceptance, despite its own revival of occult powers in the form of forces operating at a distance.

Yet Spinoza is no orthodox Cartesian. He recognizes a variety of shortcomings in Descartes' physical views and moreover rejects much of the metaphysical foundation upon which these views rest. In light of these disagreements, Spinoza holds that bodies are not substances, but rather modifications of a single substance, and he develops a distinctive and novel view of their individuation. He must also find an alternative basis for the basic principles that underlie and explain the motion and interaction of bodies. The resulting physical view arguably contains anticipations of the fundamental character of modern physics, and certainly anticipates modern theory of homeostatic systems. Yet in spite of its express mechanistic and deterministic character, Spinoza's physical theory appears to exploit an irreducible element of finalism, and to accord an important explanatory role to individual bodily essences.

This article first briefly discusses and places in context the textual sources most relevant to a consideration of Spinoza's physics. It then present in brief summary those of Spinoza's philosophical views that bear most directly on his physical theory. Having identified the central issues for physical theory that emerge, it then examines the sources in more detail to clarify them. Finally, it situates Spinoza's views vis-à-vis contemporary mathematical and experimental science.

Note on citation form. Citations to Spinoza's Ethics give the part in roman capitals, then the proposition, definition, or axiom number, (e.g., p13, or d5)), and then specify whether the cited material is in a scholium (s), corollary (c), or lemma (l). Citations to other works are given in the same style, except that they are prefaced by the abbreviated title of the work, in italics (e.g., “PCP ” for Principles of Cartesian Philosophy).

1. Sources and context

While the other two great rationalists, Descartes and Leibniz, were physical theorists and mathematicians of the first rank who made substantial contributions to the development of physical science, the same cannot be said of Spinoza. Nor was Spinoza a systematic experimentalist. Indeed, his contributions to the historical development of physical theory are minimal. This is not because the physical theory he presented was rejected or overlooked, but rather because Spinoza simply never presented a physical theory as such. Most of his writing concerning physical theory is instead in the service of other ends: exegetical, as an expositor of Descartes' philosophy; metaphysical, in elaborating, for example, the relationships between God or Nature as the single substance and the finite things he treats as “modes” thereof; or psychological, in explaining the distinctive characteristics and possible blessedness of the human mind as the idea of an especially complex individual body.

The main sources of evidence for Spinoza's thought concerning physical nature are his Principles of Cartesian Philosophy, the first half of his magnum opus the Ethics, and a number of important letters from his correspondence. The PCP contains by far the most focused and detailed of Spinoza's writing on physics proper, but is officially billed as an exposition of Descartes. The first half of the Ethics presents a physical theory only insofar as Spinoza finds this necessary to serve his goals in that work to explicate the nature of God and the natures and origins of the human mind and its affects. Discussion of the physical in the correspondence, though often illuminating, is typically directed at providing either clarification or defense of his views in response to queries and objections, or at discussing contemporary views and developments in experimental and theoretical science in order to show that they are either mistaken or consistent with his own views.

2. Overview of the Ethics as it bears on physical theory

The philosophical view that emerges from the Ethics, in so far as it bears on physical theory, can be outlined as follows. God or Nature is the unique substance (Ip14), existing essentially (Ip7), infinite in power (Ip8), and characterized by infinite attributes, each constituting its essence (Id4). Finite things are but modifications of that substance, and not themselves independent beings (Ip14); bodies in particular are modes of substance conceived under the attribute Extension. God or Nature, as the ultimate cause of all things, is also the cause of all the particular modifications of extended nature (Ip18). However, substance's power is not expressed through the operations of will and intellect; the one substance does not act by conceiving a design in the intellect and bringing it to existence through the will (Ip23cl, Appendix, I). Hence Nature is not a teleological system, natural phenomena do not have purposes, and all causation between modes is efficient, none final. Since things are conceived through their causes, and modes are conceived always through the attribute to which they belong, there can be no trans-attribute causation. Bodies and their modifications cannot cause ideas, nor can ideas cause modifications of bodies (IIp6). All modes are conceived through the substance in which they inhere; in this sense God or nature is an indwelling cause of all things (Ip18). But the particular modifications of Extension are causally necessitated entirely by the determining operation of prior modes of the same attribute, themselves so determined, ad infinitum (Ip28). The physical domain is thus completely closed causally, impervious to influence from modes of other attributes and to intervention of divine will, and fully deterministic (Ip29).

Thought is another attribute through which substance is conceived (IIp1). Since substance is unique, and the attributes simply various essences under which it is conceived, the series of finite modal causes in each attribute must operates strictly in parallel with one another (IIp7). For every modification of Thought there is a modification of Extension it mirrors, and vice versa; and the causal order of the one is perfectly matched with that of the other. The mind, a finite mode of Thought, is, under this parallelism, simply the idea of the body to which it corresponds under the parallelism (IIp13). The economy of ideas is precisely as closed, necessitated and deterministic as that of bodies.

Bodies are individuated one from the other, not by reason of substance, but rather by reason of motion and rest (IIp13sl1), individual identity through time and change being a matter of the dynamic maintenance of a distinctive ratio of motion and rest of a body's parts (IIp13s Def.). The human body is simply a particularly complex individual body, capable of maintaining its distinctive structure through a wide variety of externally imposed modifications, and capable of forming corporeal images of those bodies that affect it. An affect that increases the body's ability to maintain its distinctive ratio is paralleled in the mind by a modification that increases that mind's power of thought, and the passage from lesser to greater power is joy (IIIp11s, Affect Def. II). Modifications that decrease the power of a body to maintain its individual ratio are paralleled by modifications decreasing the mind's power of thought, and such passages are sadness (IIIp11s, Affect Def. III). Further, individuals, both minds and bodies, strive to persevere in their existence as far as they can; that is to say, they strive to increase the power by which they maintain their distinctive natures (IIIp6). Bodies, then, have essences, which are powers of striving (IIIp7). The causal interactions in which a body participates that are attributable to the action of that body increase its power of perseverance; it is in contrast passive with respect to those that diminish its power. Evidently, for Spinoza, strict necessitarian determinism is consistent with a genuine distinction between action and passion, between doing and suffering an act.

Several fundamental and distinctive issues of interpretation pertaining to the physical arise from this picture. How are bodies to be conceived, if not as independent substances? How are motion and rest to be conceived so as to make sense of the claim that bodies are individuated by them? How are the principles of inertia and the collision laws that follow from it to be accounted for, given that they cannot be grounded in God's immutable will? What is the nature of the individual striving of bodies, and how can it be reconciled with Spinoza's deterministic dynamics of Extension? These issues cannot be addressed independently of one another. The present discussion will approach them as they emerge from Spinoza's engagement with Cartesian physics, beginning with the PCP‘s exposition of Descartes’ views.

3. Physical cartesianism and the consequences of metaphysical divergence

3.1 Areas of agreement and divergence

Spinoza agrees with the Cartesian conception of body as res extensa (Latin, extended thing), i.e., things necessarily and exhaustively conceived through extension. He was, like Descartes, a plenist, rejecting the intelligibility of a vacuum. Furthermore, we know from Spinoza's correspondence that he accepted nearly all of Descartes' kinematic views, that is, the laws he articulated describing the course of physical phenomena. He likewise agrees with Descartes that physical nature should not be conceived as a teleological system, and that appeals to final causes should be banished from physical theory.

Yet Spinoza had substantial disagreements with Descartes over a wide range of metaphysical issues that bear on physical theory. Most obviously, he rejected Descartes' dualism of extended and mental substances in favor of substance monism, and correspondingly rejected Cartesian mind-body interactionism. Some of these metaphysical disagreements penetrate right to the grounds of the physical views the two thinkers share, revealing much of their agreement to be quite superficial. Consider, for example, their shared rejection of appeals to final causes in physics. Descartes held that final causal or teleological thinking is useless in physics, not because physical nature is not in fact teleological, but because our finite understanding cannot hope to understand the divine will, hence cannot grasp the purposes with which physical nature is imbued. For Spinoza, in contrast, the problem is not epistemological but metaphysical. The divine cause of the world has no will, and does not create things with a plan in mind (1p32c, p33d, s2); hence nature is simply not a teleological system at all.

Spinoza's agreement with the Cartesian laws of nature and collision provides a telling set of further examples. Spinoza explicated and elaborated on these at length and in detail in the PCP. Interpreting this work as an expression of Spinoza's own thinking is a delicate matter, since its explicit aim is to present and explicate Descartes' views, not Spinoza's own. Despite this, the PCP provides a number of indications of where Spinoza diverges from Descartes on the metaphysical foundations of physics. In particular, the demonstrations Spinoza offers of most of the basic principles of Cartesian physics are often significantly different from or supplementary to Descartes' own, and seem to presage important elements of Spinoza's mature thought as expressed in the Ethics.

