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Values, such as liberty and equality, are sometimes said to be incommensurable in the sense that their value cannot be reduced to a common measure. The possibility of value incommensurability is thought to raise deep questions about practical reason and rational choice as well as related questions concerning topics as diverse as akrasia, moral dilemmas, the plausibility of utilitarianism, and the foundations of liberalism. This entry outlines answers in the contemporary literature to these questions, starting with questions about the nature and possibility of value incommensurability.
- 1. Value Incommensurability
- 2. Incomparability
- 3. Arguments for Value Incommensurability
- 4. Deliberation and Choice
- 5. Social Choices and Institutions
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- Related Entries
Incommensurability between values must be distinguished from the kind of incommensurability associated with Paul Feyerabend (1978, 1981, 1993) and Thomas Kuhn (1977, 1983, 1996) in epistemology and the philosophy of science. Feyerabend and Kuhn were concerned with incommensurability between rival theories or paradigms — that is, the inability to express or comprehend one conceptual scheme, such as Aristotelian physics, in terms of another, such as Newtonian physics.
In contrast, contemporary inquiry into value incommensurability concerns comparisons among abstract values (such as liberty or equality) or particular bearers of value (such as a certain institution or its effects on liberty or equality). The term “bearer of value” is to be understood broadly. Bearers of value can be objects of potential choice (such as a career) or states of affairs that cannot be chosen (such as a beautiful sunset). Such bearers of value are valuable in virtue of the abstract value or values they instantiate or display (so, for example, an institution might be valuable in virtue of the liberty or equality that it engenders or embodies).
The term “incommensurable” suggests the lack of a common measure. This idea has its historical roots in mathematics. For the ancient Greeks, who had not recognized irrational numbers, the dimensions of certain mathematical objects were found to lack a common unit of measurement. Consider the side and the diagonal of a square. These can be compared or ranked ordinally, since the diagonal is longer. However, without the use of irrational numbers, there is no way to specify with cardinal numbers exactly how much longer the diagonal is than the side of a square. The significance of this kind of incommensurability, especially for the Pythagoreans, is a matter of some debate (Burkert 1972, 455-465). Hippasus of Metapontum, who was thought by many to have demonstrated this kind of incommensurability, is held by legend to have been drowned by the gods for revealing his discovery (Heath 1921, 154; von Fritz 1970, 407).
Given these historical roots, some authors reserve the term “incommensurable” for comparisons that can be made, but not cardinally (Stocker 1980, 176; Stocker 1997, 203) or not precisely (Chang 1997b, 2). Others interpret the idea of a common measure more broadly. On this broader interpretation, for there to be a common measure, all that is required is that ordinal comparisons or rankings are possible. Values are then incommensurable only when not even an ordinal comparison or ranking is possible. Unless stated otherwise, this entry adopts this latter interpretation.
Because the idea of comparison is closely tied to the topic of value incommensurability, this has led to use of the term “incomparable” alongside “incommensurable” in the literature. Some authors use the terms interchangeably (e.g., Raz 1986). Others use them to refer to distinct concepts (e.g., Chang 1997b). This entry distinguishes between the two concepts in the following manner.
Joseph Raz defines two bearers of value as incommensurable if it is false that of the two “either one is better than the other or they are of equal value” (1986, 342). Raz offers an example in which a person faces the choice between two equally successful careers: one as a lawyer and one as a clarinetist. Neither career seems better than the other, and they also do not appear to be equally good. If they were of equal value, then a slightly improved version of the legal career would be better than the musical career, but this judgment appears incorrect. The legal career and the musical career, according to Raz, are incommensurable.
Ruth Chang has proposed use of the term “incomparable” to describe the legal career and the musical career (1997b, 4). Two bearers of value are held to be incomparable if no positive comparative judgment of their value is true. Positive comparative judgments of value specify the way in which two items compare (e.g., “better than”) rather than the way in which two items do not compare (e.g., “not better than”) in virtue of some value.
Drawing on Chang’s proposal, this entry uses the term “incomparable” ordinarily to describe two or more concrete bearers of value of which no positive comparative evaluative judgment is true. In contrast, this entry uses the term “incommensurable” to describe the way in which two or more abstract values stand in relation to one another. Subsection 3.1 considers in greater detail the relationship between the incomparability of bearers of value and the incommensurability of values. The remainder of section 1 considers ways in which to conceive of incommensurable values.
This section outlines three conceptions of value incommensurability, each one capturing some sense in which incommensurable values lack a common measure.
The first conception characterizes value incommensurability in terms of restrictions on how the further realization of one value outranks realization of another value. James Griffin has proposed forms of value incommensurability of this sort. One form involves what he calls “trumping.” In a conflict between values A and B, A is said to trump B if “any amount of A, no matter how small, is more valuable than any amount of B, no matter how large” (Griffin 1986, 83). A weaker form of value incommensurability involves what Griffin calls “discontinuity.” Two values, A and B, are incommensurable in this sense if “so long as we have enough of B any amount of A outranks any further amount of B; or that enough of A outranks any amount of B” (Griffin 1986, 85).
If values are incommensurable in this first sense, there is no ambiguity whether the realization of one value outranks realization of the other. Ambiguity as to whether the realization of one value outranks realization of the other, however, is thought by many theorists to be a central feature of incommensurable values. The second and third conceptions of value incommensurability aim to capture this feature.
According to the second conception, values are incommensurable if and only if there is no true general overall ranking of the realization of one value against the realization of the other value. David Wiggins, for example, puts this forward as one conception of value incommensurability. He writes that two values are incommensurable if “there is no general way in which A and B trade off in the whole range of situations of choice and comparison in which they figure” (1997, 59).
This second conception of value incommensurability denies what Henry Richardson calls “strong commensurability” (1994, 104-105). Strong commensurability is the thesis that there is a true ranking of the realization of one value against the realization of the other value in terms of one common value across all conflicts of value. A denial of such a singular common value, however, does not rule out what Richardson calls “weak commensurability” (1994, 105). Weak commensurability is the thesis that in any given conflict of values, there is a true ranking of the realization of one value against the realization of the other value in terms of some value. This value may be one of the values in question or some independent value. This value also may differ across value conflicts. The denial of strong commensurability does not entail a denial of weak commensurability. Even if there is no systematic or general way to resolve any given conflict of values, there may be some value in virtue of which the realization of one value ranks against realization of the other. Donald Regan defends the thesis of strong commensurability (Regan 1997). Depending on how the relationship between value incommensurability and incomparability is construed (subsection 3.1), Ruth Chang could be considered a defender of weak commensurability. She argues that “nameless values” combine values in a way that allows for the comparability of alternatives in virtue of these nameless values (Chang 2004).
