Toleration

First published Fri Feb 23, 2007; substantive revision Fri May 4, 2012

The term “toleration”—from the Latin tolerare: to put up with, countenance or suffer—generally refers to the conditional acceptance of or non-interference with beliefs, actions or practices that one considers to be wrong but still “tolerable,” such that they should not be prohibited or constrained. There are many contexts in which we speak of a person or an institution as being tolerant: parents tolerate certain behavior of their children, a friend tolerates the weaknesses of another, a monarch tolerates dissent, a church tolerates homosexuality, a state tolerates a minority religion, a society tolerates deviant behavior. Thus for any analysis of the motives and reasons for toleration, the relevant contexts need to be taken into account.

1. The Concept of Toleration and its Paradoxes

It is necessary to differentiate between a general concept and more specific conceptions of toleration (see also Forst 2003, 2012b). The former is marked by the following characteristics. First, it is essential for the concept of toleration that the tolerated beliefs or practices are considered to be objectionable and in an important sense wrong or bad. If this objection component (cf. King 1976, 44–54 on the components of toleration) is missing, we do not speak of “toleration” but of “indifference” or “affirmation.” Second, the objection component needs to be balanced by an acceptance component, which does not remove the negative judgment but gives certain positive reasons that trump the negative ones in the relevant context. In light of these reasons, it would be wrong not to tolerate what is wrong, to mention a well-known paradox of toleration (discussed below). The said practices or beliefs are wrong, but not intolerably wrong. Third, the limits of toleration need to be specified. They lie at the point where there are reasons for rejection that are stronger than the reasons for acceptance (which still leaves open the question of the appropriate means of a possible intervention); call this the rejection component. All three of those reasons can be of one and the same kind—religious, for example—yet they can also be of diverse kinds (moral, religious, pragmatic, to mention a few possibilities; cf. Newey 1999, 32–34).

Furthermore, it needs to be stressed that there are two boundaries involved in this interpretation of the concept of toleration: the first one lies between (1) the normative realm of those practices and beliefs one agrees with and (2) the realm of the practices and beliefs that one finds wrong but can still tolerate; the second boundary lies between this latter realm and (3) the realm of the intolerable that is strictly rejected. There are thus three, not just two normative realms in a context of toleration.

Finally, one can only speak of toleration where it is practiced voluntarily and is not compelled, for otherwise it would be a case of simply “suffering” or “enduring” certain things that one rejects but against which one is powerless. It is, however, wrong to conclude from this that the tolerant need to be in a position to effectively prohibit or interfere with the tolerated practices, for a minority that does not have this power may very well be tolerant in holding the view that if it had such power, it would not use it to suppress other parties (cf. Williams 1996).

Based on these characteristics, we can identify three paradoxes of toleration that are much discussed in philosophical analyses of the concept, and each one refers to one of the components mentioned above. First, there is the paradox of the tolerant racist, which concerns the objection component. Sometimes people argue that someone who believes that there are “inferior races” the members of which do not deserve equal respect should be “more tolerant.” Thus the racist would be called tolerant if he curbed his desire to discriminate against the members of such groups, say, for strategic reasons. Thus if (and only if) we considered tolerance to be a moral virtue, the paradox arises that an immoral attitude (to think of other “races” in such way) would be turned into a virtue. What is more, the racist would be more “tolerant” the stronger his racist impulses are if only he did not act on them (cf. Horton 1996). Hence, seen from a moral perspective, the demand that the racist should be tolerant has a major flaw: it takes the racist objection against others as an ethical objection that only needs to be restrained by adding certain reasons for acceptance. It thus turns an unacceptable prejudice into an ethical judgment. From this it follows that the reasons for objection must be reasonable in a minimal sense; they cannot be generally shareable, of course, but they must also not rest on irrational prejudice and hatred. The racist, therefore, can neither exemplify the virtue of tolerance nor should he be asked to be tolerant; what is necessary is that he overcome his racist beliefs. This shows that there are cases in which tolerance is not the solution to intolerance.

Second, we encounter the paradox of moral tolerance, which arises in connection with the acceptance component (for various analyses of this paradox, see Ebbinghaus 1950, Raphael 1988, Mendus 1989, Horton 1994). If both the reasons for objection and the reasons for acceptance are called “moral,” the paradox arises that it seems to be morally right or even morally required to tolerate what is morally wrong. The solution of this paradox therefore requires a distinction between various kinds of “moral” reasons, some of which must be reasons of a higher order that ground and limit toleration.