One such supplement involves Spinoza's attempt to extend the range of application of Descartes' collision rules. Descartes' collision rules are limited in scope to the special case of bodies moving along a single line. In a scholium following a corollary Spinoza adds to Descartes' third rule, Spinoza, explains that the vexed Cartesian term “determinatio” (determination) signifies not just the direction of a motion, but also a force of motion along that direction (PCP IIp27s). He then attempts to demonstrate how the Cartesian collision laws can be extended to oblique collisions, by showing how this force can be resolved into components by the rule of parallelograms. Spinoza's confused attempt fails, but this failure is not of much interest on its own. Given that the oblique case is surely more ordinary that the collinear case, and given that generality of application is something one would surely want in collision laws, what is interesting is why Descartes did not himself attempt to provide rules of more general coverage, and why Spinoza felt that he had to do so.

A plausible answer lies in a difference in their views as to the degree and way in which physical nature forms a closed system. Descartes held that quantity of motion, conceived as the product of speed and bulk, is conserved in all physical interactions.[1] This view allowed him to hold that mental substances can interact with bodies and influence their motions, so long as they influence only their direction. But given such influence, there can be no fully general physical laws covering collisions. The precise state of a physical system for Descartes cannot be determined by its prior state plus the laws of nature.[2] In this sense Descartes was not a physical determinist. Given that the possible intrusion of extra-physical influence precludes fully general collision laws, Descartes might not have thought it worthwhile to puzzle too much over the formulation of laws concerning non-linear motion, thinking it sufficient to illustrate the application of the principles governing interaction only in the simplest cases.

Spinoza emphatically rejected Cartesian interactionism. For him, extended nature is an entirely closed system. All the determinations of body, including not just quantity of motion but also direction, are wholly accounted for by the causal determination of other bodies, combined with the nature of the body in question. Spinoza makes this quite clear in Ip28:

Every singular thing, or any thing which is finite and has a determinate existence, can neither exist nor be determined to produce an effect unless it is determined to exist and produce an effect by another cause, which is also finite and has a determinate existence … and so on, to infinity.

Since modes of distinct attributes cannot cause or explain one another, and since God is the cause of modes only insofar as he is considered to be affected by another thing under the attribute of which they are modes (IIp6, IIp9), it follows that every determination of an extended thing results from the exclusive determining operations of other extended things. In this light, Spinoza should have felt more acutely than Descartes the need for a set of collision laws of fully general application.

Unbeknownst to him this need could only be met effectively by the rejection of Descartes' conservation law. Spinoza nowhere calls this law explicitly into question, and his acceptance of Descartes' collision laws strongly suggests that he did in fact accept it. But he cannot have accepted the metaphysical grounds Descartes offers for it. For Descartes, substances are dependent for their existence at every moment upon God's concurrent creative activity, and since God's will is constant, he always recreates the whole of the extended world with exactly the same quantity of motion as he put there in the beginning. Each and every one of Descartes' laws of motion is for him metaphysically grounded in the immutability of the divine will. But Spinoza's God has no will, and the world is not a product of creation, in the sense in which creation follows from a decision to act in accord with a conception formed in the understanding. Spinoza's own commitment to rationalism nonetheless demands that there be some reason for the conservation of motion.

3.2 The principle of least modal mutation

This divergence over the possible metaphysical grounds for natural laws and collision rules is important for understanding what is fundamentally at stake in another of Spinoza's supplements to what Descartes had himself offered in his Principles of Philosophy. In a letter to Clerselier, Descartes makes clear that of all of his rules of collision “depend on only a single principle, which is that when two bodies collide, and have in them incompatible modes, there must undoubtedly occur some mutation of these modes to make them compatible, but this mutation is always the least possible” (Descartes 1964–74: V, 185, emphasis added). Following Gabbey (1996), call this the “Principle of Least Modal Mutation” (PLMM). Despite is importance, Descartes neither mentions the PLMM is his Principles, nor offers a justification for it in the letter to Clerselier or elsewhere.

In the PCP, Spinoza includes the principle Descartes left out, and offers the demonstration Descartes never attempted. PCP IIp23 states: “When the modes of a body are forced to undergo variation, that variation will always be the least that can be.” The demonstration consists of a concise and exclusive appeal to PCP IIp14, Spinoza's rendering of Descartes' law of inertia, according to which “Each single thing, insofar as it is simple and undivided and is considered only in itself, always perseveres in the same state, as far as it can”. But just as Descartes never explains why the PLMM is true, Spinoza never explains why the principle of inertia supports the PLMM. Moreover, as formulated in PCP IIp14, it seems prima facie inadequate to do so. PCP IIp14 speaks of what happens to a body only as it is considered in itself, simple and undivided, whereas PCP IIp23 speaks of bodies undergoing variation imposed by other bodies, and is not limited to simple and undivided bodies. And even supposing PCP IIp14 relevant to what goes on with bodies when considered as affected by other bodies, it does not give any obvious guidance as to what then occurs. It seems on the face of it quite possible that the least total modal variation commanded by PCP IIp23 might involve a greater variation on the part of each of the colliding bodies than would be consistent with either body in question persevering in its state as far as it can on its own. We are of course told they always remain in the same state “as far as they can.” But for this qualification to be of any relevance, it will obviously have to mean “as far as they can, in the face of the influence of external bodies”; but until we know the content of the collision laws, we are not entitled to say how the influence of external bodies affects a body's inertial tendency. Yet it is just this content we need PCP IIp23 to derive.

How, then, might inertia be understood so that it supports the PLMM? In good rationalist fashion, we should expect to come to a sound understanding of the principle of inertia by attending to the grounds from which it follows. But just as in the case of the Cartesian conservation law, Spinoza cannot himself have accepted the Cartesian strategy of grounding inertia in the immutability of God's will. Spinoza offers his own principle of inertia in the so-called “physical interlude” of the Ethics, at IIp13 L3C: “a body in motion moves until it is determined by another body to rest; and a body at rest also remains at rest until it is determined to motion by another”. Rather than appealing to divine will, Spinoza's demonstration of this principle seems to proceed from causal rationalism alone.

When I suppose, for example that a body A is at rest and I give no consideration to other moving bodies, I can assert nothing about body A but that it is at rest. Now if it should thereafter happen that body A is in motion, this surely could not have resulted from the fact that it was at rest; for from that fact nothing else could have followed than that body A should be at rest.

Since nothing in the conception of a thing as moving or at rest, without regard to other things, could explain a change in its motion or rest, something outside that conception is required to do so. This demonstration cites no previous propositions or axioms of the Ethics; indeed Spinoza claims his principle of inertia is “self-evident”.

But it would be unsatisfying to take inertia as primitive—to say that bodies in fact do tend to persist in their states, though there is no reason to be discerned in their nature why they do so. To say this would be to take it that Spinoza accepted the Cartesian principle as Descartes understood it, while rejecting the grounds Descartes offered for it, and without providing any substitute for it. This is dissonant indeed with the general tenor of Spinoza's rationalism.[3] Moreover, on this view, Spinoza would have taken the trouble to make explicit the PLMM Descartes' rules require, only to justify it by a direct and unelaborated appeal to a groundless principle of inertia, which seems, on Descartes' understanding of it, quite inadequate to do the job. Yet Spinoza evidently did think that the PLMM followed from the principle of inertia. This suggests that he had a different conception than did Descartes of both the nature and ground of that principle.

3.3 The principle of inertia and striving

An intriguing shift in the language Spinoza uses in the PCP to articulate the Cartesian laws of motion is suggestive of how Spinozistic and Cartesian inertia may differ. In PCP IIp16, Spinoza states “every body which moves in a circle, as for example, a stone in a sling, is continuously determined to go on moving along a tangent.” The immediately succeeding proposition, PCP IIp17, states, “Every body that moves in a circle strives to move away from the center of the circle that it describes” (emphasis added). Spinoza has substituted “strives” for “is continuously determined to do”, the Latin “conari” for the “tendere” of PCP IIp16, which is what Descartes had used in expressing his own version of the law of centrifugal motion. This substitution arguably involves a shift in dynamical implication. Conari usually has the sense of the English “exertion”, “effort” “undertaking”, or “impulse”, reading conari in accord with this usual sense, PCP IIp17 not only describes what a body moving circularly will do when it is not compelled by an external cause, but attributes that action to the effort or impulse of the moving body. PCP IIp17's invocation of conari, if we read it in this active sense, signals an ongoing effort, a continuous directedness, in this case, at homeostasis.