The third conception of value incommensurability denies both strong and weak commensurability (Richardson 1994, Wiggins 1997, Williams 1981). This conception claims that in some conflicts of values, there is no true ranking of values.
This third conception of value incommensurability is sometimes said to be necessary to explain why, in conflicts of value, a gain in one value does not always cancel the loss in another value. This view assumes that, whenever there is a true ranking between the realization of one value and the realization of another value, the gain in one of the values cancels the loss in the other. Many commentators question that assumption. This entry leaves open the possibility that when there is a true ranking between the realization of one value and the realization of another value, the gain in one of the two values need not cancel the loss in the other.
If we accept this possibility, a number of questions arise. One question is what a ranking of realizations of values means if a gain in one value does not cancel the loss in the other. A second question is whether the first and second conceptions of value incommensurability each admit of two versions: one version in which the gain in one value cancels the loss of the other and one version in which it does not. A third question concerns the relation between value incommensurability and tragedy. It may be thought that what makes a choice tragic is that, no matter which alternative is chosen, the gain in value cannot cancel the loss in the other value. Not all authors, however, regard all value conflicts involving incommensurable values as tragic (Richardson 1994, 117). Wiggins, for example, reserves the second conception of value incommensurability for what he calls “common or garden variety incommensurable” choices and the third conception for what he calls “circumstantially cum tragically incommensurable” choices (1997, 64).
Rather than focus on commensurability between abstract values, a number of authors focus on the comparability between concrete bearers of value, often in the context of choice (Broome 1997, 2000; Chang 1997, 2002; Griffin 1986; Raz 1986). Bearers of value sometimes appear incomparable in cases like Joseph Raz’s example of the choice between careers (described above in subsection 1.2).
The case for incomparability in such examples relies in part on what Ruth Chang calls the “Small Improvement Argument” (Chang 2002b, 667). As noted in the initial discussion of the example, if the legal and musical careers were of equal value, then a slightly improved version of the legal career would be better than the musical career, but this judgment appears incorrect. The Small Improvement Argument takes the following general form: “if (1) A is neither better nor worse than B (with respect to V), (2) A+ is better than A (with respect to V), (3) A+ is not better than B (with respect to V), then (4) A and B are not related by any of the standard trichotomy of relations (relativized to V)” where V represents the relevant set of considerations for purposes of the comparison (Chang 2002b, 667-668). In addition to Raz, Ronald de Sousa and Walter Sinnott-Armstrong are among those who have advanced the Small Improvement Argument (De Sousa 1974; Sinnott-Armstrong 1985).
Focusing on the incomparability of bearers of value has given rise to two lines of inquiry in the literature. The first concerns the relation between incomparability and vagueness. The second concerns the range of comparative relations that can hold between two items. This section summarizes debate within each line of inquiry. The relation between incomparability of bearers of value and incommensurability of values will be addressed in subsection 3.1.
Raz distinguishes incomparability from what he calls the “indeterminacy” of value. Recall that Raz defines two bearers of value as incomparable if and only if it is not true that “either one is better than the other or they are of equal value.” The indeterminacy of value is a case of vagueness: it is neither true nor false of two items that “either one is better than the other or they are of equal value.” Raz regards the indeterminacy of value to result from the “general indeterminacy of language” (1986, 324).
In contrast, other philosophers argue for interpreting incomparability as vagueness (Griffin 1986, 96; Broome 1997, 2000). For example, Broome introduces what he calls a “standard configuration” (1997, 96; 2000, 23). Imagine the musical and legal careers from Raz’s example. Fix the musical career as the “standard.” Now imagine variations in the legal career arranged in a line such that in one direction, the variations are increasingly better than the standard and in the other direction, the standard is increasingly better than the variations. There is an intermediate zone of legal careers that are not better than the standard and such that the standard is not better than the legal careers. If this zone contains one item, Broome defines this legal career to be equally good with the standard. If this zone contains more than one item, the zone is either one of “hard indeterminacy” or one of “soft indeterminacy.” A zone cannot be both one of hard indeterminacy and one of soft indeterminacy. In a zone of hard indeterminacy, it is false that the legal careers are better than the standard and false that the standard is better than the legal careers (1997, 73, 76). In a zone of soft indeterminacy, it is neither true nor false that the legal careers are better than the standard and neither true nor false that the standard is better than the legal careers (1997, 76). The latter is a zone of vagueness. Broome argues that indeterminate comparatives, including “better than” are softly indeterminate, thereby arguing for interpreting incomparability in terms of vagueness.
By understanding incomparability to entail vagueness, Broome disagrees with Raz (Broome 2000, 30). Raz defines incomparability so that it is compatible with vagueness, but not so that it entails vagueness. Griffin also argues that incomparability entails vagueness (1986, 96). Where Broome disagrees with Griffin is with regard to the width and significance of the zone of soft indeterminacy. Broome takes Griffin to suggest that if there is a zone of soft indeterminacy, it is narrow and unimportant. Broome argues that vagueness need not imply either narrowness or lack of importance (2000, 30-31). Erik Carlson (2004) provides one response to Broome’s account.
The second line of inquiry concerns the set of possible comparative relations that can obtain between two items. The small improvement argument for the incomparability of the musical career and the legal career in Raz’s example assumes what Chang calls the “trichotomy thesis.” The trichotomy thesis holds that if two items can be compared in terms of some value or set of values, then the two items are related by one of the standard trichotomy of comparative relations, “better than,” “worse than,” or “equally good” (2002b, 660). A number of authors have argued that these three comparative relations do not exhaust the space of comparative relations. If they are correct, the musical career and the legal career may, in fact, be comparable.
James Griffin and Derek Parfit argue that items may in fact be “roughly equal” and hence comparable (Griffin 1986, 80-81, 96-98, and 104; 1997, 38-39; 2000, 285-289; Parfit 1987, 431). As an illustration, Parfit imagines comparing two poets and a novelist for a literary prize (1987, 431). Neither the First Poet nor the Novelist is worse than the other and the Second Poet is slightly better than the First Poet. If the First Poet and the Novelist were equally good, it would follow that the Second Poet is better than the Novelist. This judgment, according to Parfit, need not follow. Instead, the First Poet and the Novelist may be roughly equal. The intuition is that even though three items display the respects in virtue of which the comparisons are made, some comparisons are inherently rough so that even though two alternatives are not worse than one other, they are not equally good. In turn, the musical and legal careers in Raz’s example may be roughly equal.