Third, there is the paradox of drawing the limits, which concerns the rejection component. This paradox is inherent in the idea that toleration is a matter of reciprocity and that therefore those who are intolerant need not and cannot be tolerated, an idea we find in most of the classical texts on toleration. But even a brief look at those texts, and even more so at historical practice, shows that the slogan “no toleration of the intolerant” is not just vacuous but potentially dangerous, for the characterization of certain groups as intolerant is all too often itself a result of one-sidedness and intolerance (cf. Forst 2004). In a deconstructivist reading, this leads to a fatal conclusion for the concept of toleration (cf. Fish 1997): If toleration always implies a drawing of the limits against the intolerant and intolerable, and if every such drawing of a limit is itself a (more or less) intolerant, arbitrary act, toleration ends as soon it begins—as soon as it is defined by an arbitrary boundary between “us” and the “intolerant” and “intolerable.” This paradox can only be overcome if we distinguish between two notions of “intolerance” that the deconstructivist critique conflates: the intolerance of those who lie beyond the limits of toleration because they deny toleration as a norm in the first place, and the lack of tolerance of those who do not want to tolerate a denial of the norm. Tolerance can only be a virtue if this distinction can be made, and it presupposes that the limits of toleration can be drawn in a non-arbitrary, justifiable way.

The discussion so far implies that toleration is a normatively dependent concept. This means that by itself it cannot provide the substantive reasons for objection, acceptance, and rejection. It needs further, independent normative resources in order to have a certain substance, content, and limits—and in order to be regarded as something good at all. In itself, therefore, toleration is not a virtue or value; it can only be a value if backed by the right normative reasons.

2. Four Conceptions of Toleration

The following discussion of four conceptions of toleration is not to be understood as the reconstruction of a linear historical succession. Rather, these are different, historically developed understandings of what toleration consists in that can all be present in society at the same time, so that conflicts about the meaning of toleration may also be understood as conflicts between these conceptions.

1. The first one I call the permission conception. According to it, toleration is a relation between an authority or a majority and a dissenting, “different” minority (or various minorities). Toleration then means that the authority gives qualified permission to the minority to live according to their beliefs on condition that the minority accepts the dominant position of the authority or majority. So long as their being different remains within certain limits, that is, in the “private” realm, and so long as the minority groups do not claim equal public and political status, they can be tolerated on pragmatic or principled grounds—on pragmatic grounds because this form of toleration is the least costly of all possible alternatives and does not disturb civil peace and order as the dominant party defines it (but rather contributes to it); and on principled grounds because one may think it is morally problematic (and in any case fruitless) to force people to give up certain deep-seated beliefs or practices.

The permission conception is a classic one that we find in many historical writings and in instances of a politics of toleration (such as the Edict of Nantes in 1598) and that—to a considerable extent—still informs our understanding of the term. According to this conception, toleration means that the authority or majority, which has the power to interfere with the practices of a minority, nevertheless “tolerates” it, while the minority accepts its inferior position. The situation or the “terms of toleration” are hierarchical: one party allows another party certain things on conditions specified by the first one. Toleration is thus understood as permissio negativa mali: not interfering with something that is actually wrong but not “intolerably” harmful. It is this conception that Goethe (1829, 507, transl. R.F.) had in mind when he said: “Tolerance should be a temporary attitude only: it must lead to recognition. To tolerate means to insult.”

2. The second conception, the coexistence conception, is similar to the first one in regarding toleration as the best means toward ending or avoiding conflict and toward pursuing one's own goals. What is different, however, is the relationship between the subjects and the objects of toleration. For now the situation is not one of an authority or majority in relation to a minority, but one of groups that are roughly equal in power, and who see that for the sake of social peace and the pursuit of their own interests mutual toleration is the best of all possible alternatives (the Augsburg Peace Treaty of 1555 is a historical example). They prefer peaceful coexistence to conflict and agree to a reciprocal compromise, to a certain modus vivendi. The relation of tolerance is no longer vertical but horizontal: the subjects are at the same time the objects of toleration. This may not lead to a stable social situation in which trust can develop, for once the constellation of power changes, the more powerful group may no longer see any reasons for being tolerant (cf. Rawls 1987, 11, Fletcher 1996).