One must be quite circumspect in drawing inferences from this terminological shift on Spinoza's part. For one thing, the word for which conari is substituted, tendere, can have similar connotations itself, carrying the sense of a try or an attempt. For another, “conari” is, as Curley points out (Spinoza 1985, p. 280 n. 43), a perfectly good Cartesian word, and in Descartes' usage, it is quite clear that “conari” is not intended to imply anything really active on the part of the “striving” body. In Principles 3.56, Descartes tells us that the striving (conari) after some motion of inanimate things “merely means that they are positioned and pushed into motion in such a way that they will in fact travel in that direction, unless they are prevented by some other cause”. Spinoza faithfully reiterates this passive sense of “striving” on Descartes' behalf in PCP IIId3. On the other hand, “conari” is also cognate with a perfectly good Spinozistic word, “conatus”, which is his term in the Ethics for an individual's inherent power of striving to persevere in its being (IIp6). Spinoza identifies this power as the essence of the individual (IIIp7), and further identifies its increase with the individual's increased power of action, as opposed to passion, that is, with an increase in power of self-determination as opposed to external determination (IIIp11). This suggests that “conari”, as Spinoza intends it, involves something more than the mere passive tendency the term signifies for Descartes. Recalling once again that the inertial tendency of bodies described in PCP IIp14 cannot, for Spinoza, be accounted for by appeal, in the manner of Descartes, to divine will, the substitution of “conari” for “tendere” in PCP IIp17 may signal the fact that Spinoza is all along thinking of inertia as resulting from an active principle in bodies as such.

If Spinoza's principle of inertia is to provide a ground for PCP IIp17 taken as involving “conari” in an active sense, then it must be taken to amount to the claim not just that bodies will not in fact change their state unless externally determined to do so, but also that even while external causes are acting on a body (e.g., the sling holding the stone in circular motion), the body's own impulse is at work actively endeavoring to determine it to move as it would in the absence of that external cause. And reading Spinozistic inertia this way, imputing to the body a continuous effort to move so as to maintain the state it would be in absent external determination, also suits it to ground the PLMM. Given the symmetry of interaction, each of the bodies to an interaction, being externally determined to change by the other, will strive to resist change as far as it is able. Plausibly, then, the total change of state resulting from the resolution of the opposition of the interacting bodies will be the least total possible. This suggests, at least tentatively, that even in the PCP, Spinoza is at work attempting to shore up worries in the foundations of Cartesian physics that stem from the unduly passive Cartesian construal of the equation of body with extension.

3.4 Striving and teleology

Quite apart from the question whether Spinoza intended to impose this more active reading of inertial dynamics on Cartesian philosophy, either deliberately or unawares, he clearly made the striving conatus of individual modes an important centerpiece of the mature philosophy he presented in the Ethics. IIIp6, which articulates the conatus doctrine according to which “each thing, as far as it can by its own power, strives to persevere in its own being”, has been the subject of a great amount of interpretive puzzlement in the literature. A main focus of this puzzlement is the extent to which IIIp6 represents a teleological element in Spinoza's natural philosophy. It is certainly central to Spinoza's subsequent treatment of human psychology, according to which we strive to obtain those things that increase our power and to avoid those that diminish it. Spinoza takes his conatus principle to license inferences from sentences of the form “x would increase A‘s power” to sentences of the form “A does x so far as A is able”; this is genuine explanatory teleology, treating a state to be achieved—the increase of power—as an end towards which a thing's activity is directed, as an explanatory ground for a behavior.

One impulse to read teleology out of the conatus principle and to regard both as fundamentally irrelevant to Spinoza's physical theory is that the latter's first explicit appearance in part III of the Ethics comes long after Spinoza presents his accounts of extended nature and the basic mechanics of modes thereof, indeed in a way that makes it very hard to see how any teleology could be involved at all. Ip28 denies that any singular thing can be determined to exist or to produce an effect unless it has been so determined by a prior finite cause, ad infinitum. The use made of Ip28 in IIp9 suggests that Spinoza intends Ip28 to articulate not just a necessary condition on modal existence and determination, but the exclusive means by which finite modes are brought to existence and determined to have any particular effects. This seems to allow no room for action of bodies in their own right, no residual space for any contribution to the motions of bodies of the active striving of the moving bodies themselves. Moreover, Spinoza expressly denies that nature is a teleological system, and claims that final causal/teleological explanations “turns nature completely upside down. For what is really a cause it considers as an effect, and conversely, what is an effect it considers as a cause” (Appendix, I).

In this light, he problem from the standpoint of the metaphysics of Extension — the basis of physical theory—is to explain why the specific configuration of a given existing mode makes any contribution at all to the determinations that result from the operation of external modal causes. It would be rash to read Ip28 in such a way that the causal powers of a body owe everything to the contributions of extrinsic causes, and nothing to the intrinsic nature of the body itself. Spinoza says in IIp13s A1 that “all modes by which a body is affected by another body follow both from the nature of the body affected and at the same time the nature of the affecting body, so that … different bodies may be moved differently by one and the same body.” (This is a key point in Spinoza's account of corporeal imagination, mental representation and the first kind of knowledge, offered at IIp17–41.) So the nature of an affected body makes a difference to the way it is affected extrinsically. This is not surprising. But then what explains why a body's nature makes a contribution to the way extrinsic influences determine it? As we saw in the previous sections, some answer to this question is required to make sense of the PLMM, and hence of all of the collision laws. The notion, shared by the teleological reading of conatus and the active reading of Spinozistic inertia, that it is in the nature of bodies actively to strive of their own power would seem to help. But is it Spinozistic? We require a more probing examination into Spinoza's conception of the nature of individual bodies.

4. Bodies as modes of substance and as individuals.

As noted above, Spinoza accepts the basic Cartesian view that physical things are res extensa—extended things. However, whereas Descartes held that distinct bodies are distinct extended substances, Spinoza famously holds that there is but one substance—God or nature—and that distinct bodies are merely modes of this one substance, considered as extended. Spinoza's substance monism is in part motivated by inadequacies in the Cartesian view. Descartes officially defines substance in terms of independence: a substance is that whose existence depends upon no other thing. But only God satisfies this definition, all other beings depending on God for their existence. So Descartes also allows for finite substances—minds and bodies—that are dependent only upon God. But it is only in an equivocal sense that both God and created, finite bodies and minds are substances. Spinoza will have none of this. For him, independence is the sine qua non of substance, and nothing that is not its own cause — nothing whose existence is not of its essence—is independent. Hence nothing finite and created is substantial. Further, since everything is either in itself or in another (Ia1), finite things like bodies are in substance, that is, they are in some way features of the one substance.

This denial of substantiality to bodies gives rise to an important interpretive issue. The traditional concept of a substance has at least two important strands. One is the idea we have already seen, of substance as independent. Spinoza clearly means his ‘demotion’ of bodies to modal status to be a denial that they are substances in this sense. But another is the idea of a substance as an ultimate subject of predication, that is, as something of which properties or relations may be predicated, but which is itself never predicated of anything else. Does Spinoza mean to deny to bodies and other finite things this status as an ultimate subject as well? That is, is talk of bodies fundamentally to be construed for Spinoza as predicative or adjectival on substance? Or do bodies, though they are not substances, nonetheless lie on the subject side of the subject/predicate divide, themselves bearers of properties, but not strictly properties of anything else? This matter is of the utmost importance for the understanding of Spinoza's physical theory, since deciding that Spinoza held bodies to be in fact ways substance is and adjectival on it, in accord with the former interpretation, requires that bodies as ordinarily conceived must be thought of as arising from and reducible to some more fundamental qualitative variation in spatiotemporal regions and of extension. This has the consequence, to some commentators salutary, of rendering Spinoza physical theory strongly prescient of contemporary physical views, in which ultimately physical nature is conceived as a field of gradient forces, bodies being not ultimate, but rather the consequences of particular local concentrations of certain classes of those forces, yielding certain characteristic effects in interactions, which effects we take as marking the presence of bodies.

In favor of the adjectival reading (promoted by Bennett 1984) is Spinoza's use of the term “modus”, or “mode”, in connection with bodies; this term regularly signifies a way something is, or a feature it has, functioning to group what are clearly predicates of thing, and in Cartesian usage it means both this and a dependent being. Against the adjectival reading, and in favor of the view (promoted by Curley 1988) that Spinozistic bodies and minds are ultimate subjects of predication, is Spinoza's persistent references to bodies as individuals and as things. The adjectival view of bodies, unlike the subjectival, must therefore face the difficult general question how individuals or things can be predicated of another individual or thing. However, the question of how bodies are individuated—the principles according to which they are distinguished from one another and maintain identity through time and change—presents especially interesting and thorny difficulties for both the adjectival and subjectival views of bodies.