“Roughly equal,” as used here, is to be distinguished from two other ways in which the term has been used: (1) to refer to a small difference in value between two items and (2) to refer to a choice of little significance (Raz 1986, 333). As used here, two items A and B are said to be roughly equal if neither is worse than the other and C’s being better than B does not imply that C is better than A when the comparisons are all in virtue of the same set of respects.
There is some debate as to whether “roughly equal” is in fact a fourth comparative relation to be considered in addition to the three standard relations, “better than,” “worse than,” and “equally good.” One way to conceive of “roughly equal” is as a “roughed up” version of “equally good.” On this interpretation, the trichotomy thesis basically holds; there are simply precise and rough versions (Chang 2002b, 661, fn. 5). Furthermore, “roughly equal” is a relation that can be defined only in virtue of three items, and as such, appears to be something distinct from a standard comparative relation. The standard comparative relations are binary; transitivity with respect to them is a separate condition (Hsieh 2005, 195).
A separate proposal for a genuine fourth relationship is Ruth Chang’s argument for “on a par” (Chang 1997; Chang 2002b). Two items are said to be on a par if neither is better than the other, their differences preclude their being equally good, and yet they are comparable. Whereas “roughly equal” is invoked to allow for comparability among alternatives that display the same respects (e.g., literary merit), “on a par” is invoked to allow for comparability between alternatives that are different in the respects that they display. Imagine comparing Mozart and Michelangelo in terms of creativity. According to Chang, neither Mozart nor Michelangelo is less creative than the other. Because the two artists display creativity in such different fields, however, it would be mistaken to judge them to be equally creative. Nevertheless, according to Chang, they are comparable with respect to creativity. Something can be said about their relative merits with respect to the same consideration. According to Chang, they are on a par.
Chang’s argument relies on invoking a continuum that resembles Broome’s standard configuration. Chang asks us to imagine a sequence of sculptors who are successively worse than Michelangelo until we arrive at a sculptor who is clearly worse than Mozart in terms of creativity. Chang then brings to bear the intuition that “between two evaluatively very different items, a small unidimensional difference cannot trigger incomparability where before there was comparability” (2002b, 673). In the light of this intuition, because Mozart is comparable to this bad sculptor, Mozart is also comparable to each of the sculptors in the sequence, including Michelangelo.
Whether “roughly equal” or “on a par” imply comparability is a matter of some debate. “Roughly equal” and “on a par,” for example, are intransitive, so to recognize them as distinct comparative relations would require us to reconsider the transitivity of comparative relations (Hsieh 2007). Some authors suggest that one of the three standard comparative relations obtains between all items that are claimed to be incomparable, roughly equal, or on a par (Regan 1997). In the case of “on a par,” Joshua Gert has argued that it can be defined in terms of the three standard comparative relations (2004). Another view is that values can be “clumpy,” meaning that the values sort items into clumps. According to this view, once we recognize the way in which the relation “equally good” functions in the context of clumpy values, items that appear to require “roughly equal” or “on a par” can be judged equally good (Hsieh 2005).
After determining what incommensurability and incomparability are, the next step is to assess the arguments for and against these possibilities. That is the task of this section.
The most direct argument against the possibility that values are incommensurable is based on value monism (e.g., Mill 1979 and Sidgwick 1981). Donald Regan, for example, argues that “given any two items (objects, experiences, states of affairs, whatever) sufficiently well specified so that it is apposite to inquire into their (intrinsic) value in the Moorean sense, then either one is better than the other, or the two are precisely equal in value” (Regan 1997, 129).
This argument has been questioned. Ruth Chang, for example, points out, with reference to John Stuart Mill, that values may have both qualitative and quantitative aspects such that a single value may have qualitative dimensions that give rise to incomparability (Chang 1997b, 16-17).
For purposes of this entry, it will not be assumed that value monism rules out incomparability of bearers of value. The additional assumption required for value monism to rule out incomparability is that the single value serves as a complete common measure for comparing any two bearers of value. A common measure is complete if and only if for any two alternatives that display the respects that comprise the common measure, it is true that some positive value judgment holds true in virtue of that list of respects.
In any case, many philosophers argue for some form of value pluralism (Berlin 1969, Finnis 1981, Nagel 1979, Raz 1986, Stocker 1990, Taylor 1982, Williams 1981). Although this entry will not assume value pluralism, most philosophers who argue for incommensurability or incomparability are value pluralists, so it will be simpler to present their views by talking of separate values.
In the choice between the musical and legal careers in Raz’s example, each career appears to be favored by different considerations. In the case of the musical career, such considerations may include those of aesthetic value, whereas in the case of the legal career, such considerations may include the value in serving one’s fellow citizens. If these values were commensurable, it seems that the careers would be comparable. In this manner, the incomparability of bearers of value has been taken to support the possibility that values are incommensurable.
Three sorts of objections have been raised against this line of reasoning. First, as noted in subsection 2.2, some authors object on epistemic grounds to the case for incomparability (e.g., Regan 1997). These authors point out that the evaluative judgments involved in proposed examples of incomparability are complex, involving multiple considerations. In turn, we may be mistaken when we make the judgment of two items that neither is better than the other nor are they equally good. Instead, it may be that one of the three standard comparative relations obtains between the items in question.
The second objection begins with the claim that one can always specify a set of relevant considerations in virtue of which a comparison can be made. Chang, for example, writes “in choosing between two careers, various considerations are relevant … if, indeed, there is no further single consideration that combines those considerations, we can simply stipulate one, for example, ‘goodness of career,’ which is nothing more than a list of the various relevant considerations” (2002b, 667). In turn, if we acknowledge the possibility that items thought incomparable are, in fact, comparable by way of “roughly equal” or “on a par,” then it would appear that “goodness of career” serves as a common measure against which to compare the musical and legal careers in Raz’s example. There is no lack of a common measure.