3. Different from this, the third conception of toleration—the respect conception—is one in which the tolerating parties respect one another in a more reciprocal sense (cf. Weale 1985, Scanlon 1996). Even though they differ fundamentally in their ethical beliefs about the good and true way of life and in their cultural practices, citizens recognize one another as moral-political equals in the sense that their common framework of social life should—as far as fundamental questions of rights and liberties and the distribution of resources are concerned—be guided by norms that all parties can equally accept and that do not favor one specific ethical or cultural community (cf. Forst 2002, ch. 2).

There are two models of the “respect conception,” that of “formal equality,” and that of “qualitative equality.” The former operates on a strict distinction between the political and the private realm, according to which ethical (i.e., cultural or religious) differences among citizens of a legal state should be confined to the private realm, so that they do not lead to conflicts in the political sphere. This version is clearly exhibited in the “secular republicanism” of the French authorities who held that headscarves with a religious meaning have no place in public schools in which children are educated to be autonomous citizens (cf. Galeotti 1993).

The model of “qualitative equality,” on the other hand, recognizes that certain forms of formal equality favor those ethical-cultural life-forms whose beliefs and practices make it easier to accommodate a conventional public/private distinction. In other words, the “formal equality” model tends to be intolerant toward ethical-cultural forms of life that require a public presence that is different from traditional and hitherto dominant cultural forms. Thus, on the “qualitative equality” model, persons respect each other as political equals with a certain distinct ethical-cultural identity that needs to be respected and tolerated as something that is (a) especially important for a person and (b) can provide good reasons for certain exceptions from or general changes in existing legal and social structures. Social and political equality and integration are thus seen to be compatible with cultural difference—within certain (moral) limits of reciprocity.

4. In discussions of toleration, one finds alongside the conceptions mentioned thus far a fourth one which I call the esteem conception. This implies an even fuller, more demanding notion of mutual recognition between citizens than the respect conception does. Here, being tolerant does not just mean respecting members of other cultural life-forms or religions as moral and political equals, it also means having some kind of ethical esteem for their beliefs, that is, taking them to be ethically valuable conceptions that—even though different from one's own—are in some way ethically attractive and held with good reasons. For this still to be a case of toleration, the kind of esteem characteristic of these relations is something like “reserved esteem,” that is, a kind of positive acceptance of a belief that for some reason you still find is not as attractive as the one you hold. As valuable as parts of the tolerated belief may be, it also has other parts that you find misguided, or wrong (cf. Raz 1988, Sandel 1989).

To answer the question which of these conceptions should be the guiding one for a given society, two aspects are most important. The first one requires an assessment of the conflicts that require and allow for toleration, given the history and character of the groups involved; and the second requires an adequate and convincing normative justification of toleration in a given social context. It is important to keep in mind that the (normatively dependent) concept of toleration itself does not provide such a justification; this has to come from other normative resources. And the list of such resources, speaking both historically and systematically, is long.

3. The History of Toleration

In the course of the religious-political conflicts throughout Europe that followed the Reformation, toleration became one of the central concepts of political-philosophical discourse, yet its history reaches much further back into antiquity (for the following, see esp. Forst 2012b, part 1; cf. also Besier and Schreiner 1990, Zagorin 2003 and Kaplan 2007). In stoic writings, especially in Cicero, tolerantia is used as a term for a virtue of endurance, of suffering bad luck, pain and injustice of various kinds in a proper, steadfast manner. But already in early Christian discourse, the term is applied to the challenge of coping with religious difference and conflict. The works of Tertullian and Cyprianus are most important in that respect.