5. Individuation of bodies and the variety in matter

While Descartes does claim (at least most of the time) that individual bodies are distinct substances, he does not invoke this claim in his official account of the individuation of bodies. The account he does offer is highly problematic. Descartes holds “all the variety in matter, and all the diversity of its forms, depends on motion” (Principles 2.23). Thus the distinction between bodies is constituted of distinctions in the motions of regions of extension. On the other hand, Descartes defines motion “in the strict sense of the term”, as the relative change of position of a body relative to those bodies with which it is immediate contact (Principles 2.25). The circularity here is obvious, and crippling. Diversity and variety of bodies depends on motion, but motion depends upon a prior distinction between bodies.

That Spinoza was aware of the problem Descartes' views had accounting for variety in extension is clear: in the late and much discussed letter 83 to Tschirnhaus, Spinoza writes,

With regard to your question as to whether the variety of things can be demonstrated a priori solely from the conception of Extension, I believe I have already shown sufficiently clearly that this is impossible, and that therefore Descartes is wrong in defining matter through extension; it must be explicated through an attribute that expresses eternal and infinite essence.

Spinoza goes on to express the hope that he may live long enough to discuss these matter more clearly, since “there has been no opportunity … to arrange these matters in proper order.” He died before the opportunity arose.

5.1 The Physical Interlude

But perhaps he did present all the elements of these matters, though in improper, hence inadequate, order. The obvious place to look for such a presentation is in the so-called “Physical Interlude” (hereinafter PI) following IIp13s, in which Spinoza gives his most extended and detailed discussion of his own views about the nature of bodies and their principles of distinction and individuation. But the PI seems to offer little help.[4] First, at least at the time of letter 83, Spinoza thought that what was needed to help explain variety in matter was an appeal to an attribute that expresses infinite and eternal essence. Yet the text of the PI makes no appeal to the infinitude, eternality or expressive nature of extension or any other attribute. More importantly, at least on the face of it, the account of the individuation of bodies presented in the PI moves in much the same futile circle as that offered by Descartes. That motion serves to individuate bodies is quite explicit in PIDL1: “Bodies are distinguished from one another by reason of motion and rest, speed and slowness.” PID5 goes on to define “body, or Individual”, in terms of motion, and presupposing a number of bodies:

When a number of bodies, whether of the same or of different size, are so constrained by other bodies that they lie upon one another, or, if they so move, whether with the same degree or different degrees of speed, that they communicate their motions to each other in a certain fixed manner, we shall say that those bodies are united with one another and that they all together compose one body or Individual, which is distinguished from the others by this union of bodies.

Since “body or individual” is here defined in terms of the relations among a plurality of bodies, PID5, to the extent it is meant to cover all bodies, is at best an inductive step of an inductive definition of body. The obvious candidates for the base case are what Spinoza calls “the simplest bodies”. But the description and differentiation of these is likewise in terms of their motion and rest. Indeed, they “are distinguished from one another only by motion and rest” (PIL7s, italics added). Spinoza, like Descartes, then, takes bodies to be distinguished by their respective motion and rest. But motion and rest seem in the first instance to be determinations of bodies. So the motion of bodies seems to presuppose a prior ground of their individuation.

Commentators have tried various strategies for finessing the apparent circularity in the Physical Interlude's account of the diversity in matter. Klever (1988) urges that the key to understanding Spinoza's concept of matter is to see that physical nature is not to be conceived as an infinite extended expanse that somehow is put into motion, but as, fundamentally, matter-in-motion (“moles in motu”). According to Klever, “movement and rest in extension are examples of immediate production by God, whereas the face of the universe with its infinite variations is an example of the mediate effects, which are a product of movement in its turn.” On this interpretation, Spinoza, rather than seeing motion as a received quality of matter, conceives “matter as consequence of motion” (Klever 1988, p. 171). This reading arguably answers Spinoza's call to explain the variety in matter through an attribute that expresses eternal and infinite essence. If God creates extended matter, and then, in a separate act, sets it in motion, the attribute of Extension would not suffice as an eternal expression of infinite essence, since it requires God's additional action in its expression of power.

5.2 Interpreting “motion and rest”

But if this is right, then “motion and rest” of the physical interlude cannot simply be the ordinary motion and rest of bodies. What then are they? Klever waxes vague and anachronistic here, straightaway seeking to validate his claim rhetorically by citing it as precedent of the view of contemporary physics: “in this reversal [Spinoza] anticipates modern physics by which mass is considered as product of energy” (ibid). (Hampshire (1987) contains similar remarks).

Jonathan Bennett's influential reading agrees that Spinoza's physical theory anticipates contemporary views. He also agrees that when Spinoza talks about “motion and rest”[5] he is not invoking these terms in their ordinary senses. But rather than simply identifying motion and rest with energy or any other trope of contemporary physical theory, Bennett holds that the terms function as mere placeholders for some basic physical quality, unknown to Spinoza, but required to make sense of the appearance of bodies—ostensible things or subjects of predication — in the context of a metaphysics that holds that bodies, as modes rather than substances, are not things or subjects at all, but rather ways that the one substance is. According to Bennett, Spinoza's Extension is, at the fundamental metaphysical level, a four dimensional field whose regions differ in the distribution and degree of this basic quality. Bodies are appearances, at one or more levels removed from this base, of the continuous path in this field constituted by relatively consistent local patterns of distribution of this quality. The ordinary “motion” of an ordinary “body” is to be understood on the analogy with the way a thaw traverses a terrain. When the snow line recedes, there is no thing that changes its place; rather, there is a change in which regions of the landscape have the quality of being snow-covered, and that change describes a continuous path.

One might object to that this analogy is not clearly persuasive. Shifts of temperature lead to a thaw only because bodies—ice crystals and aggregates thereof—melt as temperature rises, and their boundaries recede along the backdrop of a very bodily landscape. Indeed, to thaw is just to pass from a solid to a liquid state, and solidity is a benchmark of the bodily. If we excise these bodily aspects of the analogy, it is unclear how much of its explanatory force remains. But then it is unclear just how well qualitative variations of fields can explain the appearance of bodies. Perhaps if we knew more about this quality, the sense in which such continuous paths of patterns of it could appear as or constitute bodies would be clearer. Garrett (1994) adopts Bennett's field metaphysic, and attempts to fill in the explanatory gap by providing definite senses to the PI's uses of the terms “motion” and “rest”. Relying on Spinoza's remark, following PCP IIp22, that “by force of moving bodies, we understand a quantity of motion …. In bodies at rest, we understand by force of resisting a quantity of rest”, Garrett claims that by “motion” and “rest” in the PI, Spinoza means a quantity of force that moves a thing and a quantity of force resisting such imposed movement, respectively. Furthermore, these quantities can be ascribed, he says, to the regions of extension themselves, rather than to bodies, thus overcoming the circularity problem we found in Descartes. But it is unclear that Spinoza's text can support this interpretation. PCP IIp22 speaks of the force or motion “in” a body. Spinoza elaborates: “By force in moving bodies, we understand a quantity of motion, which must be greater, in bodies of equal size, as the speed of motion is greater … . But in bodies at rest we understand by force of resisting a quantity of rest” (emphasis added). In each mention, the force or resistance is attributed to a body. This strongly suggests that quantity of motion and rest, as force and resistance, are features of bodies.[6] Moreover, even supposing that it makes interpretive sense to ascribe force and resistance directly to regions, what is being attributed to these regions seems to be a power to move bodies or to slow bodies down. Rather than showing how bodies could just be, or arise from, fields of such forces, the forces themselves seem to be characterized in ways that presuppose body; the circularity, then, remains.

Individual bodies have an inherent stability, or robustness. They resist destructive incursion or change in their distinctive mode of endurance; they tend to persist in their configuration and motion in the face of opposition to this persistence. Spinoza certainly accepts this, as PID and IIp6 show. If bodies either are, or are appearances of, persistent patterns of qualitative variation of extended regions, then it seems necessary, though hardly sufficient, then something about such patterns would have to account for this stability. But what might do so? In effect, this is to ask what would account for the fact that distributions of “motion” and “rest”, conceived of as predicates of extended regions, do not vary randomly through time. One suggestion is that nothing accounts for this stability at all, and that the duration of a body is nothing more than the time through which a given complex ratio of motion and rest happens, de facto, to characterize regions of extension whose sum over time describes what can be construed as a continuous path. There is nothing to prevent such spatiotemporally continuous patterns from occurring. But there is nothing in being a time slice of such a pattern that explains why the same pattern should also characterize any other spatiotemporal region continuous with it. There may, indeed must, be kinematic laws describing how such patterns vary, but nothing about any given time slice of such patterns accounts for the fact that they are subject to just those descriptive laws. Individual time-slices of such patterns would be wholly passive with respect to the persistence and trajectory of the pattern as a whole.