One response to this objection is to distinguish between the way in which people rank bearers of value when they judge them to be “roughly equal” or “on a par” and the way in which people rank bearers of value when they judge them to be “equally good.” In the case of equally good items, the choice of either is justified because the gain involved in choosing one item is supposed to fully cancel the loss in not choosing the other item. In the case of “roughly equal” or “on a par,” however, it is not clear that this must be the case. Items that are “roughly equal” or “on a par” are valuable in virtue of different respects; the value realized in choosing one item may not cancel the loss in not choosing the other. Bearers of value may be “roughly equal” or “on a par” with respect to some set of values even though the values display a central feature of incommensurable values—namely, that the gain in one value does not cancel the loss in another.
The question then arises whether bearers of value can be comparable even though the values they bear are incommensurable. If so, it may be said that what distinguishes a list of respects, such as “goodness of career,” from a common measure is that it is only in the case of a common measure that the gain in one value cancels the loss in another. In a comparison with regard to a list of respects, it may be said, the gain in one respect need not cancel the loss in another respect.
The third objection points out that even if we do not accept the comparability of the musical and legal careers in Raz’s example, some versions of the musical career and legal career appear comparable. In John Broome’s account discussed in subsection 2.1, the initial musical career is comparable with particularly bad legal careers. The comparison between the initial musical career and a bad legal career is an example of what Chang refers to as a “nominal-notable comparison”—a comparison between a fine exemplar of a value and a poor exemplar of a value (1997b, 14). Given that the comparisons involve the same set of considerations, does the ability to rank some careers suggest that the values involved in the initial comparison are in fact commensurable so there is, in fact, a common measure?
This question arises in part because the way in which the musical career is judged better than the bad legal career does not appear to be a case of dominance. In a case of dominance, one alternative is better than another with respect to at least one of the values against which the comparison is made and worse with respect to none. Insofar as dominance is not thought to rely on there being a common measure, ranking by way of dominance need not rule out the incommensurability of values. The judgment that the musical career is better than the bad legal career, however, does not appear to be a case of dominance. The musical career may be judged better than the bad legal career even though the bad legal career is better than the musical career in some respects. For example, the bad legal career may be better than the musical career with respect to the value of protecting the legal rights of fellow citizens. This suggests that the judgment is in virtue of a common measure. Regan, for example, uses an argument along these lines to challenge the possibility that values are incommensurable (1997, 135).
One response to this third objection is that comparability in the case of nominal-notable comparisons need not rule out the incommensurability of values. As noted at the outset of this section, the incomparability of bearers of value is taken to suggest that the values they bear are incommensurable. As long as there are some cases in which bearers of value are incomparable, even if bearers of value are comparable in the case of nominal-notable comparisons, the conditions for value incommensurability are satisfied.
It may be objected that just because some careers are incomparable with respect to “goodness as a career” in Raz’s example, we should not rule out “goodness as a career” as a common measure. According to this view, it is a mistake to assume that for a list of respects (e.g., “goodness of career”) to serve as a common measure, it must be “complete”—meaning that for any two alternatives that display those respects, it is true that some positive value judgment holds true in virtue of that list of respects.
In response, it is not clear what is gained for the analysis of value incommensurability by calling “goodness as a career” a common measure. First, calling “goodness as a career” a common measure for comparing the legal and musical careers would change neither the judgment that one career is not better than the other nor the judgment that they are not equally good. The general phenomenon remains the same. Second, lack of completeness can arise for a number of different reasons. The concept of value incommensurability aims to capture what underlies the lack of completeness in comparisons between alternatives such as the legal and musical careers. Also, there might be other ways to capture the lack of completeness.
A second argument for incommensurable values is grounded in the idea that value incommensurability is constitutive of certain goods and values. In keeping with the usage in this entry, in some instances, “constitutive incomparability” is perhaps a more appropriate term than “constitutive incommensurability.” The reason for this is that the case for constitutive incommensurability of values often relies on the apparent incomparability of specific bearers of value. Two versions of this second argument will be discussed here.
One version of this argument comes from Joseph Raz. Consider being offered a significant amount of money to leave one’s spouse for a month. The indignation that is typically experienced in response to such an offer, according to Raz, is grounded in part in the symbolic significance of certain actions (1986, 349). In this case, “what has symbolic significance is the very judgment that companionship is incommensurable with money” (1986, 350). Although this form of value incommensurability looks like trumping, Raz does not see this as a case of trumping. He rejects the view that companionship is more valuable than money. If such a view were correct, then those who forgo companionship for money would be acting against reason (1986, 352). Instead, Raz takes the view that a “belief in incommensurability is itself a qualification for having certain relations” (1986, 351). Someone who does not regard companionship and money as incommensurable simply has chosen a kind of life that may be fulfilling in many ways, but being capable of having companionship is not one of them.
In Raz’s account, the symbolic significance of judging money to be incommensurable with companionship involves the existence of a social convention that determines participation in that convention (e.g., marriage) that requires a belief in value incommensurability. This conventional nature of belief in value incommensurability in Raz’s account raises a question for some authors about its robustness as an account of value incommensurability. For example, Chang objects that incommensurability appears to become relative to one’s participation in social conventions (2001, 48). It remains an open question how much of a problem this point raises. Raz’s account appears to illustrate a basic sense in which the values of money and companionship can be incommensurable. Insofar as it is not against reason to choose money over companionship, there is no general way to resolve a conflict of values between money and companionship. In Raz’s account, the resolution depends upon which social convention one has chosen to pursue.
Elizabeth Anderson advances a second argument for constitutive incommensurability. Her account is grounded in a pragmatic account of value. Anderson reduces “‘x is good’ roughly to ‘it is rational to value x,’ where to value something is to adopt toward it a favorable attitude susceptible to rational reflection” (1997, 95). She argues that in virtue of these attitudes there may be no good reason to compare the overall values of two goods. Pragmatism holds that if such a comparison serves no practical function, then the comparative value judgment has no truth value, meaning that the goods are incommensurable (1997, 99). Because the favorable attitudes one adopts toward goods help to make them good, Anderson’s account can be seen as an argument for constitutive incommensurability (Chang 2001, 49).