Within the Christian framework, a number of arguments for toleration have been developed, based on charity and love for those who err, for example, or on the idea of the two kingdoms and of limited human authority in matters of religious truth, i.e., in matters of the divine kingdom. The most important and far-reaching justification of toleration, however, is the principle credere non potest nisi volens, which holds that only faith based on inner conviction is pleasing to God, and that such faith has to develop from within, without external compulsion. Conscience therefore must not be and cannot be forced to adopt a certain faith, even if it were the true one. Yet, Augustine who defends these arguments in his earlier writings, later (when confronted with the danger of a schism between Roman Catholics and the so-called Donatists) came to the conclusion that the same reasons of love, of the two kingdoms and of the freedom of conscience could also make intolerance and the use of force into a Christian duty, if it were the only way to save the soul of another (esp. Augustine 408, letter # 93). He cites numerous examples of reconverted Catholics to substantiate his position that the proper use of force combined with the right teaching can shake men loose from the wrong faith and open up their eyes so as to accept the truth—still “from within.” Accordingly, individual conscience can and sometimes must be subjected to force. Christian arguments thus both form the core of many modern justifications of toleration and yet are janus-faced, always bound by the superior aim to serve the true faith. Similar to Augustine, Thomas Aquinas later developed a number of reasons for limited and conditional toleration, drawing especially strong limits against tolerating any form of heresy.

The question of peaceful coexistence of different faiths—Christian, Jewish and Muslim—was much discussed in the Middle Ages, especially in the 12th century. Abailard and Raimundus Lullus wrote inter-religious dialogues searching for ways of defending the truth of Christian faith while also seeing some truth—religious or at least ethical—in other religions. In Judaism and Islam, this was mirrored by writers such as Maimonides or Ibn Rushd (Averroes), whose defense of philosophical truth-searching against religious dogma is arguably the most innovative of the period (see esp. Averroes 1180).

Nicolas of Cusa's De Pace Fidei (1453) marks an important step towards a more comprehensive, Christian-humanist conception of toleration, though in the conversations among representatives of different faiths his core idea of “one religion in various rites” remains a Catholic one. Still, the search for common elements is a central, increasingly important topic in toleration discourses. This is much further developed in Erasmus of Rotterdam's humanist idea of a possible religious unity based on a reduced core faith, trying to avoid religious strife about what Erasmus saw as non-essential questions of faith (adiaphora).

In contrast with this “irenic” humanist approach, Luther defended the protestant idea of the individual conscience bound only to the word of God, which marks the limits of the authority of the church as well as of the secular powers of the state (Luther 1523). The traditional arguments of free conscience and of the two kingdoms were radicalized in this period. The protestant humanist Sebastian Castellio (1554) attacks the intolerance of both Catholic and Calvinist practices and argues for the freedom of conscience and reason as prerequisites of true faith. In this period, decisive elements of early modern toleration discourse were formed: the distinction between church authority and individual religious conscience on the one hand and the separation of religious and secular authority on the other.

Jean Bodin's work is important for the further development of modern ideas of toleration in two ways. In his Six Books of a Commonweal (1576), he develops a purely political justification of toleration, following the thought of the so-called Politiques, whose main concern was the stability of the state. For them, the preservation of political sovereignty took primacy over the preservation of religious unity, and toleration was recommended as a superior policy in a situation of religious plurality and strife. This, however, does not amount to the (late modern) idea of a fully secular state with general religious liberty. More radical still is Bodin's religious-philosophical work on the Colloquium of the Seven (1593), a discourse among representatives of different faiths who disagree about fundamental religious and metaphysical issues. For the first time in the tradition of religious discourse, in Bodin's work there is no dominant position, no obvious winner or losers. The agreement that the participants in the conversation find is based on respect for the others and on the insight that religious differences, even though they can be meaningfully discussed, cannot be resolved in a philosophical discourse by means of reason alone. Religious plurality is seen here as an enduring predicament of finite and historically situated human beings, not as a state to be overcome by the victory of the one and only true faith.

Marked by bitter religious conflicts, the 17th century brought forth a number of toleration theories, among them three paradigmatic classics: Baruch de Spinoza's Tractatus Theologico-Politicus (1670), Pierre Bayle's Commentaire Philosophique (1686) and John Locke's A Letter Concerning Toleration (1689). In his historical critique of biblical religions Spinoza locates their core in the virtues of justice and love and separates it from both contested religious dogmas and from the philosophical search for truth. The state has the task of realizing peace and justice, thus it has the right to regulate the external exercise of religion. The natural right to freedom of thought and judgment and to “inner” religion cannot, however, be entrusted to the state; here political authority finds the factual limits of its power.

