Supplement to Two-Dimensional Semantics

The 2D Argument Against Materialism

The most famous application of Chalmers' 2D semantics is his argument against materialist accounts of phenomenal properties. Chalmers (1996; 2009) formulates a conceivability argument that seeks to establish that phenomenal properties like being in pain or having a red sensation cannot be identified with any physical or functional properties of the human brain. Chalmers uses his 2D semantic framework to clarify the type of conceivability involved and its connection with metaphysical possibility.

Let ‘P’ to stand for an exhaustive microphysical description of the real world together with an indication of your current location within it. And let ‘Q’ stand for some phenomenal truth. For concreteness, let's take Q be the claim that someone has phenomenal experiences. If (P & ¬Q) is true, then the world is such that human beings physically exactly like us are all “zombies”: they have no pains or any other phenomenal experiences. Chalmers' 2D argument against materialism can now be formulated as follows (Chalmers 2009):

1. Q is true. [Empirical observation]
2. (P & ¬Q) is apriori coherent. [Apriori reflection]
3. If (P & ¬Q) is apriori coherent, then there are epistemically possible scenarios relative to which the epistemic 1-intension of (P & ¬Q) yields the value True (i.e., there are apriori coherent scenarios which, if actual, would make the target sentence true).
[Epistemic 2D framework]
4. For any such epistemically possible scenario, there is a corresponding metaphysically possible (centered) world.
[Modal rationalism]
5. The epistemic 1-intension and the subjunctive 2-intension of (P & ¬Q) are the same: if the 1-intension of (P & ¬Q) yields the value True for a scenario, then there is a corresponding possible world for which the 2-intension of (P & ¬Q) yields the value True.
[Semantic stability of ‘P’ and ‘Q’]
6. If (P & ¬Q) is apriori coherent, then (P & ¬Q) is metaphysically possible: there is a possible world at which its subjunctive 2-intension is true.
7. If (P & ¬Q) is metaphysically possible in this sense, then materialism is false.
[Definition of ‘materialism’, 1]
8. So materialism is false. [2,6,7]

Premise 1 is largely uncontroversial: it simply states someone has a phenomenal experience. Premise 2 makes a claim about what would seem coherent after ideal apriori reflection. Everyone agrees that there is no obvious contradiction in the idea that certain physiological processes (those actually correlated with human pains) might not give rise to vivid burning or stabbing sensations. Premise 2 says that this initial appearance of coherence will survive all further rational reflection, no matter how many details you add about the physiological processes or your own relation to them. Premise 3 merely reformulates this ideal apriori coherence claim within the formal framework of epistemic 2D semantics. So the transition from 2 to 3 is quasi-stipulative.

Premise 4 establishes a systematic link between apriori conceivability and metaphysical possibility at the level of the 2D framework. According to Modal Rationalism, ideal apriori coherence is an accurate guide to genuine metaphysical possibility. So every epistemically possible scenario—a complete description of what the world might be like together with your location within that world—describes a genuine metaphysically possible (centered) world. This general claim plays a crucial role in securing the argument against materialism.

Premise 5 establishes a specific link between conceivability and metaphysical possibility for the target sentence (P & ¬Q). If the component sentences ‘P’ and ‘Q’ are semantically stable—if they are couched in vocabulary that doesn't shift its extension based on contingent facts about the actual world—then their epistemic and subjunctive intensions will be identical, yielding the same truth-values for the same situations. So the complex sentence ‘(P & ¬Q)’ will also be semantically stable. The guiding intuition here is that our competence with phenomenal and physical vocabulary affords direct epistemic access to the essential nature of the properties picked out. The idea is that we don't just have indirect tests for identifying pain via its contingent features: we know exactly what it takes for pain to be instantiated in any actual or counterfactual world—a state has to feel a certain way from the subject's point of view. Similarly, the essential nature of the physical property picked out by a term like ‘quark’, one might argue, is precisely specified by physical theory.

Step 6 is an interim conclusion: it says that if zombies are conceivable, they're also metaphysically possible. The epistemic 2D framework helps regiment and clarify this claim: the conceivability of zombies is characterized via the 1-intension associated with the target sentence, whereas the metaphysical possibility of zombies is modeled by the 2-intension. If both the phenomenal and physical vocabulary involved in ‘(P & ¬Q)’ is semantically stable, then the epistemic 1-intension and the subjunctive 2-intension will be true with respect to exactly the same worlds. But there's a hitch: epistemic 1-intensions are defined over epistemically possible scenarios whereas subjective 2-intensions are defined over metaphysically possible worlds. So step 6 must also rely on the general claim in premise 4 about how these two types of possibility line up: every apriori coherent scenario describes a genuine metaphysically possible world.

