Notes to Medieval Theories of Transcendentals

1. The ascription of a doctrine of the transcendentals to Ibn Sina is a matter of controversy. For such an ascription argues Koutzarova 2009; against it Aertsen 2012, 99-110.

2. At the background of the introduction of the doctrine of the transcendentals in the first half of the 13th century is the controversy with the Cathars, who defended a manichean dualism which is negated by the thesis of the convertibility of being and the good. Cf. Aertsen 2012, 112, for scholarly literature.

3. Readers interested in the latter are referred to Aertsen 2012.

4. John Duns Scotus, Ordinatio I, dist. 8, p. 1, q. 3, n. 114 (ed. Comm. Scot., vol. 4, p. 206): “Unde de ratione transcendentis est non habere praedicatum supraveniens nisi ens, sed quod ipsum sit commune ad multa inferiora, hoc accidit.”

5. Whereas the transcendental notions differ by a distinction that is not merely conceptual, yet must allow for their real identity, i.e. the formal distinction, the disjunctive transcendental properties share the same formal character, f.i. of being, of which they indicate a different degree of intensity each, i.e. a proper mode – hence, a modal distinction.

6. For the sake of completeness: The first object in the order of the generation of confused knowledge is the species specialissima, or the concept of being, in the case of the generation of distinct knowledge. As first objects in the order of perfection Duns Scotus mentions God, the species specialissimae, and what is most proximate to the senses.

7. On the supertranscendental in the early 14th century, cf. Kobusch 1996; Folger-Fonfara 2008; Mandrella 2008 & 2010; Aertsen 2012, 635-56.

Copyright © 2013 by
Wouter Goris <>
Jan Aertsen

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