Anderson advances three ways in which there may be no good reason to compare the overall values of goods. First, it may be boring or pointless to engage in comparison. To illustrate, “the project of comprehensively ranking all works of art in terms of their intrinsic aesthetic value is foolish, boring, and stultifying” (1997, 100). Second, Anderson points to instances in which “it makes sense to leave room for the free play of nonrational motivations like whims and moods” as in the choice of what to do on a leisurely Sunday afternoon (1997, 91). Third, Anderson argues that the roles that goods play in deliberation can be so different that “attempts to compare them head to head are incoherent” (1997, 91). Imagine that the only way to save one’s dying mother is to give up a friendship. Rather than compare their overall values, argues Anderson, ordinary moral thinking focuses on what one owes to one’s mother and one’s friends (1997, 102). This focus on obligation recognizes mother and friend each to be intrinsically valuable and yet valuable in different ways (1997, 103). There is no good reason, according to Anderson, to compare their overall values with regard to some common measure.
Chang argues against each of the three points raised by Anderson (Chang 2001). In response to the first point, Chang notes there are occasions in which comparisons do need to be made between goods for which Anderson argues there is no good reason to make comparisons. In response to the second point, Chang argues that the range of instances for which the second argument applies is small. In response to the third point, Chang contends that Anderson’s argument assumes that if goods are comparable then they have some value or evaluative property in common. Chang points out that this need not be the case. As discussed above in subsection 3.1, the comparability of goods need not entail value commensurability.
Value incommensurability has also been invoked to make sense of a central feature of supposed moral dilemmas—namely, that no matter which alternative the agent chooses, she fails to do something she ought to do. Although moral dilemmas involve choices between concrete bearers of value, the apparent value conflicts involved in these choices have led some philosophers to relate moral dilemmas to the incommensurability of values. Henry Richardson, for example, takes the situation confronting Sophie in the novel Sophie’s Choice—that one of her two children will be spared death, but only if she chooses which one to save—to point to the incommensurability of values (1994, 115-117).
It has been argued that the mere fact of a moral dilemma does not imply value incommensurability. James Griffin, for example, argues that the feature of “irreplaceability” in moral dilemmas often may be mistaken as evidence for value incommensurability (1997, 37). Irreplaceability is the feature that what is lost in choosing one alternative over another cannot be replaced by what is gained in choosing another alternative. Although a conflict of incommensurable values displays this feature, not all instances of irreplaceability need involve plural values. Some moral dilemmas, for example, may involve not a conflict of values, but a conflict of obligations that arises from the same consideration. Consider forced choices in saving lives. If there is a dilemma, it need not involve conflicting values, but rather conflicting obligations that arise from the same consideration. Walter Sinnott-Armstrong calls such dilemmas “symmetrical” (1988, 54-58). The dilemma encountering Sophie, it may be said, does not point to the incommensurability of values.
Richardson acknowledges that the moral considerations underlying Sophie’s dilemma are not incommensurable. Nonetheless, he takes value incommensurability to be essential to understanding the tragedy of the dilemma that Sophie encounters. “It is a distinguishing feature of love, including parental love,” he writes, “that it cherishes the particular and unique features of the beloved” (115). He concludes, “the fact that she cannot adequately represent each child’s value on a single scale is what makes the choosing tragic” (116). By locating the incommensurability of values at the level of what is valuable about each of her children, Richardson argues that the tragedy of the dilemma points to value incommensurability.
Another common approach to argue for value incommensurability is with reference to “non-symmetrical” dilemmas. As the name suggests, in non-symmetrical dilemmas, the alternatives are favored by different values (Sinnott-Armstrong 1988). If these values are incommensurable in the third sense as discussed in subsection 1.3, there is no systematic resolution of the value conflict. Consider Jean-Paul Sartre’s well-known example of his pupil who faced the choice between going to England to join the Free French Forces and staying at home to help his mother live (Sartre 1975, 295-296). No matter which alternative he chooses, certain values will remain unrealized. An idea along these lines is considered, for example, by Walter Sinnott-Armstrong (1988, 69-71) and Bernard Williams (1981, 74-78) in their discussions of moral dilemmas.
Value incommensurability also features in debates about akrasia (Nussbaum 2001, 113-117). David Wiggins, for example, invokes the idea of value incommensurability to suggest “the heterogeneity of the psychic sources of desire satisfaction and of evaluation” (1998, 266). This heterogeneity, according to Wiggins, allows for a coherent account of the agent’s attraction to what is not best. It allows for a divergence between desire and value such that the akratic individual can be attracted to a value that should not be sought at that point in time. Wiggins invokes value incommensurability to capture the idea that a gain in the value that should not be sought does not reduce the loss in choosing what is not best.
In contrast, Michael Stocker denies that value incommensurability is required for a coherent account of akrasia (1990, 214-240). For Stocker, coherent akrasia is possible with a single value in just the way that it is possible to be attracted to two objects that differ with respect to the same value (e.g., “a languorous lesser pleasure and a piquant better pleasure” (1990, 230)). Recall the discussion of quantitative and qualitative aspects of a single value at the outset of section 3.
As suggested by the discussion of moral dilemmas and akrasia, much of the inquiry into value incommensurability is motivated more generally by theories of practical reason and rational choice. Some authors have argued that the possibility of value incommensurability raises problems for the possibility of justified choice in conflicts between incommensurable values. Even if a conception of justified choice can accommodate value incommensurability, questions remain about how to justify choice on the basis of incommensurable values and how to reason about incommensurable values. This section considers these issues as they have been discussed in the contemporary philosophical literature.
It is worth noting the potential for drawing connections between the philosophical literature and the literature in psychology and the social sciences on decision-making. One area for such potential is the psychological literature on the difficulty of making decisions (Yates, Veinott, and Patalano 2003). Jane Beattie and Sema Barlas (2001), for example, advance the thesis that the observed variation in the difficulty of making trade-offs between alternatives can be explained in part by the category to which the alternatives belong. The authors consider three categories: commodities (“objects that are appropriately bought and sold in markets”), currencies (“objects that act as stand-ins for commodities”), and noncommodities (“objects that either cannot be transferred (e.g., pain) or that lose some of their value by being traded in markets (e.g., friendship)”) (Beattie and Barlas 2001, 30). The authors’ experimental findings are consistent with participants holding normative commitments about exchanging currencies and noncommodities similar to those considered in the discussion of constitutive incommensurability in subsection 3.2. For example, Beattie and Barlas report that participants “had a significant tendency to choose noncommodities over commodities and currencies” and that choices between noncommodities and currencies were the easiest for participants (2001, 50-51). The authors interpret these results to support the view that people choose noncommodities over currencies on the basis of a rule without engaging in a calculation of trade-offs (2001, 51-53).
