Notes to Vasubandhu

1. Vasubandhu's dating is contested, though the present author feels that scholars such as Anacker (1998) and Deleanu (2006) have provided convincing resolutions to the most difficult problems (see Gold 2015). See Skilling (2000) and sources noted therein on the problem of authorship. Buescher (2013) reviews this literature from an opposing perspective.

2. Current scholarship not only calls into question the distinctiveness of the Sautrāntika school (Kritzer 2003), but also the solidity of the difference, once thought essential, between so-called “Śrāvaka” and “Mahāyāna” traditions up to and during Vasubandhu's lifetime. In this article there will appear evident continuities among works of Vasubandhu's that straddle this divide. These continuities are underlined in Gold (2015).

3. See the section on doctrinal positions and works for a discussion of this work and references to English translations. The abbreviation AKBh will be used herein to refer to Pradhan's (1967) Sanskrit edition.

4. These are the Twenty Verses (Viṃśatikākārikā & Viṃśatikāvṛtti), the Thirty Verses (Triṃśikākārikā), and the Three Natures Exposition (Trisvabhāvanirdeśa). See the section on doctrinal positions and works for references to English translations.

5. Since Vasubandhu's works span so many different systems, this article will not attempt to enumerate his doctrinal positions. The purpose here is to focus on philosophical arguments, and among those, to emphasize the most influential and noteworthy passages. For instance, instead of enumerating the various kinds of causes, conditions, and results that, as the Treasury explains, are accepted in the Kashmiri Vaibhāṣika system, this article focuses on Vasubandhu's uses of causal argumentation, such as his definition of the real as what is implicated in causality, and his disproof of conceptually-constructed entities such as the “self” based upon this definition. If this presentation may be said to privilege the Sautrāntika and Yogācāra elements in Vasubandhu's writings, that is only because these are the traditions to which he dedicated the lion's share of his philosophical energies.

6. Anacker (1998) neatly interweaves the traditional biographies. This section should be understood as selected highlights emphasizing what is most relevant to philosophical interpretation. Takakusu (1904) provides a translation of Paramārtha's biography of Vasubandhu. Butön's is the earliest known Tibetan version (Obermiller 1931–32).

7. Skilling (2000, p. 298 n. 2) lists the important sources in the dispute stemming from Frauwallner's thesis. See especially Frauwallner (1951) and Jaini (1958). Recent additions to the controversy are Buescher (2013) and Gold (2015).

8. Hirakawa et al (1973) trace continuity from the AKBh to the late Yogācāra works, via intermediate works such as the Karmasiddhiprakaraṇa and the Pañcaskandhaprakaraṇa. A similar, but more philosophically-grounded, transition is traced in Anacker (1972).

9. See Kritzer (2003 & 2005). In response, Park (2007) argues that Vasubandhu's ostensibly Yogācāra doctrines are in fact drawing upon a broader movement.

10. Admittedly, Vasubandhu did put, in the verses, a number of instances of the word kila, meaning “so they say,” to indicate contentious doctrinal points. Yet he only explains his disagreements in the commentary.

11. Tzohar (2013, Other Internet Resources) provides a detailed, annotated bibliography of available resources on Vasubandhu, including studies of all of the works mentioned here. For a survey of the issue of authorship, see Skilling (2000) and sources mentioned therein. Skilling argues for a common authorship of all of the texts mentioned here, except for the Maitreya commentaries, which he says he has not had the chance to consider. Skilling also includes the Gāthāsaṃgraha texts, and he specifically mentions the Pratītyasamutpādādivibhaṅganirdeśa, where I simply note sūtra commentaries, of which this is one. See Nakamura (1987) for a complete listing of works attributed to Vasubandhu in the Chinese and Tibetan canons.

12. Louis de la Vallée Poussin's French translation from the Chinese (1923–25) is one of the great monumental accomplishments of the field of Buddhist Studies. