Notes to The Theory of Two Truths in India

1. There are various theories proposing the date of the Buddha's birth. On this issue, there is no unanimity among traditional and modern Buddhist scholars. Most of the sources agree that the Buddha had a life-span of eighty-years. The precise date of his birth although remains problematic.

2. The Sarvāstivāda ontology classifies all the objects of knowledge within five basic categories: matter (rūpa), primary minds, secondary minds (caitta), (iv) non-associated composite phenomena which are neither matter nor associated with minds or mental factors (citta-caitta-viprayukta-saṃskāra) and (v) non-contingent or unconditioned phenomena (asaṃskṛta).

3. Dravya is also a central concept in the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika tradition. There is a fundamental distinction to be drawn between dravya as a “foundational entity” in the Sarvāstivāda and dravya as “substance” in the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika tradition. Substance denotes the objective reality of things, it exists in and of itself, is self-subsistent.

4. The Sautrāntika system has two subschools: the scruptulist (sūtra-followers) and the logicians. Sautrāntika, literally means one who follows the sūtras—the words of the Buddha. Although all Buddhist schools follow the words of the Buddha, here we use the term to refer to a more specific system of thought, namely a subschool within the Sautrāntika. The other subschool stresses on following logic and reasoning.

5.The terms svalakṣaṇa is variously rendered into English as “own-natured,” “self-defining characteritics,” “unique particular,” “real particular” etc. Notice here a crucial distinction between this Sautrāntika and the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika theory of particular (viśeṣa) wherein “particulars are seen as enabling us to perceive things as different from one another.

6. The the Nyāya-Vaiśesṣika takes the fire universal, the property of being a fire “fireness” as real, eternal and ubiquitous inhering in all particulars that instantiates it.

7. The term sāmānya-lakṣaṇa has been variously translated as “generally characterised,” “generally defined,” and “universal”, or “generality.”

8. Buddhist philosophers (Theravādins, Vaibhāṣika and Sautrāntikas) and Hindu philosophers (Sāṁkhya-Yoga, Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika, Pūrva Mīmāṁsā) claim that the atoms of the physical objects are ultimate reals and argue, in contrast with Yogācārin, that in perception we have either the external objects as the basis of our mental representations or that we directly perceive the external objects as the presentative.

9. The Sanskrit text cited here is based on the edition by Yoshiyasu Yonezawa: “Vigrahavyāvartanī, Sanskrit Transliteration and Tibetan Translation,” Journal of Naritasan Institute for Buddhist Studies 31 (2008: 209–333). Input by K. Wille (Göttingen, Germany)

10. Nāgārjuna's Mūlamadhyamakakārikā is known to have at least eight Indian commentaries, four of which are preserved in Tibetan translation—commentary by Buddhapālita know simply Buddhapālitavṛtti, Bhāvavevika's Prajñapradīpa (Lamp), Candrakīrti's Prasannapadā (Clear Words), and commentary called Akutobhyayā—and four of which are not preserved in Tibetan translation are those of Devaśarman, Guṇamati, Guṇaśrī, and Sthiramati.

11. Bhāviveka is another way to spell his name. See Malcolm D Eckel (2008: 88), Chr. Lindtner (1995: 37–65).

12. The ordination lineage found in the Tibetan sources such as George N. Roerich's The Blue Annals (Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1976) tells us Śāntarakṣita is a disciple of Jñānagarbh.

13. Changkya (1989: 254–255) makes this point, which I think is a noteworthy since Yogācāra Svātantrika Madhyamaka only adopts Yogācāra's account of the conventional truth, but not its account of the ultimate truth. It rejects, even conventionally, Yogācāra's claim that the consciousness and the nondual reality are ultimately real. Blumenthal (2004: 172) however reads the two systems to mean Yogācāra and Madhyamaka. If Changkya's argument is correct, which I think he is, then Blumenthal's unspecified reading of the two systems might mislead the readers into thinking that the Yogācāra Svātantrika Madhyamaka takes onboard the entire system of Yogācāra idealism.

14. An earlier version of the neither-one-nor many argument appears in the work of Śrigupta, Jñāgarbha's teacher who is himself recognised to be Śāntarakṣita's teacher. Śrigupta advances the argument as follows: “In reality everything, both inside and out, is empty, because it is neither one nor many, like a reflection.” See Eckel, (1987: 22). Similarly Jetāri, Dharmakīrti etc., also employs this argument. See Blumenthal (2004: 61).

15. Śāntarakṣita on the pervasion of the neither-one-nor-many argument, see Blumenthal (2004: 137-139).

Copyright © 2011 by
Sonam Thakchoe <sonam.thakchoe@utas.edu.au>

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