A significant problem with this line[7] is that Spinoza uses manifestly active language to describe the doings of individuals. For example, II d3 defines “affect” as “affections of the body by which the body's power of acting is increased or diminished, aided or restrained, and at the same time the idea of these affections” (emphasis added). And IIIp6, on which the entire psychological theory of the second half of the Ethics depends, Spinoza claims that individual things strive to persevere in their being; his subsequent uses of the IIIp6 seem clearly to suggest that Spinoza intends this striving to be understood as an a active principle rather than a mere tendency. On the conception of individuals as ratios of motion and rest that simply happen to endure, none of this would make any sense at all.

Viljanen, who also adopts Bennett's field metaphysic, with its implicit denial that Spinozistic “motion and rest” is to be granted an ordinary signification, attempts to accommodate this conception of bodies as active and potent by reading the spatial field as a field of power, and bodies as constituted by differences in the intensity or strength of this power (Valjanen 2007, p. 402), and apparent motion as the redistribution in that field of of various patterns of intensification of that power (ibid., p. 403). He further interprets the “simplest bodies” of of the PI — the basic constituents of all complex individuals — to be distinguished as “rudimentary intensifications of spatial power, or extended power quanta, that invariably change place” (Ibid., p. 408). But the question arises once again what the powers of which these quanta are “intensifications” are powers to do. They cannot, for reasons already mentioned, be powers to move or to resist bodies. The most obvious answer, in the Spinozistic context, would be “powers to persevere in its own being”. But to let the matter stand there would be simply to name the problem rather than to explain it. To the questions “why does this degree of spatial power persevere and endure in the (continuous) place and time to the extent that it does?”, the answer would seem to be “because of the degree of power to persevere that constitutes it”. But that is just to say that it manifests the powers it does because of the powers it has to do so — not very illuminating. “Motion and rest” as power appears to provide either an incomplete or vacuous theory of indivuation.

Moreover, if a body's motion in a spatial field, including that of the simplest bodies, is just a change of location at which a given degree of power is instantiated, then there seems to be no means of explaining why a particular degree of power would necessarily change locations — move — continuously, as opposed to discontinuously. But surely it is in the nature of bodies as explananda here that they are spatiotemporally continuous. Furthermore, if what individuates “quanta of power” are just their degrees of intensity — their degrees of power to persevere, then anywhere that degree is instantiated, that very same body should be. But this would be consistent with the unlikely idea of discrete, discountinuous motion of a body, and indeed with the bi-location of bodies, that is, the idea that a single body might be wholly present in each of multiple regions. Assuming that Spinoza would not accept these possibilities, the theory of “motion and rest” as signifying spatial regions of power distinguished of power fails to account for signal characteristics of body. It is thus doubtful that the inadequacy of Descartes' identification of body with extension can be overcome simply by predicating regions of extension with different “power”.

There are, then, reasons to doubt that granting Spinoza's “rest and motion” a non-ordinary signification—energy, an unspecified basic quality, force of motion and resistance, intensifications of power — can in fact give us insight into the constitution or appearance of persisting, resistant, active bodies. But it is worth asking whether these doubts in fact rest on an inappropriate imaginative basis. It seems difficult imaginatively to represent variegated fields of energy, force, or any other quality in such a way as to make clear how bodies, with the persistent resistance and capacities for interaction we ordinarily represent them to have, could possible appear from or be constituted by them. But this sort of failure of imaginative thinking cannot count against the acceptability of a theory from a proper Spinozistic perspective. On his view, our knowledge of body as an object of imagination is inherently inadequate. Our imaginative ideas of bodies in their corporeality are limited to the ideas of modifications of our own bodies. These in turn reflect only in a confused and partial way the natures of both the bodies with which we are affected and our own. At no time is the full nature of any body reflected in any of the ideas we have through these affections, hence through anything we can imagine. Hence our imaginations cannot grasp the nature of body, and failure of the faculty of imagination to provide insight into the link between the fundamental basis for variety in matter and that variety itself is to be expected. All of this is clear from IIp16–31. Any appearance of insight into the nature of body gleaned from the imagination is as likely to be illusion as illumination.

But if we cannot come to an imaginative grasp of how bodies or their appearances might be constituted out of fields, then through what sort of intellectual act might we do so? In the context of early modern philosophy of physical nature, and in particular the Cartesian philosophy in which Spinoza is steeped, the clarity and distinctness of mathematical ideas provides the contrast to the incompleteness and confusion of idea of the imagination and sensation. And certainly the quantifiability of properly physical qualities, and consequently their comprehensibility within in a closed system of mathematical laws, is of the utmost importance to the credentials of the fundamental notions of the contemporary physical theory Spinoza is alleged to have anticipated. The scientific success of classical mechanics, relativity theory, and, especially, quantum mechanics owes much more to the predictive and formal success of these theories than it does to our abilities to represent phenomena in the imagination that answer to the basic physical elements they countenance. Point masses, gravitational forces operating at a distance, curvatures of space time, finite but unsurpassable velocities, and wave-packets all seem to surpass our powers of imaginative representation. We have no real capacity to imagine how the solid table on which my computer rests can be identical to both a swirling cloud of particles and a warp in the very fabric of space. On the other hand, these fundamental scientific notions can be rendered mathematically, placed within a system of laws, and employed to great effect in predicting and manipulating, hence effectively representing, the same nature we represent imaginatively.

Thus perhaps the proper criterion, or at any event a proper criterion, for the success of an Spinozistic account of variety in matter and its individuation into bodies is the quantifiability of the basic properties in which it proceeds. Gabbey stresses this line with admirable clarity.

To talk of bodies maintaining among themselves “the same proportion of motion and rest,” or communicating motion to each other “in a certain fixed proportion” is to say nothing effective, unless a mathematical account is provided of those proportions and of the measures of motion and rest from which they are formed, and unless there is some account of the laws that ensure the claimed invariance in proportionalities. Spinoza provides no such laws, nor does he say how the proportions are to be mathematically expressed (Gabbey 1996, p. 168).

Gabbey concludes that the theory of bodily individuation by ratio of motion and rest “lacks quantitative anchoring”, and is thus “too vague to allow a assessment of what is being claimed” (Gabbey 1996, p. 169).

That Spinoza did not himself provide the mathematicization of his notion of motion-and-rest that would render his theory of body non-circular and sufficiently clear to be understood (or imagined) does not entail that this cannot be done. A number of commentators have attempted to show that Spinoza's account of variety in matter by appeal to “motion and rest” can be so rendered. Garrett, whose account we have already examined, nods his head in this direction. Recall that PId5 defines an individual as being composed of bodies that “communicate their motions to one another in a certain fixed manner”. Later lemmas characterize this fixed manner as a “ratio” of motion and rest. Notwithstanding his realization that, for a number of reasons, such a ratio must be understood as a pattern rather than a numerical proportion, Garrett's expresses sanguine confidence that “any such pattern could be expressed by a mathematical formula” (1994, p. 86). Matson (1990) also places weight on the possible quantifiability of motion and rest as a means of in rendering it a clear and distinct, non-imaginary basis for our understanding of the individuation of bodies, taking the idea of an atomic number as his model:

Being element No. 16 “pertains to the essence” of sulfur, as being yellow and smelly do not. One can in a sense “imagine” sulfur by its color and odor; but only by articulating it into the attribute, as the atomic number does, can one understand it…. ‘Element No. 16’, together with the comprehensive theory in which this conception is embedded, is a specification of ‘motion and rest’, indicating, in fact, that particular unique ‘proportion of motion and rest’ that is the necessary and sufficient condition for being sulfur. (Matson 1990, pp. 88–89).

Matson piggybacks on to this analogy the formula for the identity of any living thing supposedly found in its genetic code.

If it is right to think of atomic numbers as the specifications of motion and rest for certain stuffs, in the case of the human being (or any living creature) the obvious analogue is the genetic code, the formula for the structure of the individual's (quasi-unique) DNA molecule (Matson 1990, p. 89).

Treating such structures as representable by formulae enhances the impression that they are expressible in numerically quantifiable terms.