At a minimum, for the choice of an alternative to qualify as justified, there must not be an overriding reason against choosing it. Beyond that, conceptions of justified choice differ in what is required for the choice of an alternative to qualify as justified.
Ruth Chang defines “comparativism” as the view that “a comparative fact about the alternatives determines which alternative one is justified in choosing” (1998, 1572). A common form of comparativism is “optimization.” According to optimization, the fact that an alternative is at least as good as each other alternative is what justifies its choice. If one accepts the trichotomy thesis (subsection 2.2), an alternative is at least as good as another if and only if it is equally good or better than it. If one accepts the possibility of “on a par” as a genuine fourth relation (subsection 2.2), then an alternative that is at least as good as another is also on a par with it. Optimization is most frequently associated with an economic conception of rational choice and decision theory. Chang associates optimization even more widely with “most forms of consequentialism, some versions of virtue theory, and, arguably, certain forms of deontology” (1998, 1577-1578). If value incommensurability gives rise to the incomparability of alternatives as discussed in subsection 3.1, then value incommensurability precludes the possibility of justified choice under optimization.
One response has been to argue that apparently incomparable alternatives are, in fact, comparable. As discussed in subsection 2.2, judgments of incomparability frequently involve comparisons that are difficult and it may be that judgments of incomparability are mistaken (Regan 1997). In addition, as discussed, alternatives that appear incomparable by way of “better than,” “worse than,” or “equally good” may be comparable by way of some fourth comparative relation, such as “roughly equal” or “on a par.” It also has been argued that “nameless values” combine values in a way that allows for comparability of alternatives in virtue of these nameless values (Chang 2004).
Another line of response, one from within the economics literature, has been to distinguish between “optimization” and “maximization” as theories of justified choice (Sen 1997, 746; Sen 2000, 486). According to the theory of optimization as justified choice, the choice of an alternative is justified only if the alternative is at least as good as each other alternative. In contrast, the theory of maximization as justified choice only requires the choice of an alternative that is not worse than other alternatives. Because incomparable alternatives are not worse than one another, the choice of either is justified according to the theory of maximization as justified choice. If proponents of comparativism have no reason to reject maximization as an account of justified choice, as has been argued (Hsieh 2007), then incomparability, and value incommensurability, need not pose a problem for the possibility of justified choice.
One objection voiced against accounts that permit justified choice between alternatives that are roughly equal or on a par or between incomparable alternatives is that such accounts may justify a series of choices that leaves a person worse off. Consider Raz’s example of career choice. Suppose the person chooses the musical career over the legal career. At a future time, she has the opportunity to pursue a legal career that is slightly worse than the initial legal career. Suppose this slightly worse legal career and the musical career are judged roughly equal or on a par. If justified choice permits her to choose either of two alternatives when they are roughly equal or on a par, then she would be justified in choosing the slightly worse legal career. Similarly, if justified choice does not require the comparability of alternatives, she could be justified in choosing the slightly worse legal career. Through a series of such apparently justified choices, she would be left significantly worse off in a manner analogous to a “money pump” (Chang 1997, 11).
One response is to question whether the problem posed by choices of this sort is serious. John Broome, for example, notes that after having chosen one kind of career, a person may change her mind and choose the kind of career she previously rejected. According to Broome, there would be a puzzle only if she did not repudiate her previous choice (2000, 34).
Another line of response is that the considerations that make some alternatives worthy of choice count against the constant switching among alternatives envisioned in this objection. First, the constant switching among alternatives is akin to not choosing an alternative. If the alternatives are such that choosing either is better than choosing neither, then the considerations that make the alternatives worthy of choice count against constantly switching among them. Second, to switch constantly among careers appears to misunderstand what makes the alternatives worthy of choice. Not only is pursuing a career the kind of activity that depends upon continued engagement for its success, but it is also the kind of activity that is unlikely to be judged truly successful unless one demonstrates some commitment to it. Third, for a career to be considered successful, it may require the chooser to adopt a favorable attitude toward the considerations that favor it over other careers. In turn, when subsequently presented with the choice of a legal career, the considerations favoring it may no longer apply to her in the same way as they did before (Hsieh 2007).
The idea expressed in the distinction between optimization and maximization in subsection 4.1 can be expressed more generally in terms of the idea of rational eligibility. To say that an alternative is rationally eligible is to mean that choosing it would not be an unjustified choice. Which alternatives are judged rationally eligible may vary with the theory of justified choice. According to maximization as a theory of justified choice, an alternative is rationally eligible if and only if there is no better alternative.
Issac Levi (1986; 2004) argues for “v-admissibility” as a criterion of justified choice. For v-admissibility, value incommensurability does not pose a problem for the possibility of justified choice. An alternative is v-admissible if and only if it is optimal according to at least one of the relevant considerations at hand. In some conflicts of value, maximization and v-admissibility specify the same alternatives as rationally eligible. Suppose that alternative X is better than alternative Y with respect to consideration A and alternative Y is better than alternative X with respect to consideration B. According to maximization as a theory of justified choice, both X and Y are rationally eligible; neither alternative is better than the other with respect to A and B taken together. Both alternatives are also rationally eligible according to v-admissibility; X is optimal with respect to A and Y is optimal with respect to B.
In some conflicts of value, maximization and v-admissibility specify different sets of alternatives as rationally eligible. V-admissibility is more restrictive than maximization (Levi 2004). Add to the above example alternative Z. Suppose that X is better than Z, which is better than Y, all with respect to A. Suppose also that Y is better than Z, which is better than X, all with respect to B. According to maximization as a theory of justified choice, X, Y, and Z are rationally eligible; no alternative is better than the other with respect to A and B taken together. However, Z is not rationally eligible according to v-admissibility. Z is not optimal with respect to A. Nor is it optimal with respect to B. Only X and Y are rationally eligible according to v-admissibility. According to Levi, v-admissibility captures what he takes to be a plausible judgment—namely, that it would be unjustified to choose the alternative that is second worse on all relevant respects (Levi 2004). The plausibility of this judgment might be questioned. Suppose that Z is only slightly worse than X with respect to A and Z is only slightly worse than Y with respect to B. Does the judgment still hold?
For Joseph Raz, value incommensurability also does not pose a problem for the possibility of justified choice (1997). If incommensurable values give us reasons to choose both alternatives, they are both rationally eligible from the perspective of justified choice. As such, the choice of either alternative is justified on the basis of reason.