Bayle's Commentaire is the most comprehensive attempt to refute the arguments for the duty of intolerance that go back to Augustine (and especially his interpretation of the parable “compel them to come in,” where the master orders his servants to force those who were invited to the prepared supper but did not attend to come in; see Luke 14, 15ff.). In his elaborate argument against the use of force in matters of religion, Bayle does not primarily take recourse to the idea that religious conscience must not and cannot be forced, for he was aware of the powerful Augustinian arguments against both points (cf. Forst 2008 and Kilcullen 1988). Rather, Bayle argued that there is a “natural light” of practical reason revealing certain moral truths to every sincere person, regardless of his or her faith, even including atheists. And such principles of moral respect and of reciprocity cannot be trumped by religious truths, according to Bayle, for reasonable religious faith is aware that ultimately it is based on personal faith and trust, not on apprehensions of objective truth. This has often been seen as a skeptical argument, yet this is not what Bayle intended; what he suggested, rather, was that the truths of religion are of a different epistemological character than truths arrived at by the use of reason alone. Connecting moral and epistemological arguments in this way, Bayle was the first thinker to try to develop a universally valid argument for toleration, one that implied universal toleration of persons of different faiths as well as of those seen as lacking any faith.

In important respects, this is a more radical theory than the (much more popular and influential) one developed by Locke, who distinguishes between state and church in an early liberal perspective of natural individual rights. While it is the duty of the state to secure the “civil interests” of its citizens, the “care of the soul” cannot be its business, this being a matter between the individual and God to whom alone one is responsible in this regard. Hence there is a God-given, inalienable right to the free exercise of religion. Churches are no more than voluntary associations without any right to use force within a legitimate political order based on the consent of the governed. Locke draws the limits of toleration where a religion does not accept its proper place in civil society (such as Catholicism, in Locke's eyes) as well as where atheists deny any higher moral authority and therefore destroy the basis of social order.

In the 18th century, the conception of a secular state with an independent basis of authority and the distinction between the roles of citizen and believer in a certain faith were further developed, even though Locke's thought that a stable political order did require some common religious basis persisted (with a few exceptions, such as the French materialists). In the course of the American and the French Revolutions a basic “natural” right to religious liberty was recognized, even though the interpretations of what kind of religious dissent could be tolerated differed.

Thinkers of the French Enlightenment argued for toleration on various grounds and, as in Bodin, there was a difference between a focus on political stability and a focus on religious coexistence. In his On the Spirit of the Laws (1748), Montesquieu argues for the toleration of different religions for the purpose of preserving political unity and peace, yet he warns that there is a limit to the acceptance of new religions or changes to the dominant one, given the connection between a constitution and the morality and habits of a people. In his Persian Letters (1721), however, he had developed a more comprehensive theory of religious pluralism. The difference between the two perspectives—political and inter-religious—is even more notable in Jean-Jacques Rousseau's writings. In his Social Contract (1762), he tries to overcome religious strife and intolerance by institutionalizing a “civic religion” that must be shared by all, while in his Emile (1762) he argues for the primacy of individual conscience as well as for the aim of a non-dogmatic “natural religion.”

The idea of a “religion of reason” as an alternative to established religions for the sake of overcoming the quarrels between them was typical for the Enlightenment, and is found in thinkers such as Voltaire, Diderot and Kant. In his parable of the rings (which goes back to medieval precursors) in the play Nathan the Wise (1779), G. E. Lessing offers a powerful image for the peaceful competition of established religions that both underlines their common ancestry as well as their differences due to multiple historical traditions of faith. Since there is no objective proof as to their truth for the time being, they are called upon to deliver such proof by acting morally and harmoniously until the end of time.

John Stuart Mill's On Liberty (1859) marks the transition to a modern conception of toleration, one that is no longer occupied with the question of religious harmony and does not restrict the issue of toleration to religious differences. In Mill's eyes, in modern society toleration is also required to cope with other forms of irreconcilable cultural, social and political plurality. Mill offers three main arguments for toleration. According to his “harm principle,” the exercise of political or social power is only legitimate if necessary to prevent serious harm done to one person by another, not to enforce some idea of the good in a paternalistic manner. Toleration towards opinions is justified by the utilitarian consideration that not just true, but also false opinions lead to productive social learning processes. Finally, toleration towards unusual “experiments of living” is justified in a romantic way (following Wilhelm von Humboldt), stressing the values of individuality and originality.