Such attempts to interpret motion and rest as numerically expressible quantities constitute efforts to make Spinoza's physical theory relevant to contemporary science, by displaying how it can conform to, and even constitute a blueprint for, its mathematical structure. They stand, then, as responses both to Gabbey's implication that because Spinoza does not say how his notion of motion and rest can be expressed mathematically, his views are too vague and sterile to be of such contemporary relevance, and to the difficulties we have seem, in conceiving how motion and rest, as we conceive them imaginatively, can possible serve to individuate bodies. But at the end of the final section of this article, we will see that, quite apart from the vagueness, anachronism (Spinoza anticipating not just Mendeleyev, but also Watson and Crick?) and other interpretative difficulties faced by such attempts, there are reasons to suppose that any effort to render basic principles of physical theory through numerical quantification may run deeply counter to Spinoza's own attitude.

5.3 Individuation by essence

In the previous sub-section, we saw reasons for doubting the adequacy of readings that treat the PD's talk of motion and rest as constituting his entire account of individuation. This section considers an alternative interpretation of Spinoza's approach to individuation. This account appeals to the notion of individuating essences.

In IId2 Spinoza says:

to the essence of a thing belongs that which, being given, the thing is necessarily posited and which, being taken away, the thing is necessarily taken away; or that without which the thing can neither be nor be conceived, and which can neither be nor be conceived without the thing.

This does not quite offer a definition of “essence”, but rather defines what belongs to it. 2d2 speaks of the essences of “things.” Individuals, or singular things, are surely things. If what belongs to the essence of an individual is given (by “given” Spinoza means “posited as existing”), then so too is the individual. This suggests that the essence of an individual is particular to that individual, since otherwise, what belongs to it could be given without that individual being posited, so long as some other individual with that essence were posited.[8]

But how are we to conceive essences, and how can they help solve the problems we have encountered with claiming the PI, with its talk of motion and rest, provides Spinoza's full account of individuation? In the Preface to Ethics Part IV, Spinoza writes:

When I say that someone passes from a lesser to a greater perfection, and the opposite, I do not understand that he is changed from one essence, or form, to another… . Rather, we conceive that his power of acting, insofar as it is understood through his nature, is increased or diminished.

Here Spinoza writes as if a body's essence and its form are one and the same. In each of PIl4, 5 and 6, Spinoza speaks of bodily persistence in terms of its parts keeping the same ratio of motion and rest. If the parts do so, the body, says Spinoza “will retain its nature, as before, with no change of form” (emphasis added). PIl7 also speaks of a body's retaining its “nature”, despite change. These are plainly mean to state conditions on individual persistence. These lemmas seem to equate nature and form. So by transitivity of identity, form=nature=essence. Moreover, Spinoza implies that so long as this form or essence is retained, a thing is not destroyed. “Form”, “nature” and “essence” than, refer to something in virtue of the persistence of which an individual retains its identity.

In a series of propositions leading up to and supporting IIIp6's articulation of the conatus doctrine, Spinoza also treats “essence” and “nature” as synonyms, and assigns them to things independently of the attribute under which they are considered. IIIp4 is worthy of particular attention here. It states: “No thing can be destroyed except through an external cause”. Garrett (2002) persuasively argues that “external” here contrasts, not with “on the inside”, but with “inherent”, where inherence is a technical notion referring to what belongs to a thing in virtue of its essence. This includes both the thing's essence and those properties following from it. These are all “in” the thing. However, a thing may also have accidental properties, which are “in” it in the general sense in which that which is predicated of a thing is in it, and may also be “in” it in the sense in which one region surrounded by another is in it, but which do not inhere in it. Such properties, in the thing in one sense but external to it in another, may be destructive of the thing. In IIIp4d, Spinoza writes “while we attend only to a thing itself, and not to the external causes, we shall not be able to find anything in it which can destroy it” (emphasis added). Reading “in” here in the sense of “inherent”, and “external” in the sense of “not inherent”, this passage suggests that to attend to a thing itself is just to attend to its essence—what is affirmed in its definition—and what follows from it. To attend to what is not inherent in it is to attend to what is external to it, to something else. An actually existing thing, then, such as an existing body, is its essence brought to existence. So long as a thing retains its essence=nature=form, it retains whatever inheres in it, and endures as the same individual.

The appeal to individuating essences accounts for the robust persistence of bodies. In IIIp6 Spinoza says that “Each thing, as far as it can by its own power, strives to persevere in is own being”. In arguing for this conatus doctrine, Spinoza states that “singular things” are that “by which God's attributes are expressed in a certain and determinate way, i.e., things that express, in a certain and determinate way, God's power, by which God is and acts”. “Things” here takes the active position. Things express power; they do the expressing. They are not mere expressions of it. Power is expressed by things, rather than merely through them. Because this is an active expression of power, the thing not only persists through externally caused changes, but opposes those changes which would tend to destroy it, i.e., to keep it from expressing God's power in the way which constitutes its essence. Finally, in IIIp7, Spinoza expressly identifies this striving with the thing's essence; “the striving by which each thing strives to persevere in its being is nothing but the actual essence of the thing.”

Thus the form or essence of a thing, which individuates it, and whose retention through change constitutes the persistence of an individual, just is its inherent and individual power of striving to retain just form, hence to resist those extrinsic determinants that would diminish its power and destroy it. In the case of body, striving is expressed by the active tendency of a pattern of relative motion and rest, in their ordinary sense, of its parts to persist. The active tendency of that pattern to persist is the essence of the individual body. That pattern is determined in its existence transiently and externally; now this way, and now that, now larger, now smaller, now swifter, now slower, now with these parts, now those. Such transient, external determination may give it accidental properties that oppose and hinder the power of action it has in virtue of what inheres in it, and hence limit its power of action. Another virtue of the idea that essence as active striving is what individuates bodies is that it would provide a basis in the nature of body for the principle of inertia, in such a way that inertia could be taken as a ground for the PLMM we earlier saw was needed to underwrite the collision laws.

However, this view is certainly not without its problems. Indeed, one of its strengths—helping to ground inertia in the persistent activity of bodies, is a weakness. We saw earlier that it is not easy to square this active reading of inertia, grounded as it is in the idea of motion pertaining to the action proper to a body, with a good deal of what Spinoza says in the first and second parts of the Ethics about how no body can be determined to produce an effect unless is it so determined externally. Another, related problem for this interpretation is that it represents Spinoza as, not an avant-garde thinker anticipating modern physics, but as a rear guard defender, despite his official anti-scholastic stance, of the traditional neo-Aristotelian doctrines of essence and substantial form, open to the same charges of ad hoc theorizing and appeal to occult powers that Modernity and the Scientific Revolution leveled against it in its their rise to intellectual dominance. Indeed, the notion of the individual essence of a body conceived as a power to maintain itself is of dubious intelligibility. Spinoza clearly believes that an individual's power to persevere can increase or diminish. But if this power is to constitute the thing's essence and identity, such changes in degree cannot alter the identity of the power. But what then constitutes the individuality and identity of a power? In this light, the account of individuation by essence seems unexplanatory: either it amounts to an elaborate name for the problem of the individuation of bodies it is supposed to solve, or it simply displaces the same sort of problem from bodies to powers.

6. Spinoza and the experimental and mathematical sciences

Attempts to find anticipations of contemporary scientific physics in Spinoza's thinking about the physical face a number of challenges beyond simple anachronism. Contemporary physics is both resolutely experimental and resolutely mathematical. However, there is reason to suppose that Spinoza had dim views of both experimental method in science[9] and the prospects for an insightful mathematical description of nature.

6.1 Observation

It is by now widely accepted that observation is “theory laden”, and that therefore the idea that scientific theory proceeds through the neutral collection of data is bogus. Studies in the logic of confirmation have likewise put an end to the simple-minded idea that experimental method involves devising crucial experiments whose results can, as a matter of logic, falsify a theory, or force a choice among competing theories. Nonetheless, modern science is still thoroughly empirical, relying heavily and essentially on observation and experimentation in the generation, development and testing of theories. The truism that one can always save a theory by rejecting auxiliary assumptions or discrediting data—reports of observation—does not change the facts that, in practice, observational results are taken to refute theories, and the ability to predict and explain a wide range of observable phenomena better than rivals remains the gold standard in scientific method.

Spinoza, however, discounted the relevance of observational data to the discovery of truths of nature. His conception of sense experience seems, in fact, to disqualify it from being a reliable source of information about the world altogether. He held that sense experience, in which the human body is affected by external bodies, can never provide us with adequate ideas of either external bodies or our own. He seems moreover to have denied that the method by which we discover new truths involves either the collection of new sensory evidence or the construction of crucial experiments. Indeed, much of the early Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect is devoted to establishing that “the fictitious, the false, and the other [ideas falling short of truth] have their origin in the imagination, i.e., in certain sensations that are fortuitous, and as it were disconnected, since they do not arise from the very power of the mind, but from external causes, as the body (whether awake or dreaming) receives various motions” (EMI, ¶84). The intellect unaided by imagination, however construed, is the sole source of knowledge. Observation, which involves sensory ideas derived from external causes, has no role in the true method for acquiring adequate knowledge.

