Supplement to Supervenience

Appendix: List of Definitions

For ease of reference, the technical definitions discussed in earlier sections are collected in this section. ‘A’ and ‘B’ should be understood as variables ranging over non-empty sets of properties (though the quantification is typically implicit).

Individual Supervenience
Weak Individual Supervenience
Possible-Worlds Formulation: A weakly supervenes on B iff for any possible world w and any individuals x and y in w, if x and y are B-indiscernible in w, then they are A-indiscernible in w.

Modal Operator Formulation: A weakly supervenes on B iff necessarily, if anything x has some property F in A, then there is at least one property G in B such that x has G, and everything that has G has F.

□∀xFA[Fx → ∃GB(Gx & ∀y(GyFy))]

Strong Individual Supervenience
Possible-Worlds Formulation: A strongly supervenes on B iff for any possible worlds w1 and w2 and any individuals x in w1 and y in w2, if x in w1 is B-indiscernible from y in w2, then x in w1 is A-indiscernible from y in w2.

Modal Operator Formulation: A strongly supervenes on B iff necessarily, if anything x has some property F in A, then there is at least one property G in B such x has G, and necessarily everything that has G has F.

□∀xFA[Fx → ∃GB(Gx & □∀y(GyFy))]
Regional Supervenience
Weak: A weak-regionally supervenes on B iff for any possible world w and any space-time regions r1 and r2 in w, if r1 and r2 are exactly alike in every intrinsic B-respect in w, then they are exactly alike in every intrinsic A-respect in w.

Strong: A strong-regionally supervenes on B iff for any possible worlds w1 and w2 and any space-time regions r1 in w1 and spacetime region r2 in w2, if r1 in w1 is exactly like r2 in w2 in every intrinsic B-respect, then r1 in w1 is exactly like r2 in w2 in every intrinsic A-respect.

Similarity-Based Supervenience
Weak Similarity-Based: A weakly supervenes on B iff for any world w, and for any x and y in w, if x and y are not largely different with respect to B-properties, then they are not largely different with respect to A-properties.

Strong Similarity-Based: A strongly supervenes on B iff for any worlds w1 and w2, and for any x in w1 and y in w2, if x in w1 is not largely different from y in w2 with respect to B-properties, then x in w1 is not largely different from y in w2 with respect to A-properties.

Global Supervenience
Generic Global: A globally supervenes on B iff for any worlds w1 and w2, if w1 and w2 have exactly the same world-wide pattern of distribution of B-properties, then they have exactly the same world-wide pattern of distribution of A-properties.

Weak Global: A weakly globally supervenes on B iff for any worlds w1 and w2, if there is a B-preserving isomorphism between w1 and w2, then there is an A-preserving isomorphism between them.

Intermediate Global: A intermediately globally supervenes on B iff for any worlds w1 and w2, if there is a B-preserving isomorphism between w1 and w2, then there is an A-and-B-preserving isomorphism between w1 and w2.

Strong Global: A strongly globally supervenes on B iff for any worlds w1 and w2, every B-preserving isomorphism between w1 and w2 is an A-preserving isomorphism between them.

Multiple Domain Supervenience
Weak Multiple Domain: A weakly supervenes on B relative to relation R just in for any world w and any x and y in w, if R|x in w is B-indiscernible from R|y in w, then x and y are A-indiscernible in w.

Strong Multiple Domain: A strongly supervenes on B relative to relation R just in case for any worlds w1 and w2, any x in w1 and y in w2, if R|x in w1 is B-indiscernible from R|y in w2, x in w1 is A-indiscernible from y in w2.

Weak Coincident-Friendly: For any world w and any x and y in w, if x in w is B-indiscernible from y in w, then for each thing x* in w to which x is R-related, there is something y* in w to which y is R-related, and which is A-indiscernible from x*.

Strong Coincident-Friendly: For all x and y, and all worlds w1 and w2, if x in w1 is B-indiscernible from y in w2, then for each thing x* in w1 to which x is R-related, there is something y* in w2 to which y is R-related, and which is A-indiscernible from x*.

Return to main entry

Copyright © 2011 by
Brian McLaughlin <brianmc@rci.rutgers.edu>
Karen Bennett <kb383@cornell.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free


The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007. Readers who have benefited from the SEP are encouraged to examine the NEH’s anniversary page and, if inspired to do so, send a testimonial to neh50@neh.gov.