The story of toleration would have to be continued after Mill up to the present, yet this short overview might suffice to draw attention to the long and complex history of the concept and to the many forms it took as well as the different justifications offered for it. Seen historically, toleration has been many things: An exercise of love for the other who errs, a strategy of preserving power by offering some form of freedom to minorities, a term for the peaceful coexistence of different faiths who share a common core, another word for individual liberty, a postulate of practical reason, or the ethical promise of a productive pluralistic society.

4. Justifying Toleration

Many of the systematic arguments for toleration—be they religious, pragmatic, moral or epistemological—can be used as a justification for more than one of the conceptions of toleration mentioned above (section 2). The classic argument for freedom of conscience, for example, has been used to justify arrangements according to the “permission conception” as well as the “respect conception.” Generally speaking, relations of toleration are hierarchically ordered according to the first conception, quite unstable according to the conception of “coexistence,” while the “esteem conception” is the most demanding in terms of the kind of mutual appreciation between the tolerating parties. In each case, the limits of toleration seem either arbitrary or too narrow, as in the esteem conception, which only allows toleration of those beliefs and practices that can be ethically valued.

Accordingly, in current philosophical discussions of toleration in multicultural, modern societies, the “respect conception” is often seen as the most appropriate and promising. Yet in these discussions, toleration as “respect” can be justified in different ways. An ethical-liberal, neo-Lockean justification argues that respect is owed to individuals as personally and ethically autonomous beings with the capacity to choose, possibly revise and realize an individual conception of the good. This capacity is to be respected and furthered because it is seen as a necessary (though not sufficient) condition for attaining the good life (cf. Kymlicka 1995). Hence the argument presupposes a specific thesis about the good life—i.e., that only an autonomously chosen way of life can be a good life—which can, however, reasonably be questioned. One may doubt whether such a way of life will necessarily be subjectively more fulfilling or objectively more valuable than one adopted in a more traditional way, without the presence of a range of options to choose from. Apart from that, the ethical-liberal theory could lead to a perfectionist justification of policies designed to further individual autonomy that could have a paternalistic character and lack toleration for non-liberal ways of life. In other words, there is the danger of an insufficient distinction between the components of objection and rejection mentioned above (section 1).

Thus, an alternative, neo-Baylean justification of the respect conception seeks to avoid a particular conception of the good life, relying instead on the discursive principle of justification which says that every norm that is to be binding for a plurality of persons, especially norms that are the basis of legal coercion, must be justifiable with reasons that are reciprocally acceptable to all affected as free and equal persons. Such persons have a basic “right to justification” (Forst 2012a) which gives them the power to reject one-sided ethical or religious justifications for general norms. For a complete argument for toleration, however, this normative component has to be accompanied by an epistemological component which says that ethical or religious reasons, if reciprocally contested, cannot be sufficient to justify the exercise of force, since their validation depends on a particular faith that can reasonably be rejected by others who do not share it; its validity reaches into a realm “beyond reason,” as Bayle said (see also similar arguments by Rawls 1993, ch. 2, and Larmore 1996, ch. 7). Thus toleration consists of the insight that reasons of ethical objection, even if deeply held, cannot be valid as general reasons of rejection so long as they are reciprocally rejectable as belonging to a conception of the good or true way of life that is not and need not be shareable. While such a distinction between ethical reasons for objection and stronger, morally justifiable reasons for rejection tries to overcome the “paradox of moral tolerance” (see section 1 above), the “paradox of drawing the limits” would be solved by seeing as tolerable all such views or practices that do not violate the principle of justification itself (see Forst 2012b).

With such a reflexive turn in the debate about toleration, a number of questions arise as to the alleged superior validity of the principle of justification and the plausibility of a neo-Baylean epistemology distinguishing between faith and knowledge. Can there be an impartial justification that is not in the same way a “party” to the contest of ethical truths and world-views? Might there be the possibility, using a phrase John Rawls (1993) coined in the context of his theory of justice, of a “tolerant” theory of toleration that is at the same time substantive enough to ground and limit toleration?

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Rainer Forst <forst@em.uni-frankfurt.de>

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