In IIp25 Spinoza states “The idea of any affection of the human body does not involve adequate knowledge of an external body”. Sense perception—the basis of experimental observation—is a matter of the body's being affected by external bodies. So it would seem that, prima facie, Spinoza cannot have held that observation can be a means to an adequate knowledge of things. Scientific knowledge — scientia—would, for Spinoza, have to be adequate. Hence it seems that experimental observation ought to be, for Spinoza, irrelevant to science. There is strong confirmation to be found for this conclusion in Spinoza's accounts of the kinds of knowledge.

In IIp40s2, Spinoza discusses four kinds of knowledge or modes of cognition. These are I) knowledge from singular things; II) knowledge from signs; III) knowledge from common notions; and IV) intuitive knowledge. The first two are prone to falsity, as they generate inadequate ideas. Cognition of kind (I) arises from objects represented “through the senses in a way that is mutilated, confused, and without order for the intellect”. This is perception from “experientia vaga”, vague or random experience. Knowledge of kind (II) arises from hearsay, arising “from the fact that having heard or read certain words, we recollect things, and form certain ideas of them … through which we imagine them.” Spinoza groups (I) and (II) together as knowledge of the first kind: opinion or imagination. Inadequate and confused ideas pertain to knowledge of the first kind, and so it is the sole cause of falsity. Both of the sorts of knowledge of the first kind depend upon what we would ordinarily call sense experience. Spinoza does not go so far as to assert explicitly that no true knowledge can ever arise from sense experience. It is only when the senses present us with representations in a way that is “mutilated, confused and without order for the intellect” (IIp40s2), i.e., random, that our resulting conceptions are inadequate. But the question is whether there is any other way, on Spinoza's views about sense perception, that the senses can represent objects to us. Knowledge of the third kind, intuitive knowledge, does not appear to involve the senses at all. It is knowledge proceeding “from an adequate idea of the formal essence of certain attributes of God to the adequate knowledge of the essence of things” (IIp40s2). This knowledge, then, arises from the intellectual consideration of the essence of an attribute itself, rather than from sensuous commerce with modes of that attribute. Knowledge of the second kind, reason, seems a more plausible candidate for arising from experience. This is based on the so-called “common notions”. Common notions are conceptions of things “which are common to all, and which are equally in the part as in the whole” IIp38. Such conceptions can only be adequate, and this would guarantee that the knowledge arising from such conceptions is true. Spinoza also allows that if there were something common and peculiar to the human body and external bodies by which it is affected, and equally in the part as in the whole of each, then the human mind will conceive that thing adequately. The problem, however, is that given Spinoza's views about sensation is it hard to see how such common notions could arise from sensation, and to the extent we can make sense of this, the common notions seem limited to ideas of extremely general features of physical objects, far too general to be a source of any of the kinds of particular observational knowledge required for experimental practice. The inadequacy of a conception of a thing results from its not reflecting the entire nature of a thing's causes. Knowledge of effects is by knowledge of causes, and while things can interact causally only insofar as they share something in common, there can be aspects of the causes of things not reflected in their effects. However, if a conception is of something common to an object and all other things, then there can be nothing in any of its causes not reflected in the conception of it itself; whatever is present in the cause will be present in it as well, hence reflected in the idea of it. But what, we may ask, is even possibly shared by each thing and equally in the part of each as in the whole? The only obvious candidates are properties that follow from the nature of extension: i.e., taking up space, and being subject to motion and to the laws of geometry. But the sorts of observational knowledge that are crucial to experimental method in science are hardly exhausted by the knowledge that pertains to bodies as such. Indeed, experimental observation depends precisely on the observational knowledge of differences, rather than similarities.

Spinoza characterizes experiential vaga as experience that is “without order for the intellect” and as “experience that is not determined by the intellect” (Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, ¶19). This experience is called “random” because “it comes to us by chance, and since ”we have no other experiment to oppose it“; perception attained in this mode it ”remains with us unshaken“. Perception from random experience can, then, be shaken by opposing experiment, but there is nothing here that suggests this is a matter of less random experience overruling more, rather than multiple random experiences conflicting with one another. Moreover, Spinoza really never tells us what it would be for experience to be ”ordered for“ or ”determined by“ the intellect. It is tempting to suppose that he meant, following Bacon, from whom the term ”experientia vaga“ is borrowed, that experience is not vague insofar as it ”proceeds by fixed law, without interruption and in regular order“. (Bacon, Novum Organon, Book I, Aphorism 100). But it is unclear, given Spinoza's general denigration of sense experience as generating only inadequate ideas of things, how the intellect could order the collection of sense experience by law, and it is equally unclear how the result of doing so would shore up the inadequacy of the resulting observations.[10] Bennett, who resists the standard view that Spinoza thought experience irrelevant to knowledge, and cites the possibility of experientia non-vaga, i.e., experience as directed by the intellect, as evidence for this, concedes that Spinoza is entirely silent about experientia non-vaga, offering no account of what it might be, other than ”the experience of someone who puts to nature questions dictated to him by Spinoza's philosophy“ (Bennett 1984, p. 24). Bennett's suggestion that a characterization of this might have to wait until we learn more about how the senses function seems a non-starter, though. For if we conceive the senses as objects of empirical, experimental study, then we cannot learn about them until we know how to order our experience, so the question is begged; and if we conceive of them as objects for non-experiential, non-experimental philosophical reflection, then what more by way of the Spinozistic carrying out of this sort of work is there to be done than Spinoza does in the Ethics?

6.2 Experimentation

Spinoza engaged in very little experimentation of his own, but he did show some interest in the experimental results of others. His letters contain several discussions of experimental and theoretical dioptrics, to be expected from a lens grinder and man of letters, as well as discussions of recent observations of comets and whether they can be explained on Cartesian principles, of the new microscope, and of medical and alchemical experiments. Far and away the most famous and significant discussion of experimentation are found in his exchanges with Henry Oldenburg, the first Secretary of the Royal Society, who operated largely as the mouthpiece of Robert Boyle, and in particular those concerning Boyle's experiments on solidity, fluidity, and on nitre. The latter of these is the most telling of Spinoza's attitude towards the relevance of experiment to theorizing about nature. Boyle had claimed to show that nitre (potassium nitrate) is a chemical compound rather than a mixture, by having decomposed it into fixed and volatile parts (potash and spirit of nitre), and then recombining them into nitre with little or no loss of quantity. The disparate properties of the components, he argued, showed that the nitre itself was a compound, in which the components were altered and transformed, rather than a mere mixture. This, in turn, suggested that the basic constituents of the components were preserved through the interaction, confirming the corpuscular chemical theory over the scholastic view that chemical transformation involves the substantial form of given matter being destroyed and replaced by some other substantial form.

Spinoza in fact agrees with Boyle that the scholastic view is bankrupt, but he rejects Boyle's claim that the separation of the nitre into two parts is actually a decomposition of a distinctive substance into two others; rather, he claims that the experiment is consistent with the Cartesian view, itself based on reason, that differentiations among extended substance are always owing to different quantities of motion and rest. He claimed that the ”fixed nitre“ (potash) was actually an impurity mixed into the original sample, and that the spirit of nitre was simply the volatile state of the pure, crystallized nitre portion of the original mix. Thus the different chemical properties of spirit of nitre and the original sample owe not to a difference of substantial structure—the basic shape of the particles of each is the same—but to a difference in their motion. In support of this reading and against Boyle's interpretation, Spinoza claimed that, if Boyle were actually to show what he claimed, ”further experiment seems to be required to show that Spirit of Nitre is not really Nitre, and cannot be reduced to solid state or crystallized without the help of salt of lye“ (Letters, p. 71). Spinoza then went on at some length to show how, in the absence of such a demonstration, it is easy enough to explain the results of Boyle's experiments along Cartesian lines. He further explains several experiments he himself performed which he takes to support the Cartesian interpretation, claiming that he ”might have added further experiments which would perhaps make the matter quite clear“ (Letters p. 76).

