Notes to Umar Khayyam

1. While the exact date of his birth is not known, Swami Govinda Tirtha mentions 439 AH, while Tabrizī in his Tarabkhānah mentions 455 AH as the likely date. Most scholars seem to accept the 439 AH as the probable date. See Tirtha (1941).

2. Some have suggested his death took place before 515 AH/1124 CE, but most contemporary scholars seem to think that 517 AH/1126 CE is a more likely date. For more information on his place of birth, see: Bayhaqī (1932/1351 AH), pp. 116–117.

3. For more information on his teachers, students see Aminrazavi (2007), pp. 21–23.

4. One may even find some inconsistencies between “The Light of the Intellect on the Subject of Universal Knowledge” and “On Existence.” Some scholars have considered “Response to Three Problems” and “The Necessity of Contradiction in the World, Determinism and Subsistence” to be part of the same treatise.

5. For Khayyām's cosmological arguments see Risālah fi'l-wujūd (p. 113) and Fi'l- kawn wa'l-taklīf (pp. 140–141).

6. For Khayyām's ontological argument see Fi'l-kawn wa'l-taklif, in Malik, 329.

7. H. N. Iṣfahānī (1380) identifies twenty-four principles which constitute the core of Khayyām's philosophical views.

8. For more information see Al-jawāb ‘an thulāth masā’il, in Farhang, 12/1–4 (2000/1378 A.H.s.): 167–68, and Ḍarurat al-taḍād fī’l-‘ālam wa'l-jabr wa'l-baqā’, 177.

9. For more information on these four theological positions see Al-Mabāḥith al-mashraqiyyah (Al-Razi, Fakhr al-Din, 1990, 128); and Al-Mawāqif (Iji, Adud al-Din, 1983, 48).

10. Traditionally, the word for “substance” has been “jawhar” but Khayyām uses “dhāt,” which is closer to essence.

11. Risālah ḍiyā’ al-‘aqli fī muḍū’ al-‘ilm al-kulīi. See also Malik, p. 371.

12. For information concerning a Sufi reading of Khayyām see: Naṣr (2001).

13. Translated to English in Amir-Móez (1963), and in Rashed and Vahabzadeh (2000); and into French in Rashed and Vahabzadeh (1999).

14. Translated into English in Kasir (1931); Winter and ‛Arafat (1950); and in Rashed and Vahabzadeh (2000). Translated into French in Woepcke (1851) and in Rashed and Vahabzadeh (1999). An account of Khayyām's solution of one of the types of cubic equation may be found in Berggren (1986), pp. 118–124.

15. Translated into English in Amir-Móez (1959) and Rashed and Vahabzadeh (2000), and into French in Rashed and Vahabzadeh (1999). See also the analysis in Vahabzadeh (1997).

Copyright © 2011 by
Mehdi Aminrazavi <maminraz@umw.edu>
Glen Van Brummelen <gvb@questu.ca>

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