# The Revision Theory of Truth

*First published Fri Dec 15, 1995; substantive revision Tue Jun 2, 2015*

Consider the following sentence:

(1) is not true. (1)

It has long been known that the sentence, (1), produces a paradox, the
so-called *liar's paradox*: it seems impossible consistently to
maintain that (1) is true, and impossible consistently to maintain
that (1) is not true: if (1) is true, then (1) says, truly, that (1)
is not true so that (1) is not true; on the other hand, if (1) is not
true, then what (1) says is the case, i.e., (1) is true. (For details,
see Section 1, below.) Given such a paradox, one might be sceptical of
the notion of truth, or at least of the prospects of giving a
scientifically respectable account of truth.

Alfred Tarski's great accomplishment was to show how to give —
contra this scepticism — a formal definition of truth for a wide
class of formalized languages. Tarski did *not*, however, show
how to give a definition of truth for languages (such as
English) *that contain their own truth predicates*. He thought
that this could not be done, precisely because of the liar's
paradox. More generally, Tarski reckoned that *any* language
with its own truth predicate would be inconsistent, as long as it
obeyed the rules of standard classical logic, and had the ability to
refer to its own sentences. As we will see in our remarks on Theorem
2.1 in Section 2.3, Tarski was not quite right: there are consistent
classical interpreted languages that refer to their own sentences and
have their own truth predicates. (This point originates in Gupta 1982
and is strengthened in Gupta and Belnap 1993.)

Given the close connection between *meaning* and
*truth*, it is widely held that any semantics for a language
*L*, i.e., any theory of meaning for *L*, will be
closely related to a theory of truth for *L*: indeed, it is
commonly held that something like a Tarskian theory of truth for
*L* will be a central part of a semantics for *L*. Thus,
the impossibility of giving a Tarskian theory of truth for languages
with their own truth predicates threatens the project of giving a
semantics for languages with their own truth predicates.

We had to wait until the work of Kripke 1975 and of Martin &
Woodruff 1975 for a systematic formal proposal of a semantics for
languages with their own truth predicates. The basic thought is
simple: take the offending sentences, such as (1), to be *neither
true nor false*. Kripke, in particular, shows how to implement
this thought for a wide variety of languages, in effect employing a
semantics with three values, *true*, *false* and
*neither*.^{[1]}
It is safe to
say that Kripkean approaches have replaced Tarskian pessimism as the
new orthodoxy concerning languages with their own truth
predicates.

One of the main rivals to the three-valued semantics is the Revision
Theory of Truth, or RTT, independently conceived by Hans Herzberger
and Anil Gupta, and first presented in publication in Herzberger 1982a
and 1982b, Gupta 1982 and Belnap 1982 — the first monographs on
the topic are Yaqūb 1993 and the *locus classicus*, Gupta
& Belnap 1993. The RTT is designed to model the kind of reasoning
that the liar sentence leads to, *within a two-valued
context*. (See Section 5.2 on the question of whether the RTT is
genuinely two-valued.) The central idea is the idea of a *revision
process*: a process by which we *revise* hypotheses about
the truth-value of one or more sentences. The present article's
purpose is to outline the Revision Theory of Truth. We proceed as
follows:

- 1. Semiformal introduction
- 2. Framing the problem
- 3. Basic notions of the RTT
- 4. Interpreting the formalism
- 5. Further issues
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Semiformal introduction

Let's take a closer look at the sentence (1), given above:

(1) is not true. (1)

It will be useful to make the paradoxical reasoning explicit. First, suppose that

(1) is not true. (2)

It seems an intuitive principle concerning truth that, for any
sentence *p*, we have the so-called T-biconditional

‘ p’ is true iffp.(3)

(Here we are using ‘iff’ as an abbreviation for ‘if and only if’.) In particular, we should have

‘(1) is not true’ is true iff (1) is not true. (4)

Thus, from (2) and (4), we get

‘(1) is not true’ is true. (5)

Then we can apply the identity,

(1) = ‘(1) is not true.’ (6)

to conclude that (1) is true. This all shows that if (1) is not true, then (1) is true. Similarly, we can also argue that if (1) is true then (1) is not true. So (1) seems to be both true and not true: hence the paradox. As stated above, the three-valued approach to the paradox takes the liar sentence, (1), to be neither true nor false. Exactly how, or even whether, this move blocks the above reasoning is a matter for debate.

The RTT is not designed to block reasoning of the above
kind, but to model it-or most of
it.^{[2]}
As stated above,
the central idea is the idea of a *revision process*: a process
by which we *revise* hypotheses about the truth-value of one or
more sentences.

Consider the reasoning regarding the liar sentence, (1)
above. Suppose that we *hypothesize* that (1) is not true. Then,
with an application of the relevant T-biconditional, we might revise
our hypothesis as follows:

Hypothesis: (1) is not true. T-biconditional: ‘(1) is not true’ is true iff (1) is not true. Therefore: ‘(1) is not true’ is true. Known identity: (1) = ‘(1) is not true’. Conclusion: (1) is true. New revisedhypothesis:(1) is true.

We could continue the revision process, by revising our hypothesis once again, as follows:

New hypothesis: (1) is true. T-biconditional: ‘(1) is not true’ is true iff (1) is not true. Therefore: ‘(1) is not true’ is not true. Known identity: (1) = ‘(1) is not true’. Conclusion: (1) is not true. Newnew revised hypothesis:(1) is not true.

As the revision process continues, we flip back and forth between taking the liar sentence to be true and not true.

Example 1.1

It is worth seeing how this kind of revision reasoning works in a case with several interconnected sentences. Let's apply the revision idea to the following three sentences:

(8) is true or (9) is true. (7) (7) is true. (8) (7) is not true. (9) Informally, we might reason as follows. Either (7) is true or (7) is not true. Thus, either (8) is true or (9) is true. Thus, (7) is true. Thus (8) is true and (9) is not true, and (7) is still true. Iterating the process once again, we get (8) is true, (9) is not true, and (7) is true. More formally, consider any initial hypothesis,

h_{0}, about the truth values of (7), (8) and (9). Eitherh_{0}says that (7) is true orh_{0}says that (7) is not true. In either case, we can use the T-biconditional to generate our revised hypothesish_{1}: ifh_{0}says that (7) is true, thenh_{1}says that ‘(7) is true’ is true, i.e. that (8) is true; and ifh_{0}says that (7) is not true, thenh_{1}says that ‘(7) is not true’ is true, i.e. that (9) is true. Soh_{1}says that either (8) is true or (9) is true. Soh_{2}says that ‘(8) is true or (9) is true’ is true. In other words,h_{2}says that (7) is true. So no matter what hypothesish_{0}we start with, two iterations of the revision process lead to a hypothesis that (7) is true. Similarly, threeor moreiterations of the revision process, lead to the hypothesis that (7) is true, (8) is true and (9) is not true — regardless of our initial hypothesis. In Section 3, we will reconsider this example in a more formal context.

One thing to note is that, in Example 1.1, the revision process
yields *stable* truth values for all three sentences. The
notion of a sentence *stably true in all revision sequences*
will be a central notion for the RTT. The revision-theoretic treatment
contrasts, in this case, with the three-valued approach: on most ways
of implementing the three-valued idea, all three sentences, (7), (8)
and (9), turn out to be neither true nor
false.^{[3]}
In this case, the
RTT arguably better captures the correct informal reasoning than does
the three-valued approach: the RTT assigns to the sentences (7), (8)
and (9) the truth-values that were assigned to them by the informal
reasoning given at the beginning of the example.

## 2. Framing the problem

### 2.1 Truth languages

The goal of the RTT is *not* to give a paradox-free account of
truth. Rather, the goal of the RTT is to give an account of our often
unstable and often paradoxical reasoning about truth. RTT seeks, more
specifically, to give a a two-valued account that assigns stable
classical truth values to sentences when intuitive reasoning would
assign stable classical truth values. We will present a formal
semantics for a formal language: we want that language to have both a
truth predicate and the resources to refer to its own sentences.

Let us consider a first-order language *L*, with connective
&, ∨, and ¬, quantifiers ∀ and ∃, the equals sign =,
variables, and some stock of names, function symbols and relation
symbols. We will say that *L* is a *truth language*, if
it has a distinguished predicate ** T** and
quotation marks ‘ and ’, which will be used to form

*quote names*: if

*A*is a sentence of

*L*, then ‘

*A*’ is a name. Let

*Sent*

_{L}= {

*A*:

*A*is a sentence of

*L*}.