What matters here is not who is right in this dispute, nor whether Spinoza's Cartesian view is in fact coherent, but Spinoza's strategy. For it is hardly an evenhanded assessment of the experimental results. Spinoza shows considerable ingenuity in interpreting the results of Boyle's own experiments to be consistent with the Cartesian view, and his own as (nearly, anyway) proof positive of it. But he shows no inclination to pursue the question whether his own experimental results can be interpreted along the lines of Boyle's hypothesis, which they can be, easily enough, as Boyle's response (letter 11) shows. Indeed, Boyle complains overall that Spinoza's interpretations of the experimental results are wholly driven by Cartesian theory, rather than a fair attempt to adjudicate between the two alternatives. For example, far from proving the need for the ”very fine matter“ of Cartesian physics, this conclusion has been ”assumed“, by Spinoza, ”simply from the hypothesis of the impossibility of a vacuum“. In other aspects of his interpretation, claims Boyle, Spinoza ‘presupposes Descartes' theory of fire”. Now Boyle's readings of the experimental data are hardly less theory driven than are Spinoza's. But where they differ strategically is in the fact that since the Cartesian theory that drives Spinoza's interpretations is derived by the method of pure rational reflection on perceptions that are a priori clear and distinct, Spinoza clearly grants the it a privileged standing in the court of experimentation. On his view, to prove a conclusion that is at odds with one dictated by reason itself, like Descartes', one has to establish impossibility experimentally—which cannot, of course, be done. So long as it is possible to interpret results as consistent with a theory determined by rational reflection alone, those results cannot weigh at all against the theory. Yet experimental results that conform to rationally determined theory confirm it.

Indeed, where there are properly philosophical arguments to be had for a thesis, experimentation is superfluous. In assessing Boyle's experiments designed to prove that all tangible properties depend on the mechanical features of objects, Spinoza wonders why Boyle bothered, since this conclusion “has already been abundantly proved by Verulam, and later Descartes”. (Letter 6). Descartes had proved this a priori from the fact that the sole nature of body is extension, whose sole attributes are size, shape and motion. Moreover, ordinary, mundane observations offer as good proof as any that might be afforded by controlled observation. Boyle's careful experiments could not add any weight to the evidence already available from such ordinary phenomena as the facts that even cold sticks will spark a fire when rubbed together, that water makes sound when it comes to a moving boil, and that stirring and warming foul smelling bodies make them smell yet worse. Spinoza's attitude towards experimental observation seems to be, then, that it can have no weight against a theory based in sound a priori philosophical intuition and geometrical demonstration, and is easy available, though not necessary, to confirm the results of such pure theorizing. Experimentation can help us discover new phenomena, but it cannot help us to prove any scientific propositions we do not already know to be true. As Gabbey (1996) puts it, experimentation “cannot uncover the nature of things; sensory knowledge belongs to the imagination, the knowledge of essences and causes to the intellect alone” (Gabbey 1996, p. 171).

6.3 Mathematical science

Observation and experimentation are no more central to contemporary scientific practice than is quantification. Contemporary physical theory, which Spinoza is said to have anticipated, is thoroughly quantitative in character. Theories are expressed in quantitative terms; giving an explanation of a phenomenon is typically a matter of generating a mathematically formulated law that covers it. Unifying theories is a matter of showing how the mathematical formulae that comprise them can be derived from one another, how the phenomena they concern can be commensurated. Indeed, observation itself is irrelevant to modern physical theory unless it is expressed in quantitative terms, since the prediction yielded by physical theories are predictions of what the observed measures of things will be. This, in turn, requires that the phenomena observed must be measurable.

Spinoza is in a fairly obvious way, a champion of a mathematical approach to understanding the physical world. But Spinoza's mathematical model is Euclidean geometry, and this is not a domain of mathematics that deals with quantities as measurable. And indeed, there is strong evidence that Spinoza thought that a proper understanding of physical nature can never be expressed in terms of measurable quantities. For measure, both of spatial extent and temporal duration, is a mere aid to the imagination, and not a means of intellectually understanding. In Letter 12 to Meyer, Spinoza distinguishes two ways of conceiving quantity. One is abstract and superficial, as we have it is sensation and imagination; on this conception quantities can be finite, divisible, and composed of parts. The other is through the intellect's grasp of substance in which “we apprehend the thing as it is in itself”; on this conception, quantity is infinite, indivisible, and a unity. Spinoza goes on to elaborate how measure of spatial and temporal quantity derives from the abstract, superficial conception of quantity, and leads to nothing but confusion in the attempt to understand physical nature. His discussion is worth quoting at length.

From the fact that we are able to delimit Duration and Quantity as we please, conceiving quantity in abstraction from Substance and separating the efflux of duration from things eternal, there arise Time and Measure: Time to delimit Duration and Measure to delimit Quantity in such wise as enables us to imagine them easily, as far as possible. Again, from the fact we separate the affections of substance from substance itself, and arrange them in classes so that can easily imagine them as far as possible, there arises Number, whereby we delimit them. Hence it can be seen clearly that measure, Time and Number are nothing other than modes of thinking, or rather, modes of imagining. It is therefore not surprising that all who have attempted to understand the workings of nature by such concepts, and furthermore without really understanding these concepts, have tied themselves into such extraordinary knots that in the end they have been unable to extricate themselves except by breaking through everything and perpetrating the grossest absurdities.(Letter 12, to Meyer).

As if to emphasize that he is speaking not just of the understanding of nature as substance (natura naturans), but also of the passive nature of the existing finite modes (natura naturata), Spinoza cites the troubles one gets into as soon as one attempts to conceive duration through the abstraction of time. The eternity of the attributes and active nature is to be contrasted with the duration of existing modes. Yet to attempt to understand the duration of modes through the abstraction Time, and by implication, to try to understand the spatial extension of modes through Measure and Number, is to employ aids to the imagination only, and inevitably leads not to understanding, but to absurdities.[11] We must conclude that Spinoza's views of Measure, Time and Number confound the easy impression that he thought that the variety in matter could be accounted for by motion and rest considered as numerical quantities. Even if we could satisfy Gabbey's demand for a “mathematical account of … proportions of motion and rest and of the measures of motion and rest from which they are formed”, that would not meet Spinoza's own demands for the intellectual understanding of the nature and existence of bodies.

We saw earlier that there are grounds, though hardly conclusive, for supposing that Spinoza held a fundamental metaphysical view of physical nature that is akin to the contemporary view of the physical world as composed of fields of force, with bodies in some sense being constituted by relatively stable patterns, relative to our own, of force. However, Spinoza's hostility to observation as a source of knowledge, his view that experimentation can at best provide examples of what we know through reason, and his rejection of the idea that physical nature is to be known through number and measurable quantities, suggests that his convergence with contemporary physical science goes no farther than this possible anticipation of the theory of fields as fundamental.

7. Conclusion

It is far from clear that any thorough and consistent account of Spinoza's physical theory can be found. He says too little that is focused and direct, and the various partial and indirect discussions of such fundamental topics as inertia and the individuation of bodies are individually underdeveloped and problematic, as well as in prima facie tension with one another. A few general interpretive strategies present themselves.We might take both his claim that all determinations of extended modes of substance are extrinsically caused by other finite modes and his talk of essence and conatus seriously. On such a reading, Spinoza tried to develop an ecumenical account of bodies that both conformed to the mechanical principles of the Cartesian view and preserved the sense that bodies are centers of real activity; but his entitlement to that sense is hard to square with mechanism, and only dubiously earned through the appeal to essences. We might, on the other hand, focus on either of the two aspects of Spinoza's thinking about the physical, downplaying the other. Focusing on conatus and essence might enable us to take the latter, properly ethical and psychological half of the Ethics at face value, but only at the cost of being debarred from seeing how it fits with the mechanical view of the physical world, and those field metaphysical refinements of it that form the basis of modern physics. Focusing on the idea of wholly extrinsic modal determinatism, we will see Spinoza as a visionary thinker whose physical theory both anticipates and provides a metaphysical basis for contemporary physical views, albeit without their central experimental and perhaps quantitative dimensions; but then the ethical and psychological half of Spinoza's thought, depending as it does on the idea that individuals, including bodies, are centers of active striving, proper to themselves, is cut adrift. Or we might take each aspect seriously for what they are worth in their own domains, seeing Spinoza as both a visionary thinker about the physical and a subtle and original theorist of the psychological, but one whose doctrines cannot be squared with each other, or with the sort of naturalism that sees the acting subject as fitting seamlessly into physical nature. But in any of these cases, we lose the unity of Spinoza's thought, which was clearly of vital importance to him.

In retrospect, Spinoza's view of physical nature appears as an unstable hybrid, perhaps even incoherent. But it of great interest as a testimony to the striking originality of its author and to the unsettled state of play in the open field that was mid-17th century natural philosophy.

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Other Internet Resources

  • Benedict De Spinoza, entry by Blake Dutton (Loyola University of Chicago) in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

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