One question that arises is this. If an agent has reason to choose either alternative and they are not equally good, what makes her choice of one alternative over another intelligible to her? For Raz, what explains the choice of one alternative over the other is the exercise of the will. By the will, Raz has in mind “the ability to choose and perform intentional actions” and “the most typical exercise or manifestation of the will is in choosing among options that reason merely renders eligible” (1997, 111).
John Finnis advances a similar view in response to the question of intelligibility. Finnis writes, “in free choice, one has reasons for each of the alternative options, but these reasons are not causally determinative. … No factor but the choosing itself settles which alternative is chosen” (1997, 220). In a choice between alternatives each favored by different, incommensurable values, even though there are reasons to choose both alternatives, because reasons are not causally determinative, the lack of a reason to choose one alternative over another need not render the choice unintelligible.
Donald Regan challenges this view. According to Regan, unless grounded in an adequate reason, “a decision to go one way rather than another will be something that happened to the agent rather than something she did” and hence be unintelligible to the agent herself (1997, 144). Suppose the agent has no more reason to choose one alternative over another and the choice, as suggested above, is settled by her wants. On Regan’s view, if the agent’s choice is to be intelligible to her, her wants must be grounded in reasons. Because she has no more reason to choose one alternative over another initially, the reasons grounding her wants must be available to her only after the initially relevant reasons are exhausted. This strikes Regan as implausible (1997, 150). Regan concludes that no choice between incommensurable values or incomparable bearers of value is intelligible in the ways suggested by Raz or Finnis.
A number of authors have argued that practical reason has available to it the resources to accommodate value incommensurability in ways that would appear to address the concern raised by Regan.
Charles Taylor outlines two such sets of resources. First, we are able to appeal to “constitutive goods that lie behind the life goods” our sense of which is “fleshed out, and passed on, in a whole range of media: stories, legends, portraits of exemplary figures and their actions and passions, as well as in artistic works, music, dance, ritual, modes of worship, and so on” (1997, 179). Second, we cannot escape the need to live an integrated life or to have this, at a minimum, as an aspiration (1997, 180). Given that a life is finite, leading a life involves an articulation of how different goods fit into it relative to one another. More generally, our lives take on a certain “shape” and this shape provides guidance in making choices in the face of value incommensurability (1997, 183). Michael Stocker similarly points out that alternatives are rarely considered in the abstract (1997). Instead, they are usually considered in concrete ways in which they are valuable—for example, as part of one’s life. Once considered in such concrete contexts, there are considerations according to which alternatives can be evaluated for purposes of justified choice. In his analysis of incommensurability, Fred D’Agostino discusses the role of social institutions in resolving value conflicts (2003).
Another resource that has been invoked is morality. Recall Elizabeth Anderson’s discussion of the example of the choice between saving the life of one’s mother and maintaining a close friendship. Anderson regards the attempt to invoke a comparison of values as incoherent from the perspective of practical reason. Instead, ordinary moral thinking focuses on the obligations one has to one’s mother and one’s friends. In turn, Anderson suggests that the obligations themselves will provide guidance (1997, 106). The availability of such resources to reason is independent of her theories of value and rationality. John Finnis also points to principles of morality as guiding reason in a way that does not depend upon comparing incommensurable values (1997). It remains an open question as to how wide a range of cases it is in which morality can provide such guidance.
One worry that may arise in appealing to such external resources is that they address the problem of value incommensurability by simply denying it. The shape of one’s life or the “constitutive goods that lie behind the life goods,” for example, would appear to be sources of value. Insofar as they provide a value against which to resolve the initial value conflict, it might be said that there was no problem of value incommensurability in the first place.
Two responses to this worry can be given. First, even if these external resources are a source of commensurating value, it does not follow that they provide a systematic resolution to value conflicts. Insofar as the shapes of people’s lives differ, the way in which two individuals resolve the same value conflict may be different. The fact that it may be consistent with reason to resolve the same value conflict in different ways points to the possibility of value incommensurability.
Second, in the case of moral considerations, there may not be any denial of value incommensurability. Moral considerations may provide guidance without comparing alternative courses of action with respect to a common measure (Finnis 1997, 225-226). Furthermore, some philosophers argue that the moral wrongness of certain actions is intelligible only in virtue of the incommensurability of values. For example, Alan Strudler argues that to deliberate about the permissibility of lying in terms of commensurable values is to misunderstand the wrong in lying (1998, 1561-1564).
Recall that value incommensurability was thought to pose a problem for justified choice in part because it gives rise to the possibility of incomparability among alternatives. In this light, it would appear that conceptions of justified choice that do not rely on comparisons avoid the problems posed by value incommensurability. Stocker aims to provide one such account of justified choice (1990; 1997). Two features help to distinguish his account. First, he argues for evaluating alternatives as “the best” in an absolute, rather than a relative, sense. Optimization and maximization rely on choosing “the best” in a relative sense: given the relevant comparison class, there is no better alternative. To be “the best” in an absolute sense, an alternative “must be, of its kind, excellent—satisfying, or coming close to, ideals and standards” (1997, 206). This is the sense, for example, in which a person can be the best of friends even if we may have even better friends. More generally, an alternative can be absolutely best even if there are better alternatives, and even if an alternative is relatively best, it may not be absolutely best. The second distinctive feature of Stocker’s account is his appeal to a good life, for example, or part of a good life or project. This appeal does not require the alternative to be the best for that life or project. Instead, the alternative need only be good enough for that life or project to qualify as a justified choice.
Stocker’s account of justified choice differs from the concept of “satisficing” as used in the economics and rational choice literature. Introduced into the economics literature by Herbert Simon (1955), satisficing is the process of choosing in which it is rational to stop seeking alternatives when the agent finds one that is “good enough” (Byron 2004). Where satisficing differs from Stocker’s account is that satisficing is instrumentally rational in virtue of a more general maximizing account of choice. In situations in which finding the best alternative is prohibitively costly or impossible, for example, satisficing becomes rational. In contrast, on Stocker’s account, choosing the alternative that is “good enough” is non-instrumentally rational (Stocker 2004).
Objections discussed in previous sections may be raised with respect to Stocker’s account. Suppose two alternatives are both good in an absolute sense and incommensurable. According to Stocker’s account, insofar as both alternatives are good enough for an agent’s life, the choice of either alternative appears justified. As discussed in subsection 4.2, Regan and others may object that the choice of either alternative is not intelligible to the agent. Also, the appeal to a good life may raise the worry discussed in subsection 4.4 that Stocker’s account addresses the problem of value incommensurability by simply denying it.
The topic of value incommensurability also arises in accounts that concern deliberation about ends. This section discusses two accounts.
The first account is by Henry Richardson (1994). Richardson argues for the possibility of rational deliberation about ends. According to Richardson, if value commensurability is a prerequisite for rational choice, choices involving conflicting values could be made rationally if each of the values were expressed in terms of their contribution to furthering some common end. This conception of choice treats this common end as the one final end relevant for the choice. According to Richardson, the idea that value commensurability is a prerequisite for rational choice seems to rule out rational deliberation about ends (1994, 15).
Richardson defends an account of rational deliberation about ends that does not depend upon value commensurability. In his account, rational deliberation involves achieving coherence among one’s ends. Briefly, coherence is “a matter of finding or constructing intelligible connections or links or mutual support among them and of removing relations of opposition or conflict” (Richardson 1994, 144). For Richardson, coherence among ends need not result in their being commensurable (1994, 180).
The second account is by Elijah Millgram (1997). Like Richardson, Millgram argues that value commensurability is not a prerequisite for deliberation. However, in contrast to Richardson, Millgram argues that practical deliberation results in the commensurability of ends (1997, 151). By this he means that through deliberation, one develops a coherent conception of what matters and a “background against which one can judge not only that one consideration is more important than another, but how much more important” (1997, 163). For Millgram, commensurating one’s ends is a “central part of attaining unified agency” (1997, 162).
Millgram proposes two ways in which deliberation results in the commensurability of ends. The first proposal is that one can learn what is important and how it is important through experience (1997, 161). The second proposal is that deliberation about ends is “something like the construction by the agent of a conception of what matters … out of raw materials such as desires, ends, preferences, and reflexes” (1997, 168). Millgram identifies an objection to each proposal and briefly responds to each.
The objection to the first proposal is this. If the incommensurability of ends can be resolved by experience, this suggests that the judgment of incommensurability reflects incomplete knowledge about the values expressed in these ends. In other words, experience seems to help only if the values expressed in these ends are themselves commensurable (1997, 168). Millgram responds as follows. The agent who uses her experience to develop a coherent conception of what matters is like the painter who uses her experience to paint a picture that is not a copy of an existing image. Even if the ends are commensurable in her conception of what matters, the values they reflect need not be commensurable just as the painting need not be an exact copy of an existing image.
The objection to the second proposal is this. The second proposal suggests that deliberation is not driven by experience, which places it in tension with the first proposal. Millgram responds by continuing the analogy with the painter. Imagine a painter who paints a picture that is not a copy of an existing image. Just because the painting is not a copy of an existing image does not mean there is no source of correction and constraint on it. Similarly, deliberation may involve the construction by the agent of a conception of what matters, but this does not imply that it is not informed or constrained by experience (1997, 168-169).
This discussion points to two areas of further inquiry that bear on the topic of incommensurability. First, does coherence among ends entail their commensurability? Second, leaving aside the issue of the commensurability of ends, more needs to be said about what is required to deliberate rationally about what matters when that deliberation involves incommensurable values.
As discussed above, social practices and institutions play a role in the inquiry into value incommensurability. They are claimed by some philosophers to ground the possibility of value incommensurability, as in the case of constitutive incommensurability (subsection 3.2), and to help resolve value conflicts, as in the case of providing external resources for practical reason (subsection 4.4). This section discusses additional areas in which considerations about social institutions intersect with the inquiry into value incommensurability.
To begin, some philosophers have pointed to a structural similarity between a single individual trying to choose in the face of incommensurable values and the process of incorporating the varied interests and preferences of the members of society into a single decision. The preferences of different individuals, for example, may be taken to reflect differing evaluative judgments about alternatives so that combining these different preferences into a single decision becomes analogous to resolving value conflicts in the individual case. Given this analogy, Fred D’Agostino has applied methods of decision-making at the social level from social choice theory and political theory to consider the resolution of value conflicts at the individual level (2003).
At the same time, Richard Pildes and Elizabeth Anderson caution against wholeheartedly adopting this analogy. The analogy, according to them, assumes that individuals already have rationally ordered preferences. Given value incommensurability, however, there is no reason to make such an assumption. In turn, Pildes and Anderson argue that “individuals need to participate actively in democratic institutions to enable them to achieve a rational ordering of their preferences for collective choices” (1990, 2177).
Value incommensurability also has been considered with respect to the law. Matthew Adler discusses the variety of ways in which legal scholars have engaged the topic of value incommensurability (1998). One question is whether the possibility of value incommensurability poses a problem for evaluating government policy options and laws, more generally. Some authors respond that it does not. Cass Sunstein, for example, argues that recognition of value incommensurability helps “to reveal what is at stake in many areas of the law” (1994, 780). According to Sunstein, important commitments of a well-functioning legal system are reflected in recognizing value incommensurability.
More generally, a number of scholars have focused on the relation between value incommensurability and the structure of social and political institutions. John Finnis, for example, takes the open-endedness of social life to render it impossible to treat legal or policy choices as involving commensurable alternatives (1997, 221-222). Michael Walzer’s account of distributive justice also relates value incommensurability to the structure of social and political institutions. According to Walzer (1983), different social goods occupy different “spheres,” each one governed by a distinct set of distributive norms. What is unjust is to convert the accumulation of goods in one sphere into the accumulation of goods in another sphere without regard for that second sphere’s distributive norms. Underlying Walzer’s account, it seems, is a commitment to a kind of constitutive incommensurability. Given its connection to the possibility of plural and incompatible ways of life, the concept of value incommensurability also plays a role in many accounts of political liberalism, including Joseph Raz’s account (1986) and Isaiah Berlin’s account (1969). It is the latter’s inquiry into the relation between incommensurable values and political institutions that can be credited with motivating much of the contemporary inquiry into value incommensurability.
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[Please contact the author with suggestions.]
For helpful discussions and comments, I would like to thank Rahul Kumar, Martin Sandbu, Alan Strudler, Kok-Chor Tan, and Sara Toomey. I owe a special debt of gratitude to Walter Sinnott-Armstrong for his support and for his extremely detailed comments and suggestions. I also would like to thank Jennifer Woo for research assistance.