It will be useful to identify the ** T**-free fragment of a truth language

*L*: the first-order language

*L*

^{−}that has the same names, function symbols and relation symbols as

*L*,

*except*the unary predicate

**. Since**

*T**L*

^{−}has the same names as

*L*, including the same quote names,

*L*

^{−}will have a quote name ‘

*A*’ for every sentence

*A*of

*L*. Thus ∀

*x*

*T**x*is not a sentence of

*L*

^{−}, but ‘∀

*x*

*T**x*’ is a name of

*L*

^{−}and ∀

*x*(

*x*= ‘∀

*x*

*T**x*’) is a sentence of

*L*

^{−}.

### 2.2 Ground models

Other than the truth predicate, we will assume that our language is interpreted classically. More precisely, let a *ground model* for *L* be a
classical model *M* = <*D*, *I* > for *L*^{−}, the ** T**-free fragment of

*L*, satisfying the following:

*D*is a nonempty domain of discourse;*I*is a function assigning- to each name of
*L*a member of*D*; - to each
*n*-ary function symbol of*L*a function from*D*^{n}to*D*; and - to each
*n*-ary relation symbol, other than, of*T**L*a function from*D*^{n}to one of the two truth-values in the set {**t**,**f**};^{[4]}

- to each name of
*Sent*_{L}∈*D*; and*I*(‘*A*’) =*A*for every*A*∈*Sent*_{L}.

Clauses (1) and (2) simply specify what it is for *M* to be a
classical model of the ** T**-free fragment of

*L*. Clauses (3) and (4) ensure that

*L*, when interpreted, can talk about its own sentences. Given a ground model, we will consider the prospects of providing a satisfying interpretation of

**. The most obvious desideratum is that the ground model, expanded to include an interpretation of**

*T***, satisfy Tarski's T-biconditionals, i.e., the biconditionals of the form**

*T*‘TA’ iffA

for each *A* ∈ *Sent*_{L}.

Some useful terminology: Given a ground model *M*
for *L* and a name, function symbol or relation
symbol *X*, we can think of *I*(*X*) as the
*interpretation* or, to borrow a term from Gupta and Belnap,
the *signification* of *X*. Gupta and Belnap
characterize an expression's or concept's *signification* in a
world *w* as “an abstract something that carries all the
information about all the expression's [or concept's] extensional
relations in *w*.” If we want to
interpret *T**x* as ‘*x*
is true’, then, given a ground model *M*, we would like
to find an appropriate signification, or an appropriate range of
significations, for ** T**.

### 2.3 Three ground models

We might try to assign to ** T**
a

*classical*signification, by expanding

*M*to a classical model

*M*′ = <

*D*′,

*I*′ > for all of

*L*, including

**. Also recall that we want**

*T**M*′ to satisfy the T-biconditionals: for our immediate purposes, let us interpret these classically. Let us say that an expansion

*M*′ of a ground model

*M*is

*Tarskian*iff

*M*′ is a classical model and all of the T-biconditionals, interpreted classically, are true in

*M*′. We would like to expand ground models to Tarskian models. We consider three ground models in order to assess our prospects for doing this.

Ground modelM_{1}

Our first ground model is a formalization of Example 1.1, above. Suppose thatL_{1}contains three non-quote names, α, β, and γ, and no predicates other than. LetTM_{1}= <D_{1},I_{1}> be as follows:

D_{1}= Sent_{L1}I_{1}(α)= β ∨TγTI_{1}(β)= αTI_{1}(γ)= ¬ αTGround modelM_{2}

Suppose thatL_{2}contains one non-quote names, τ, and no predicates other than. LetTM_{2}= <D_{2},I_{2}> be as follows:

D_{2}= Sent_{L2}I_{2}(τ)= τTGround modelM_{3}

Suppose thatL_{3}contains one non-quote names, λ, and no predicates other than. LetTM_{3}= <D_{3},I_{3}> be as follows:

D_{3}= Sent_{L3}I_{3}(λ)= ¬ λT

**Theorem 2.1**

(1) *M*_{1} can be expanded to exactly one Tarskian model: in this model, the sentences (** T**β
∨

**γ) and**

*T***α are true, while the sentence ¬**

*T***α is false.**

*T*(2)

*M*

_{2}can be expanded to exactly two Tarskian models, in one of which the sentence

**τ is true and in the other of which the sentence**

*T***τ is false.**

*T*(3)

*M*

_{3}cannot be expanded to a Tarskian model.

The proofs of (1) and (2) are beyond the scope of this article, but some remarks are in order.

Re (1): The fact that *M*_{1} can be expanded to a Tarskian model is not surprising, given the reasoning in Example 1.1, above: any initial hypothesis about the truth values of the three sentences in question leads, after three iterations of the revision process, to a stable hypothesis that (** T**β
∨

**γ) and**

*T***α are true, while ¬**

*T***α is false. The fact that**

*T**M*

_{1}can be expanded to

*exactly*one Tarskian model needs the so-called

*Transfer Theorem*, Gupta and Belnap 1993, Theorem 2D.4.

Remark: In the introductory remarks, above, we claim that there are consistent classical interpreted languages that refer to their own sentences and have their own truth predicates. Clauses (1) of Theorem 2.1 delivers an example. Let *M*_{1}′ be the unique Tarskian expansion of *M*_{1}. Then the language *L*_{1}, interpreted by *M*_{1}′ is an interpreted language that has its own truth predicate satisfying the T-biconditionals classically understood, obeys the rules of standard classical logic, and has the ability to refer to each of its own sentences. Thus Tarski was not quite right in his view that any language with its own truth predicate would be inconsistent, as long as it obeyed the rules of standard classical logic, and had the ability to refer to its own sentences.

Re (2): The only potential problematic self-reference is in the sentence ** T**τ, the so-called

*truth teller*, which says of itself that it is true. Informal reasoning suggests that the truth teller can consistently be assigned either classical truth value: if you assign it the value

**t**then no paradox is produced, since the sentence now truly says of itself that it is true; and if you assign it the value

**f**then no paradox is produced, since the sentence now falsely says of itself that it is true. Theorem 2.1 (2) formalizes this point, i.e.,

*M*

_{2}can be expanded to one Tarskian model in which

**τ is true and one in which**

*T***τ is false. The fact that**

*T**M*

_{2}can be expanded to

*exactly*two Tarskian models needs the Transfer Theorem, alluded to above. Note that the language

*L*

_{2}, interpreted by either of these expansions, provides another example of an interpreted language that has its own truth predicate satisfying the T-biconditionals classically understood, obeys the rules of standard classical logic, and has the ability to refer to each of its own sentences.

Proof of (3). Suppose that *M*_{3}′ = <*D*_{3}, *I*_{3}′ > is a classical expansion of *M*_{3} to all of *L*_{3}. Since *M*_{3}′ is an expansion of *M*_{3}, *I*_{3} and *I*_{3}′ agree on all the names of *L*_{3}. So

I_{3}′(λ) =I_{3}(λ) = ¬λ =TI_{3}(‘¬λ’) =TI_{3}′(‘¬λ’).T

So the sentences ** T**λ and

**‘¬**

*T***λ’ have the same truth value in**

*T**M*

_{3}′. So the T-biconditional

‘¬Tλ’ ≡ ¬TλT

is false in *M*_{3}′.

Remark: The language *L*_{3} interpreted by the ground model *M*_{3} formalizes the liar's paradox, with the sentence ¬** T**λ as the offending liar's sentence. Thus, despite Theorem 2.1, Clauses (1) and (2), Clause (3) strongly suggests that in a semantics for languages capable of expressing their own truth concepts,

**cannot, in general, have a classical signification; and the ‘iff’ in the T-biconditionals will not be read as the classical biconditional. We take these suggestions up in Section 4, below.**

*T*## 3. Basic notions of the RTT

### 3.1 Revision rules

In Section 1, we informally sketched the central thought of the
RTT, namely, that we can use the T-biconditionals to generate a
*revision rule* — a rule for revising a hypothesis about the
extension of the truth predicate. Here we will formalize this notion,
and work through an example from Section 1.

In general, let L be a truth language and *M* be a ground model
for *L*. An *hypothesis* is a function
*h* : *D* → {**t**,
**f**}. A hypothesis will in effect be a hypothesized
classical interpretation for ** T**. Let's work
with an example that combines Examples 2.1 and 2.3. We will state the
example formally, but reason in a semiformal way, to transition from
one hypothesized extension of

**to another.**

*T*Example 3.1

Suppose thatLcontains four non-quote names, α, β, γ and λ and no predicates other than. Also suppose thatTM= <D,I> is as follows:

D= Sent_{L}I(α)= β ∨TγTI(β)= αTI(γ)= ¬ αTI(λ)= ¬ λTIt will be convenient to let

Abe the sentence β ∨TγTBbe the sentence αTCbe the sentence ¬ αTXbe the sentence ¬ λTThus:

D= Sent_{L}I(α)= AI(β)= BI(γ)= CI(λ)= XSuppose that the hypothesis

h_{0}hypothesizes thatAis false,Bis true,Cis false andXis true. Thus

h_{0}(A)= fh_{0}(B)= th_{0}(C)= fh_{0}(X)= fNow we will engage in some semiformal reasoning,

on the basis of hypothesish_{0}. Among the four sentences,A,B,CandX,h_{0}puts onlyBin the extension of. Thus, reasoning fromTh_{0}, we conclude that

¬ αTsince the referent of α is not in the extension of TβTsince the referent of β isin the extension ofT¬ γTsince the referent of γ is not in the extension of T¬ λTsince the referent of λ is not in the extension of .TThe T-biconditional for the four sentence

A,B,CandXare as follows:

(T _{A})Ais true iffβ ∨TγT(T _{B})Bis true iffαT(T _{C})Cis true iff ¬αT(T _{X})Xis true iff ¬λTThus, reasoning from

h_{0}, we conclude that

Ais trueBis not trueCis trueXis trueThis produces our new hypothesis

h_{1}:

h_{1}(A)= th_{1}(B)= fh_{1}(C)= th_{1}(X)= tLet's revise our hypothesis once again. So now we will engage in some semiformal reasoning,

on the basis of hypothesish_{1}. Hypothesish_{1}putsA,CandX, but notB, in the extension of the. Thus, reasoning fromTh_{1}, we conclude that

αTsince the referent of ais in the extension ofT¬ βTsince the referent of β isin the extension ofTγTsince the referent of γ is not in the extension of TλTsince the referent of λ is not in the extension of TRecall the T-biconditional for the four sentence

A,B,CandX, given above. Reasoning fromh_{1}and these T-biconditionals, we conclude that

Ais trueBis trueCis not trueXis not trueThis produces our

newnew hypothesish_{2}:

h_{2}(A)= th_{2}(B)= th_{2}(C)= fh_{2}(X)= f□

Let's formalize the semiformal reasoning carried out in Example
3.1. First we hypothesized that certain sentences were, or were not,
in the extension of ** T**. Consider ordinary
classical model theory. Suppose that our language has a predicate

*G*and a name

*a*, and that we have a model

*M*= <

*D*,

*I*> which places the referent of

*a*inside the extension of

*G*:

I(G)(I(α)) =t

Then we conclude, classically, that the sentence *Ga* is true
in *M*. It will be useful to have some notation for the
classical truth value of a sentence *S* in a classical model
*M*. We will write
*Val*_{M}(*S*). In this case,
*Val*_{M}(*Ga*) =
**t**. In Example 3.1, we did not start with a classical
model of the whole language *L*, but only a classical model of
the ** T**-free fragment of

*L*. But then we added a hypothesis, in order to get a classical model of all of

*L*. Let's use the notation

*M*+

*h*for the classical model of all of

*L*that you get when you extend

*M*by assigning

**an extension via the hypothesis**

*T**h*. Once you have assigned an extension to the predicate

**, you can calculate the truth values of the various sentences of**

*T**L*. That is, for each sentence

*S*of

*L*, we can calculate

Val_{M + h}(S)

In Example 3.1, we started with hypothesis *h*_{0} as follows:

h_{0}(A)= fh_{0}(B)= th_{0}(C)= fh_{0}(X)= f

Then we calculated as follows:

Val_{M+h0}(α)T= fVal_{M+h0}(β)T= tVal_{M+h0}(γ)T= fVal_{M+h0}(λ)T= f

And then we concluded as follows:

Val_{M+h0}(A)= Val_{M+h0}(β ∨Tγ) =TtVal_{M+h0}(B)= Val_{M+h0}(¬α) =TfVal_{M+h0}(C)= Val_{M+h0}(α) =TtVal_{M+h0}(X)= Val_{M+h0}(¬λ) =Tt

These conclusions generated our new hypothesis, *h*_{1}:

h_{1}(A)= th_{1}(B)= fh_{1}(C)= th_{1}(X)= t

Note that, in general,

h_{1}(S) =Val_{M+h0}(S).

We are now prepared to define the *revision rule* given by a
ground model *M* = <*D*, *I* >. In general,
given an hypothesis *h*, let *M* + *h* =
<*D*, *I*′ > be the model of *L* which
agrees with *M* on the ** T**-free
fragment of

*L*, and which is such that

*I*′(

**) =**

*T**h*. So

*M*+

*h*is just a classical model for all of

*L*. For any model

*M*+

*h*of all of

*L*and any sentence

*A*if

*L*, let

*Val*

_{M+h}(

*A*) be the ordinary classical truth value of

*A*in

*M*+

*h*.

Definition 3.2

Suppose thatLis a truth language and thatM= <D,I> is a ground model forL. Therevision rule, τ_{M}, is the function mapping hypotheses to hypotheses, as follows:

τ _{M}(h)(d)= { t, ifd∈Dis a sentence ofLandVal_{M+h}(d) =t

f, otherwise

The ‘otherwise’ clause tells us that if *d* is not
a sentence of *L*, then, after one application of revision, we
stick with the hypothesis that *d* is not
true.^{[5]}
Note that, in Example 3.1, *h*_{1} =
τ_{M}(*h*_{0}) and
*h*_{2} =
τ_{M}(*h*_{1}). We will often drop
the subscripted ‘*M*’ when the context make it
clear which ground model is at issue.

### 3.2 Revision sequences

Let's pick up Example 3.1 and see what happens when we iterate the application of the revision rule.

Example 3.3(Example 3.2 continued)

Recall thatLcontains four non-quote names, α, β, γ and λ and no predicates other than. Also recall thatTM= <D,I> is as follows:

D= Sent_{L}I(α)= A= β ∨TγTI(β)= B= αTI(γ)= C= ¬ αTI(λ)= X= ¬ λT

The following table indicates what happens with repeated applications
of the revision rule τ_{M} to the hypothesis
*h*_{0} from Example 3.1. In this table, we will write
τ instead of τ_{M}:

Sh_{0}(S)τ( h_{0})(S)^{ }τ ^{2}(h_{0})(S)τ ^{3}(h_{0})(S)τ ^{4}(h_{0})(S)… Aftttt… Btfttt… Cftfff… Xftftf…

So *h*_{0} generates a *revision sequence* (see
Definition 3.7, below). And *A* and *B* are *stably
true* in that revision sequence (see Definition 3.6, below), while
*C* is *stably false*. The liar sentence *X* is,
unsurprisingly, neither stably true nor stably false: the liar
sentence is *unstable*. A similar calculation would show that
*A* is stably true, regardless of the initial hypothesis: thus
*A* is *categorically true* (see Definition 3.8).

Before giving a precise definition of a *revision sequence*, we
give an example where we would want to carry the revision process
beyond the finite stages, *h*, τ^{1}(*h*),
τ^{2}(*h*), τ^{3}(*h*), and so
on.

Example 3.4

Suppose thatLcontains nonquote names α_{0}, α_{1}, α_{2}, α_{3}, …, and unary predicatesGand. Now we will specify a ground modelTM= <D,I> where the name α_{0}refers to some tautology, and wherethe name α_{1}refers to the sentenceαT_{0}

the name α_{2}refers to the sentenceαT_{1}

the name a_{3}refers to the sentenceaT_{2}

…More formally, let

A_{0}be the sentenceαT_{0}∨ ¬αT_{0}, and for eachn≥ 0, letA_{n+1}be the sentenceαT_{n}. ThusA_{1}is the sentenceαT_{0}, andA_{2}is the sentenceαT_{1}, andA_{3}is the sentenceαT_{2}, and so on. Our ground modelM= <D,I> is as follows:

D= Sent_{L}I(α_{n})= A_{n}I(G)(A) =tiff A=A_{n}for somenThus, the extension of

Gis the following set of sentences: {A_{0},A_{1},A_{2},A_{3}, … } = {(αT_{0}∨ ¬αT_{0}),αT_{0},aT_{1},aT_{2},aT_{3}, … }. Finally letBbe the sentence ∀x(Gx⊃Tx). Lethbe any hypothesis for which we have, for each natural numbern,h(A_{n}) =h(B) =f.The following table indicates what happens with repeated applications of the revision rule τ

_{M}to the hypothesish. In this table, we will write τ instead of τ_{M}:

Sh(S)t(h)(S)τ ^{2}(h)(S)τ ^{3}(h)(S)τ ^{4}(h)(S)… A_{0}ftttt… A_{1}ffttt… A_{2}ffftt… A_{3}fffft… A_{4}fffff… Bfffff… At the 0

^{th}stage, eachA_{n}is outside the hypothesized extension of. But from theTn^{th}stage onwards,A_{n}isinthe hypothesized extension of. So, for eachTn, the sentenceA_{n}is eventually stably hypothesized to be true. Despite this, there is nofinitestage at which all theA_{n}'s are hypothesized to be true: as a result the sentenceB= ∀x(Gx⊃Tx) remains false at each finite stage. This suggests extending the process as follows:

Sh(S)τ( h)(S)τ ^{2}(h)(S)τ ^{3}(h)(S)… ω ω+1 ω+2 … A_{0}fttt… ttt… A_{1}fftt… ttt… A_{2}ffft… ttt… A_{3}ffff… ttt… A_{4}ffff… ttt… Bffff… ftt… Thus, if we allow the revision process to proceed beyond the finite stages, then the sentence

B= ∀x(Gx⊃Tx) is stably true from the ω+1^{st}stage onwards. □

In Example 3.4, the intuitive verdict is that not only should each
*A*_{n} receive a stable truth value of
**t**, but so should the sentence *B* =
∀*x*(*Gx* ⊃
*T**x*). The only way to ensure this is
to carry the revision process beyond the finite stages. So we will
consider revision sequences that are very long: not only will a
revision sequence have a *n*^{th} stage for each finite
number *n*, but a η^{th} stage for every
*ordinal* number η. (The next paragraph is to help the
reader unfamiliar with ordinal numbers.)

One way to think of the ordinal numbers is as follows. Start with the finite natural numbers:

0, 1, 2, 3,…

Add a number, ω, greater than all of these but not the immediate successor of any of them:

0, 1, 2, 3, …, ω

And then take the successor of ω, its successor, and so on:

0, 1, 2, 3, …, ω, ω+1, ω+2, ω+3 …

Then add a number ω+ω, or ω×2, greater than all of these (and again, not the immediate successor of any), and start over, reiterating this process over and over:

0, 1, 2, 3, …,

ω, ω+1, ω+2, ω+3, …,

ω×2, (ω×2)+1, (ω×2)+2, (ω×2)+3, …,

ω×3, (ω×3)+1, (ω×3)+2, (ω×3)+3, …

At the end of this, we add an ordinal number ω×ω or
ω^{2}:

0, 1, 2, …, ω, ω+1, ω+2, …, ω×2, (ω×2)+1, …,

ω×3, …, ω×4, …, ω×5, …, ω^{2}, ω^{2}+1, …

The ordinal numbers have the following structure: every ordinal
number has an immediate successor known as a *successor
ordinal*; and for any infinitely ascending sequence of ordinal
numbers, there is a *limit ordinal* which is greater than all
the members of the sequence and which is not the immediate successor
of any member of the sequence. Thus the following are successor
ordinals: 5, 178, ω+12, (ω×5)+56,
ω^{2}+8; and the following are limit ordinals: ω,
ω×2, ω^{2}, (ω^{2}+ω),
etc. Given a limit ordinal η, a sequence *S* of objects is
an η-*long* sequence if there is an object
*S*_{δ} for every ordinal δ < η. We
will denote the class of ordinals as
On.
Any sequence *S* of objects is an
On-*long*
sequence if there is an object *S*_{δ} for every
ordinal δ.

When assessing whether a sentence receives a
stable truth value, the RTT considers sequences of hypotheses of
length
On.
So suppose that *S* is an
On-long
sequence of hypotheses, and let ζ and η range over
ordinals. Clearly, in order for *S* to represent the revision
process, we need the ζ+1^{st} hypothesis to be generated
from the ζ^{th} hypothesis by the revision rule. So we
insist that *S*_{ζ+1} =
τ_{M}(*S*_{ζ}). But what
should we do at a limit stage? That is, how should we set
*S*_{η}(δ) when η is a limit ordinal?
Clearly any object that is stably true [false] *up to* that
stage should be true [false] *at* that stage. Thus consider
Example 3.2. The sentence *A*_{2}, for example, is true
up to the ω^{th} stage; so we set *A*_{2}
to be true *at* the ω^{th} stage. For objects
that do not stabilize up to that stage, Gupta and Belnap 1993 adopt a
liberal policy: when constructing a revision sequence *S*, if
the value of the object *d* ∈ *D* has not
stabilized by the time you get to the limit stage η, then you can
set *S*_{η}(δ) to be whichever of
**t** or **f** you like. Before we give the
precise definition of a *revision sequence*, we continue with
Example 3.3 to see an application of this idea.

Example 3.5(Example 3.3 continued)

Recall thatLcontains four non-quote names, α, β, γ and λ and no predicates other than. Also recall thatTM= <D,I> is as follows:

D= Sent_{L}I(α)= A= β ∨TγTI(β)= B= αTI(γ)= C= ¬ αTI(λ)= X= ¬ λTThe following table indicates what happens with repeated applications of the revision rule τ

_{M}to the hypothesish_{0}from Example 3.1. For each ordinal η, we will indicate the η^{th}hypothesis byS_{η}(suppressing the indexMon τ). ThusS_{0}=h_{0},S_{1}= τ(h_{0}),S_{2}= τ^{2}(h_{0}),S_{3}= τ^{3}(h_{0}), andS_{ω}, the ω^{th}hypothesis, is determined in some way from the hypotheses leading up to it. So, starting withh_{0}from Example 3.3, our revision sequence begins as follows:

SS_{0}(S)S_{1}(S)S_{2}(S)S_{3}(S)S_{4}(S)… Aftttt… Btfttt… Cftfff… Xftftf… What happens at the ω

^{th}stage?AandBare stably trueup tothe ω^{th}stage, andCis stably falseup tothe ω^{th}stage. Soatthe ω^{th}stage, we must have the following:

SS_{0}(S)S_{1}(S)S_{2}(S)S_{3}(S)S_{4}(S)… S_{ω}(S)Aftttt… tBtfttt… tCftfff… fXftftf… ?But the entry for

S_{ω}(X) can be eithertorf. In other words, the initial hypothesish_{0}generates at least two revision sequences. Every revision sequenceSthat hash_{0}as its initial hypothesis must haveS_{ω}(A) =t,S_{ω}(B) =t, andS_{ω}(C) =f. But there is some revision sequenceS, withh_{0}as its initial hypothesis, and withS_{ω}(X) =t; and there is some revision sequenceS′, withh_{0}as its initial hypothesis, and withS_{ω}′(X) =f. □

We are now ready to define the notion of a *revision
sequence*:

Definition 3.6

Suppose thatLis a truth language, and thatM= <D,I> is a ground model. Suppose thatSis an On-long sequence of hypotheses. Then we say thatd∈Disstablyt[f]inSiff for some ordinal θ we haveS_{ζ}(d) =t[f], for every ordinal ζ ≥ θ.Suppose that

Sis a η-long sequence of hypothesis for some limit ordinal η. Then we say thatd∈Disstablyt[f]inSiff for some ordinal θ < η we haveS_{ζ}(d) =t[f], for every ordinal ζ such that ζ ≥ θ and ζ < η.If

Sis an On-long sequence of hypotheses and η is a limit ordinal, thenS|_{η}is the initial segment ofSup to but not including η. Note thatS|_{η}is a η-long sequence of hypotheses.

Definition 3.7

Suppose thatLis a truth language, and thatM= <D,I> is a ground model. Suppose thatSis an On-long sequence of hypotheses.Sis arevision sequence forMiff

S_{ζ+1}= τ_{M}(S_{ζ}), for each ζ ∈ On, and- for each limit ordinal η and each
d∈D, ifdis stablyt[f] inS|_{η}, thenS_{η}(d) =t[f].Definition 3.8

Suppose thatLis a truth language, and thatM= <D,I> is a ground model. We say that the sentenceAiscategorically true[false]inMiffAis stablyt[f] in every revision sequence forM. We say thatAiscategorical inMiffAis either categorically true or categorically false inM.

We now illustrate these concepts with an example. The example will also illustrate a new concept to be defined afterwards.

Example 3.9

Suppose thatLis a truth language containing nonquote names β, α_{0}, α_{1}, α_{2}, α_{3}, …, and unary predicatesGand. LetTBbe the sentenceβ ∨ ∀Tx∀y(Gx& ¬Tx&Gy& ¬Ty⊃x=y).Let

A_{0}be the sentence ∃x(Gx& ¬Tx). And for eachn≥ 0, letA_{n+1}be the sentenceαT_{n}. Consider the following ground modelM= <D,I>

D= Sent_{L}I(β)= BI(α_{n})= A_{n}I(G)(A) =tiff A=A_{n}for somenThus, the extension of

Gis the following set of sentences: {A_{0},A_{1},A_{2},A_{3}, … } = {αT_{0},αT_{1},αT_{2},αT_{3}, … }. Lethbe any hypothesis for which we have,h(B) =fand for each natural numbern,h(A_{n}) =f.And let

Sbe a revision sequence whose initial hypothesis ish, i.e.,S_{0}=h. The following table indicates some of the values ofS_{γ}(C), for sentencesC∈ {B,A_{0},A_{1},A_{2},A_{3}, … }. In the top row, we indicate only the ordinal number representing the stage in the revision process.

0 1 2 3 … ω ω+1 ω+2 ω+3 … ω×2 (ω×2)+1 (ω×2)+2 … Bffff… fttt… ttt… A_{0}fttt… tftt… tft… A_{1}fftt… ttft… ttf… A_{2}ffft… tttf… ttt… A_{3}ffff… tttt… ttt… A_{4}ffff… tttt… ttt… It is worth contrasting the behaviour of the sentence B and the sentence

A_{0}. From the ω+1^{st}stage on,Bis stabilizes as true. In fact,Bis stably true in every revision sequence forM. Thus,Bis categorically true inM. The sentenceA_{0}, however, never quite stabilizes: it is usually true, but within a few finite stages of a limit ordinal, the sentenceA_{0}can be false. In these circumstances, we say thatA_{0}isnearly stably true(See Definition 3.10, below.) In fact,A_{0}is nearly stably true in every revision sequence forM. □

Example 3.9 illustrates not only the notion of stability in a revision sequence, but also of near stability, which we define now:

Definition 3.10.

Suppose thatLis a truth language, and thatM= <D,I> is a ground model. Suppose thatSis an On-long sequence of hypotheses. Then we say thatd∈Disnearly stablyt[f]inSiff for some ordinal θ we havefor every ζ ≥ θ, there is a natural numbernsuch that, for everym≥n,S_{ζ+m}(d) =t[f].

Gupta and Belnap 1993 characterize the difference between stability
and near stability as follows: “Stability *simpliciter*
requires an element [in our case a sentence] to settle down to a value
**x** [in our case a truth value] after some initial
fluctuations say up to [an ordinal η]… In contrast, near
stability allows fluctuations after η also, but these fluctuations
must be confined to finite regions just after limit
ordinals” (p. 169). Gupta and Belnap 1993 introduce two theories of
truth, *T*^{*} and
*T*^{#}, based on stability and near
stability. Theorems 3.12 and 3.13, below, illustrate an advantage of
the system *T*^{#}, i.e., the system
based on near stability.

Definition 3.11

Suppose thatLis a truth language, and thatM= <D,I> is a ground model. We say that a sentenceAisvalid inMbyT^{*}iffAis stably true in every revision sequence. And we say that a sentenceAisvalid inMbyT^{#}iffAis nearly stably true in every revision sequence.

Theorem 3.12

Suppose thatLis a truth language, and thatM= <D,I> is a ground model. Then, for every sentenceAofL, the following is valid inMbyT^{#}:‘¬TA’ ≡ ¬‘TA’.

Theorem 3.13

There is a truth languageLand a ground modelM= <D,I> and a sentenceAofLsuch that the following isnotvalid inMbyT^{*}:‘¬TA’ ≡ ¬‘TA’.

Gupta and Belnap 1993, Section 6C, note similar advantages of
*T*^{#} over
*T*^{*}. For example,
*T*^{#} does, but
*T*^{*} does not, validate the
following semantic principles:

‘TA&B’ ≡‘TA’ &‘TB’

‘TA∨B’ ≡‘TA’ ∨‘TB’

Gupta and Belnap remain noncommittal about which of
*T*^{#} and
*T*^{*} (and a further alternative
that they define, *T*^{c}) is
preferable.

## 4. Interpreting the formalism

The main formal notions of the RTT are the notion of a *revision
rule* (Definition 3.2), i.e., a rule for revising hypotheses; and a
*revision sequence* (Definition 3.7), a sequence of hypotheses
generated in accordance with the appropriate revision rule. Using
these notions, we can, given a ground model, specify when a sentence
is *stably, or nearly stably, true or false* in a particular
revision sequence. Thus we could define two theories of truth,
*T*^{*} and
*T*^{#}, based on stability and near
stability. The final idea is that each of these theories delivers a
verdict on which sentences of the language are categorically
assertible, given a ground model.

Note that we could use revision-theoretic notions to make rather fine-grained distinctions among sentences: Some sentences are unstable in every revision sequence; others are stable in every revision sequence, though stably true in some and stably false in others; and so on. Thus, we can use revision-theoretic ideas to give a fine-grained analysis of the status of various sentences, and of the relationships of various sentences to one another.

Recall the suggestion made at the end of Section 2:

In a semantics for languages capable of expressing their own truth concepts,will not, in general, have a classical signification; and the ‘iff’ in the T-biconditionals will not be read as the classical biconditional.T

Gupta and Belnap fill out these suggestions in the following way.

### 4.1 The signification of *T*

*T*

First, they suggest that the signification of
** T**, given a ground model

*M*, is the revision rule τ

_{M}itself. As noted in the preceding paragraph, we can give a fine-grained analysis of sentences' statuses and interrelations on the basis of notions generated directly and naturally from the revision rule τ

_{M}. Thus, τ

_{M}is a good candidate for the signification of

**, since it does seem to be “an abstract something that carries all the information about all [of**

*T***'s] extensional relations” in**

*T**M*. (See Gupta and Belnap's characterization of an expression's

*signification*, given in Section 2, above.)

### 4.2 The ‘iff’ in the T-biconditionals

Gupta and Belnap's related suggestion concerning the ‘iff’
in the T-biconditionals is that, rather than being the classical
biconditional, this ‘iff’ is the distinctive biconditional
used to *define* a previously undefined concept. In 1993, Gupta
and Belnap present the revision theory of truth as a special case of a
revision theory of *circularly defined concepts*. Suppose that
*L* is a language with a unary predicate *F* and a
binary predicate *R*. Consider a new concept expressed by a
predicate *G*, introduced through a definition like this:

Gx=_{df}∀y(Ryx⊃Fx) ∨ ∃y(Ryx&Gx).

Suppose that we start with a domain of discourse, *D*, and an
interpretation of the predicate *F* and the relation symbol
*R*. Gupta and Belnap's revision-theoretic treatment of
concepts thus circularly introduced allows one to give categorical
verdicts, for certain *d* ∈ *D* about whether or
not *d* satisfies *G*. Other objects will be unstable
relative to *G*: we will be able categorically to assert
neither that *d* satisfies *G* nor that d does not
satisfy *G*. In the case of truth, Gupta and Belnap take the
set of T-biconditionals of the form

‘TA’ =_{df}A(10)

together to give the definition of the concept of truth. It is their
treatment of ‘=_{df}’ (the
‘iff’ of definitional concept introduction), together with
the T-biconditionals of the form (10), that determine the revision
rule τ_{M}.

### 4.3 The paradoxical reasoning

Recall the liar sentence, (1), from the beginning of this article:

(1) is not true (1)

In Section 1, we claimed that the RTT is designed to model, rather than block, the kind of paradoxical reasoning regarding (1). But we noted in footnote 2 that the RTT does avoid contradictions in these situations. There are two ways to see this. First, while the RTT does endorse the biconditional

(1) is true iff (1) is not true,

the relevant ‘iff’ is not the material biconditional, as explained above. Thus, it does not follow that both (1) is true and (1) is not true. Second, note that on no hypothesis can we conclude that both (1) is true and (1) is not true. If we keep it firmly in mind that revision-theoretical reasoning is hypothetical rather than categorical, then we will not infer any contradictions from the existence of a sentence such as (1), above.

### 4.4 The signification thesis

Gupta and Belnap's suggestions, concerning the signification of
** T** and the interpretation of the
‘iff’ in the T-biconditionals, dovetail nicely with two
closely related intuitions articulated in Gupta & Belnap 1993. The
first intuition, loosely expressed, is “that the T-biconditionals are
analytic and

*fix*the meaning of ‘true’” (p. 6). More tightly expressed, it becomes the “Signification Thesis” (p. 31): “The T-biconditionals fix the signification of truth in every world [where a world is represented by a ground model].”

^{[6]}Given the revision-theoretic treatment of the definition ‘iff’, and given a ground model

*M*, the T-biconditionals (10) do, as noted, fix the suggested signification of

**, i.e., the revision rule τ**

*T*_{M}.

### 4.5 The supervenience of semantics

The second intuition is *the supervenience of the signification of
truth*. This is a descendant of M. Kremer's 1988 proposed
*supervenience of semantics*. The idea is simple: which
sentences fall under the concept *truth* should be fixed by (1)
the interpretation of the nonsemantic vocabulary, and (2) the
empirical facts. In non-circular cases, this intuition is particularly
strong: the standard interpretation of “snow” and “white” and the
empirical fact that snow is white, are enough to determine that the
sentence “snow is white” falls under the concept *truth*. The
supervenience of the signification of truth is the thesis that the
signification of truth, whatever it is, is fixed by the ground model
*M*. Clearly, the RTT satisfies this principle.

It is worth seeing how a theory of truth might violate this principle. Consider the truth-teller sentence, i.e., the sentence that says of itself that it is true:

(11) is true (11)

As noted above, Kripke's three-valued semantics allows three truth
values, true (**t**), false (**f**), and
neither (**n**). Given a ground model *M* =
<*D*, *I* > for a truth
language *L*, the candidate interpretations of
** T** are three-valued interpretations, i.e.,
functions

*h*:

*D*→ {

**t**,

**f**,

**n**}. Given a three-valued interpretation of

**, and a scheme for evaluating the truth value of composite sentences in terms of their parts, we can specify a truth value**

*T**Val*

_{M+h}(

*A*) =

**t**,

**f**or

**n**, for every sentence

*A*of

*L*. The central theorem of the three-valued semantics is that, given any ground model

*M*, there is a three-valued interpretation h of

**so that, for every sentence**

*T**A*, we have

*Val*

_{M+h}(

**‘**

*T**A*’) =

*Val*

_{M+h}(

*A*).

^{[7]}We will call such an interpretation of

**an**

*T**acceptable*interpretation. Our point here is this: if there's a truth-teller, as in (11), then there is not only one acceptable interpretation of

**; there are three: one according to which (11) is true, one according to which (11) is false, and one according to which (11) is neither. Thus, there is no single “correct” interpretation of**

*T***given a ground model M. Thus the three-valued semantics seems to violate the supervenience of semantics.**

*T*^{[8]}

The RTT does not assign a truth value to the truth-teller,
(11). Rather, it gives an analysis of the kind of reasoning that one
might engage in with respect to the truth-teller: If we start with a
hypothesis *h* according to which (11) is true, then upon
revision (11) remains true. And if we start with a hypothesis
*h* according to which (11) is not true, then upon revision
(11) remains not true. And that is all that the concept of truth
leaves us with. Given this behaviour of (11), the RTT tells us that
(11) is neither categorically true nor categorically false, but this
is quite different from a verdict that (11) is neither true nor
false.

### 4.6 A nonsupervenient interpretation of the formalism

We note an alternative interpretation of the revision-theoretic formalism. Yaqūb 1993 agrees with Gupta and Belnap that the T-biconditionals are definitional rather than material biconditionals, and that the concept of truth is therefore circular. But Yaqūb interprets this circularity in a distinctive way. He argues that,

since the truth conditions of some sentences involve reference to truth in an essential, irreducible manner, these conditions can only obtain or fail in a world that already includes an extension of the truth predicate. Hence, in order for the revision process to determine an extension of the truth predicate, aninitialextension of the predicate must be posited. This much follows from circularity and bivalence. (1993, 40)

Like Gupta and Belnap, Yaqūb posits no privileged extension for
** T**. And like Gupta and Belnap, he sees the
revision sequences of extensions of

**, each sequence generated by an initial hypothesized extension, as “capable of accommodating (and diagnosing) the various kinds of problematic and unproblematic sentences of the languages under consideration” (1993, 41). But, unlike Gupta and Belnap, he concludes from these considerations that “**

*T**truth in a bivalent language is not supervenient*” (1993, 39). He explains in a footnote: for truth to be supervenient, the truth status of each sentence must be “fully determined by nonsemantical facts”. Yaqūb does not explicitly use the notion of a concept's

*signification*. But Yaqūb seems committed to the claim that the signification of

**— i.e., that which determines the truth status of each sentence — is given by a particular revision sequence itself. And no revision sequence is determined by the nonsemantical facts, i.e., by the ground model, alone: a revision sequence is determined, at best, by a ground model and an initial hypothesis.**

*T*^{[9]}

## 5. Further issues

### 5.1 Three-valued semantics

We have given only the barest exposition of the three-valued
semantics, in our discussion of the supervenience of the signification
of truth, above. Given a truth language *L* and a ground model
*M*, we defined an *acceptable* three-valued
interpretation of ** T** as an interpretation

*h*:

*D*→ {

**t**,

**f**,

**n**} such that

*Val*

_{M+h}(

**‘**

*T**A*’) =

*Val*

_{M+h}(

*A*) for each sentence

*A*of

*L*. In general, given a ground model

*M*, there are many acceptable interpretations of

**. Suppose that each of these is indeed a truly acceptable interpretation. Then the three-valued semantics violates the supervenience of the signification of**

*T***.**

*T*
Suppose, on the other hand, that, for each ground model *M*,
we can isolate a privileged acceptable interpretation as *the*
correct interpretation of ** T**. Gupta and
Belnap present a number of considerations against the three-valued
semantics, so conceived. (See Gupta & Belnap 1993, Chapter 3.) One
principal argument is that the central theorem, i.e., that for each
ground model there is an acceptable interpretation, only holds when
the underlying language is expressively impoverished in certain ways:
for example, the three-valued approach fails if the language has a
connective ~ with the following truth table:

A~ Atfftnt

The only negation operator that the three-valued approach can handle has the following truth table:

A¬ Atfftnn

But consider the liar that says of itself that it is ‘not’ true, in this latter sense of ‘not’. Gupta and Belnap urge the claim that this sentence “ceases to be intuitively paradoxical” (1993, 100). The claimed advantage of the RTT is its ability to describe the behaviour of genuinely paradoxical sentences: the genuine liar is unstable under semantic evaluation: “No matter what we hypothesize its value to be, semantic evaluation refutes our hypothesis.” The three-valued semantics can only handle the “weak liar”, i.e., a sentence that only weakly negates itself, but that is not guaranteed to be paradoxical: “There are appearances of the liar here, but they deceive.”

We've thus far reviewed two of Gupta and Belnap's complaints against
three-valued approaches, and now we raise a third: in the
three-valued theories, truth typically behaves like a nonclassical
concept even when there’s no vicious reference in the
language. Without defining terms here, we note that one popular
precisification of the three-valued approach, is to take the correct
interpretation of T to be that given by the ‘least fixed
point’ of the ‘strong Kleene scheme’: putting aside
details, this interpretation always assigns the truth value n to the
sentence ∀x(** T**x ∨
¬

**x), even when the ground model allows no circular, let alone vicious, reference. Gupta and Belnap claim an advantage for the RTT: according to revision-theoretic approach, they claim, truth always behaves like a classical concept when there is no vicious reference.**

*T*
Kremer 2010 challenges this claim by precisifying it as a formal claim
against which particular revision theories
(e.g. *T*^{*}
or *T*^{#}, see Definition 3.11,
above) and particular three-valued theories can be tested. As it turns
out, on many three-valued theories, truth does in fact behave like a
classical concept when there's no vicious reference: for
example, the least fixed point of a natural variant of the
supervaluation scheme always assigns ** T** a
classical interpretation in the absence of vicious reference. Granted,
truth behaves like a classical concept when there’s no vicious
reference on Gupta and Belnap's
theory

*T*^{*}, but, so Kremer argues, does not on Gupta and Belnap's theory

*T*^{#}. This discussion is further taken up by Wintein 2014.

### 5.2 Two values?

A contrast presupposed by this entry is between allegedly two-valued theories, like the RTT, and allegedly three-valued or other many-valued rivals. One might think of the RTT itself as providing infinitely many semantic values, for example one value for every possible revision sequence. Or one could extract three semantic values for sentences: categorical truth, categorical falsehood, and uncategoricalness.

In reply, it must be granted that the RTT generates
many *statuses* available to sentences. Similarly, three-valued
approaches also typically generate many statuses available to
sentences. The claim of two-valuedness is not a claim about statuses
available to sentences, but rather a claim about the *truth
values* presupposed in the whole enterprise.

### 5.3 Amendments to the RTT

We note three ways to amend the RTT. First, we might put constraints
on which hypotheses are acceptable. For example, Gupta and Belnap 1993
introduce a theory, **T**^{c}, of truth
based on *consistent* hypotheses: an hypothesis *h* is
*consistent* iff the set
{*A* : *h*(*A*) =
**t**} is a complete consistent set of sentences. The
relative merits of **T**^{*},
**T**^{#} and
**T**^{c} are discussed in Gupta &
Belnap 1993, Chapter 6.

Second, we might adopt a more restrictive *limit policy* than
Gupta and Belnap adopt. Recall the question asked in Section 3: How
should we set *S*_{η}(*d*) when η is a
limit ordinal? We gave a partial answer: any object that is stably
true [false] *up to* that stage should be true [false]
*at* that stage. We also noted that for an object *d*
∈ *D* that does not stabilize up to the stage η, Gupta
and Belnap 1993 allow us to set *S*_{η}(*d*)
as either **t** or **f**. In a similar
context, Herzberger 1982a and 1982b assigns the value
**f** to the unstable objects. And Gupta originally
suggested, in Gupta 1982, that unstable elements receive whatever
value they received at the initial hypothesis
*S*_{0}.

These first two ways of amending the RTT both, in effect, restrict
the notion of a revision sequence, by putting constraints on which of
*our* revision sequences really count as acceptable revision
sequences. The constraints are, in some sense local: the first
constraint is achieved by putting restrictions on which hypotheses can
be used, and the second constraint is achieved by putting restrictions
on what happens at limit ordinals. A third option would be to put more
global constraints on which putative revision sequences count as
acceptable. Yaqūb 1993 suggests, in effect, a limit rule whereby
acceptable verdicts on unstable sentences at some limit stage η
depend on verdicts rendered at *other* limit stages.
Yaqūb argues that these constraints allow us to avoid certain
“artifacts”. For example, suppose that a ground model *M* =
<*D*, *I* > has two independent
liars, by having two names α and β, where
*I*(α) = ¬** T**α and

*I*(β) = ¬

**β. Yaqūb argues that it is a mere “artifact” of the revision semantics, naively presented, that there are revision sequences in which the sentence ¬**

*T***α ≡ ¬**

*T***β is stably true, since the two liars are independent. His global constraints are developed to rule out such sequences. (See Chapuis 1996 for further discussion.)**

*T*### 5.4 Revision theory for circularly defined concepts

As indicated in our discussion, in Section 4, of the ‘iff’
in the T-biconditionals, Gupta and Belnap present the RTT as a special
case of a revision theory of circularly defined concepts. To
reconsider the example from Section 4. Suppose that *L* is a
language with a unary predicate F and a binary predicate R. Consider a
new concept expressed by a predicate *G*, introduced through a
definition, *D*, like this:

Gx=_{df}A(x,G)

where *A*(*x*,*G*) is the formula

∀y(Ryx⊃Fx) ∨ ∃y(Ryx&Gx).

In this context, a *ground model* is a classical model
*M* = <*D*, I > of the language
*L*: we start with a domain of discourse, *D*, and an
interpretation of the predicate *F* and the relation symbol
*R*. We would like to extend *M* to an interpretation of
the language *L* + *G*. So, in this context, an
hypothesis will be thought of as an hypothesized extension for the
newly introduced concept *G*. Formally, a hypothesis is simply
a function *h* : *D* →
{**t**, **f**}. Given a hypothesis
*h*, we take *M*+*h* to be the classical model
*M*+*h* =
<*D*, *I*′ >, where
*I*′ interprets *F* and *R* in the same way
as *I*, and where *I*′(*G*) = *h*.
Given a hypothesized interpretation *h* of *G*, we
generate a new interpretation of *G* as follows: and object
*d* ∈ *D* is in the new extension of *G*
just in case the defining formula *A*(*x*,*G*) is
true of *d* in the model *M*+*h*. Formally, we
use the ground model *M* and the definition *D* to
define a *revision rule*,
δ_{D,M}, mapping hypotheses to
hypotheses, i.e., hypothetical interpretations of *G* to
hypothetical interpretations of *G*. In particular, for any
formula *B* with one free variable *x*, and *d*
∈ *D*, we can define the truth value
*Val*_{M+h,d}(*B*) in
the standard way. Then,

δ_{D,M}(h)(d) =Val_{M+h,d}(A)

Given a revision rule δ_{D,M}, we
can generalize the notion of a *revision sequence*, which is
now a sequence of hypothetical extensions of *G* rather than
** T**. We can generalize the notion of a
sentence

*B*being

*stably true*,

*nearly stably true*, etc., relative to a revision sequence. Gupta and Belnap introduce the systems

**S**

^{*}and

**S**

^{#}, analogous to

**T**

^{*}and

**T**

^{#}, as follows:

^{[10]}

Definition 5.1.

- A sentence
Bisvalid on the definitionDin the ground modelMin the systemS^{*}(notationM⊨_{*,D}B) iffBis stably true relative to each revision sequence for the revision rule δ_{D,M}.- A sentence
Bisvalid on the definitionDin the ground modelMin the systemS^{#}(notationM⊨_{#,D}B) iffBisnearlystably true relative to each revision sequence for the revision rule δ_{D,M}.- A sentence
Bisvalid on the definitionDin the systemS^{*}(notation ⊨_{*,D}B) iff for all classical ground modelsM, we haveM⊨_{*,D}B.- A sentence
Bisvalid on the definitionDin the systemS^{#}(notation ⊨_{#,D}B) iff for all classical ground modelsM, we haveM⊨_{#,D}B.

One of Gupta and Belnap's principle open questions is whether there is
a complete calculus for these systems: that is, whether, for each
definition *D*, either of the following two sets of sentences is
recursively axiomatizable:
{*B* : ⊨_{*,D} *B*}
and
{*B* : ⊨_{#,D} *B*}.
Kremer 1993 proves that the answer is no: he shows that there is a
definition *D* such that each of these sets of sentences is of
complexity at least Π^{1}_{2}, thereby putting a
lower limit on the complexity of **S**^{*} and
**S**^{#}. (Antonelli 1994a and 2002 shows that
this is also an upper limit.)

Kremer's proof exploits an intimate relationship between circular
definitions understood *revision*-theoretically and circular
definitions understood as *inductive* definitions: the theory
of inductive definitions has been quite well understood for some
time. In particular, Kremer proves that every inductively defined
concept can be revision-theoretically defined. The expressive power
and other aspects of the revision-theoretic treatment of circular
definitions is the topic of much interesting work: see Welch 2001,
Löwe 2001, Löwe and Welch 2001, and Kühnberger *et
al*. 2005.

### 5.5 Axiomatic Theories of Truth and the Revision Theory

The RTT is a clear example of a semantically motivated theory of truth. Quite a different tradition seeks to give a satisfying axiomatic theory of truth. Granted we cannot retain all of classical logic and all of our intuitive principles regarding truth, especially if we allow vicious self-reference. But maybe we can arrive at satisfying axiom systems for truth, that, for example, maintain consistency and classical logic, but give up only a little bit when it comes to our intuitive principles concerning truth, such as the T-biconditionals (interpreted classically); or maintain consistency and all of the T-biconditionals, but give up only a little bit of classical logic. Halbach 2011 comprehensively studies such axiomatic theories (mainly those that retain classical logic), and Horsten 2011 is in the same tradition. Both Chapter 14 of Halbach 2011 and Chapter 8 of Horsten 2011 study the relationship between the Friedman-Sheard theory FS and the revision semantics, with some interesting results. For more work on axiomatic systems and the RTT, see Horsten et al 2012.

Field 2008 makes an interesting contribution to axiomatic theorizing about truth, even though most of the positive work in the book consists of model building and is therefore semantics. In particular, Field is interested in producing a theory as close to classical logic as possible, which at the same time retains all T-biconditionals (the conditional itself will be nonclassical) and which at the same time can express, in some sense, the claim that such and such a sentence is defective. Field uses tools from multivalued logic, fixed-point semantics, and revision theory to build models showing, in effect, that a very attractive axiomatic system is consistent. Field’s construction is an intricate interplay between using fixed-point constructions for successively interpreting T, and revision sequences for successively interpreting the nonclassical conditional — the final interpretation being determined by a sort of super-revision-theoretic process.

### 5.6 Applications

Given Gupta and Belnap's general revision-theoretic treatment of
circular definitions-of which their treatment of *truth* is a
special case-one would expect revision-theoretic ideas to be applied
to other concepts. Antonelli 1994b applies these ideas to
non-well-founded sets: a non-well-founded set *X* can be
thought of as circular, since, for some *X*_{0},
…, *X*_{n} we have *X* ∈
*X*_{0} ∈ … ∈
*X*_{n} ∈ *X*. Chapuis 2003
applies revision-theoretic ideas to rational decision making. Also,
see Wang 2011 for a discussion of revision theory and abstract
objects, and Asmus 2013 for a discussion of revision theory and
vagueness.

In the last decade, there has been increasing interest in bridging the gap between classic debates on the nature of truth — deflationism, the correspondence theory, minimalism, pragmatism, and so on — and formal work on truth, motivated by the liar's paradox. The RTT is tied to pro-sententialism by Belnap 2006; deflationism, by Yaqūb 2008; and minimalism, by Restall 2005.

We must also mention Gupta 2006. In this work, Gupta argues that an
experience provides the experiencer, not with a straightforward
entitlement to a proposition, but rather with a hypothetical
entitlement: as explicated in Berker 2011, if subject S has
experience *e* and is entitled to hold view *v* (where
S’s *view* is the totality of S’s concepts,
conceptions, and beliefs), then S is entitled to believe a certain
class of perceptual judgements, Γ(*v*). (Berker uses
“propositions” instead of “perceptual judgements” in his formulation.)
But this generates a problem: how is S entitled to hold a view? There
seems to be a circular interdependence between entitlements to views
and entitlements to perceptual judgements. Here, Gupta appeals to a
general form of revision theory — generalizing beyond both the
revision theory of truth and the revision theory of circularly defined
concepts (Section 5.4, above) — to given an account of how
“hypothetical perceptual entitlements could yield categorical
entitlements” (Berker 2011).

### 5.7 An open question

We close with an open question about **T**^{*}
and **T**^{#}. Recall Definition 3.11, above,
which defines when a sentence *A* of a truth language
*L* is *valid in the ground model* *M*
*by* **T**^{*} or *by*
**T**^{#}. We will say that *A* is
*valid by* **T**^{*} [alternatively,
*by* **T**^{#}] iff *A* is valid in
the ground model *M* by **T**^{*}
[alternatively, by **T**^{#}] for every ground
model *M*. Our open question is this: What is the complexity of
the set of sentences valid by **T**^{*}
[**T**^{#}]?

## Bibliography

- Antonelli, G.A., 1994a, “The complexity of
revision”,
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 35: 204–218. - –––, 1994b, “Non-well-founded sets via revision
rules”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 23: 633–679. - –––, 2002, “The complexity of revision,
revised”,
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 43: 75–78. - Asmus C.M., 2013, “Vagueness and revision
sequences”,
*Synthese*, 190: 953–974. - Belnap, N., 1982, “Gupta's rule of revision theory of truth”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 11: 103–116. - –––, 2006, “Prosentence, Revision, Truth, and
Paradox”,
*Philosophy and Phenomenological Research*, 73: 705–712. - Berker S., 2011, “Gupta’s
gambit”,
*Philosophical Studies*, 152: 17–39. - Chapuis, A., 1996, “Alternate revision theories of truth”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 25: 399–423. - –––, 2003, “An application of circular definitions:
rational decision”, in Löwe, Malzkorn, and Räsch (eds.),
*Foundations of the Formal Sciences II: Applications of Mathematical Logic in Philosophy and Linguistics*, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 47–54. - Field H., 2008,
*Saving Truth from Paradox*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Gupta, A., 1982, “Truth and paradox”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 11: 1–60. - –––, 2006,
*Empiricism and Experience*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Gupta, A., and Belnap, N., 1993,
*The Revision Theory of Truth*, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. - Halbach, V., 2011,
*Axiomatic Theories of Truth*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Hammer, E., 2003, “The Revision Theory of Truth”,
*The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy*(Spring 2003 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <http://plato.stanford.edu/archives/spr2003/entries/truth-revision/>. - Herzberger, H.G., 1982, “Notes on naive
semantics”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 11: 61–102. - –––, 1982, “Naive semantics and the liar
paradox”,
*Journal of Philosophy*, 79: 479–497. - Horsten, L., 2011,
*The Tarskian Turn: Deflationism and Axiomatic Truth*, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. - Horsten, L., Leigh, G.E., Leitgeb, H., and Welch, P., 2012,
“Revision Revisited”,
*The Review of Symbolic Logic*, 5: 642–665. - Kremer, M., 1988, “Kripke and the logic of
truth”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 17: 225–78. - Kremer, P., 1993, “The Gupta-Belnap systems
**S**^{#}and**S**^{*}are not axiomatisable”,*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 34: 583–596. - –––, 2010, “How Truth Behaves When There’s No
Vicious Reference”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 39: 345–367. - Kripke, S., 1975, “Outline of a theory of
truth”,
*Journal of Philosophy*, 72: 690–716. - Kühnberger, K., Löwe, B., Möllerfeld, M., and
Welch, P., 2005, “Comparing inductive and circular definitions:
parameters, complexity and games”,
*Studia Logica*, 81: 79–98. - Löwe, B., 2001 “Revision sequences and computers with an infinite
amount of time”,
*Journal of Logic and Computation*, 11: 25–40. - Löwe, B., and Welch, P., 2001, “Set-theoretic absoluteness
and the revision theory of truth”,
*Studia Logica*, 68(1): 21–41. - Martin, R., and Woodruff, P., 1975, “On representing
‘True-in-L’ in L”,
*Philosophia*, 5: 217–221. - Restall, G., 2005, “Minimalists about Truth Can (and Should)
Be Epistemicists, and it Helps if They Are Revision Theorists
too”, in
*Deflation and Paradox*, JC Beall and B. Armour-Garb (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 97–106. - Wang, W., 2011, “Theories of abstract objects without ad hoc
restriction”,
*Erkenntnis*74: 1–15. - Welch, P., 2001, “On Gupta-Belnap revision theories of truth,
Kripkean fixed points, and the Next stable set”,
*Bulletin for Symbolic Logic*, 7: 345–360. - Wintein, S., 2014, “Alternative Ways for Truth to Behave
When There's no Vicious Reference”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*43: 665–690. - Yaqūb, A., 1993,
*The Liar Speaks the Truth : A Defense of the Revision Theory of Truth*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - –––, 2008, “Two types of
deflationist”,
*Synthese*, 165: 77–106.

## Academic Tools

How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

## Other Internet Resources

- Hammer, E., 2003, “The Revision Theory of Truth”,
*The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy*(Spring 2003 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <http://plato.stanford.edu/archives/spr2003/entries/truth-revision/>. (This was the entry on the revision theory of truth which appeared in the active portion of the SEP from 1997–2006.)