Notes to Alfred Tarski

1. Hodges (1985/6) claims that no notion defined by Tarski in the monograph on truth possesses all the crucial features of the notion of truth in a structure, and thus that this notion is not really defined by Tarski at this time. (See also Milne 1999. Gómez-Torrente 2001 contains a critique of Hodges’s claim.)

2. The claim that in the 1936 paper Tarski is primarily thinking of languages with the conventions of LAr is controversial. It is defended in Gómez-Torrente (1996), (2009) and disputed e.g. in Mancosu (2006), (2010). According to Mancosu, Tarski is paradigmatically thinking of languages like LAr*: LAr* is like LAr except that quantifications need not be relativized to “N”, and the range of the variables is the set of all individuals of some underlying type theory. See the next footnote.

3. A very similar definition can be given for languages like LAr* (see the preceding footnote): an interpretation <A, a, R> of LAr* satisfies the formula function X with respect to a sequence f (that assigns arbitrary values from the set of individuals of an underlying type theory to the original variables of LAr*) if and only if:

(a) (i) X is Pxn (for some n) and f(xn)∈A; or X is Py and aA; or

   (ii) X is Yxnxm (for some m and n) and <f(xn),f(xm)>∈R; or X is Yyxn (for some n) and <a,f(xn)>∈R; or X is Yxny (for some n) and <f(xn),a>∈R; or X is Yyy and <a,a>∈R; or

(b) there is a formula function Y such that X is ¬Y and <A, a, R> does not satisfy Y with respect to sequence f; or

(c) there are formula functions Y and Z such that X is (YZ) and either <A, a, R> does not satisfy Y with respect to sequence f or <A, a, R> satisfies Z with respect to sequence f; or, finally,

(d) there is a formula function Z and a number n such that X is ∀xnZ and every sequence g that assigns arbitrary values to the (original) variables of LAr and that differs from f at most in what it assigns to xn is such that <A, a, R> satisfies Z with respect to g.

Copyright © 2011 by
Mario Gómez-Torrente <mariogt@unam.mx>

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