If one accepts the argument up to this point, then the denial of materialism is straightforward. According to materialism, all properties in the actual world supervene on microphysical properties. But if (P & ¬Q) is metaphysically possible, there is a possible world at which the microphysical properties of our world are not accompanied by the phenomenal properties of our world. So phenomenal properties like pains, vivid red sensations, and bitter tastes do not supervene on physical properties. It follows that there are properties in our world (pains, red sensations, etc.) that fail to supervene on physical properties—which is precisely what the materialist denies. The materialist must therefore deny that (P & ¬Q) is metaphysically possible: there is no possible world physically just like ours but lacking phenomenal properties. Step 7 simply states this materialist commitment: if (P & ¬Q) is possible, then materialism is false. And now we can simply rely on modes ponens to draw the conclusion (from 2, 6, and 7) that materialism is false about our world.

Chalmers' 2D argument against materialism has generated a vast critical literature. The 2D framework allows the basic conceivability argument to be formulated with great precision and the premises all have significant prima facie plausibility. Critics differ about where they take the argument to go wrong: premises 1, 2, 4 and 5 have all been challenged, and some critics challenge the validity of the argument. It's worth briefly noting how these challenges arise.

According to premise 1, phenomenal experiences exist. On the face of it, this claim seems obviously true. However, eliminative materialists contend that, on closer examination, the notion of phenomenal experience invoked by the argument smuggles in implicit theoretical commitments that are incoherent, empirically unsatisfiable, or at least not justifiable on the basis of simple observation (e.g., Dennett 1988).

Premise 2 is a more frequent target for critics. There are two different reasons why one might reject the claim that the zombie hypothesis, (P & ¬Q), is apriori coherent. Some theorists argue that causal relations are crucial to determining the reference of phenomenal terms. Analytic functionalists, for instance, hold that phenomenal predicates like ‘pain’ can be defined apriori by the causal role pains play in commonsense psychology (e.g., Lewis 1966, 1980). Other theorists argue that nothing can count as a pain unless it is appropriately causally related to our judgments about pain (e.g., Shoemaker 1999; Perry 2001). If these theorists are right, then the zombie hypothesis is not apriori coherent after all, for the microphysical facts captured by ‘P’ will fix all of the causal facts relevant to the truth of ‘Q’. Other theorists would reject the claim that the zombie hypothesis is apriori coherent because they reject the notion of apriority altogether (e.g., Quine 1951; Stalnaker1999; Williamson 2007).

Premise 4 is another controversial step in the argument. The modal rationalist thesis that every apriori coherent sentence describes a genuine metaphysical possibility has been challenged in a number of different ways (e.g., Hill and McLaughlin 1999; Loar 1999; Shoemaker 1999; Yablo 1999; 2000b; Schroeter 2004). In response to such critics, Chalmers argues that there are no clear counterexamples to the modal rationalist thesis and that the thesis provides a simple and compelling interpretation of the point of modal discourse (Chalmers 1999, 2002a).

It's also possible challenge premise 5, which asserts the semantic stability of the basic phenomenal and microphysical terms used in ‘P’ and ‘Q’. If the subjunctive intensions associated with terms like ‘pain’ or ‘quark’ vary depending on contingent facts about the actual world, then the move from the epistemic possibility of zombies to their metaphysical possibility will be blocked. Some theorists claim that phenomenal predicates like ‘pain’ are unstable in this way (e.g., Block & Stalnaker 1999; Yablo 2000b). However, Chalmers argues (i) that his main anti-materialist conclusions do not depend essentially on the stability of phenomenal terms like ‘pain’[1] and (ii) that his main anti-materialist conclusions survive if physical terms are unstable.[2]

Instead of challenging its premises, one might object to the form of Chalmers' argument. Some critics argue that while premises 1 and 2 are acceptable when considered individually, the combination of the two is question-begging (Braddon-Mitchell 2003; Hawthorne 2002; Stalnaker 2002). Roughly, the worry is that the zombie hypothesis, (P & ¬Q), is apriori coherent only if we assume that phenomenal properties satisfy certain abstract theoretical presuppositions. So the acceptability of premise 2 requires a theoretical conception of phenomenal terms like ‘pain’. But if one accepts this understanding of phenomenal terms, it's no longer empirically obvious that any phenomenal properties are actually instantiated in our world. So our empirical justification for premise 1 is compromised. By treating both premises as certain, critics claim, Chalmers' argument implicitly presupposes that our world is not a purely physical world.[3]

See (Chalmers 2009) for further elaboration of his 2D argument, extensive discussion of objections to it, and comparison with related conceivability arguments against materialism. See also the entries on zombies and rigid designators.

Copyright © 2012 by
Laura Schroeter <>

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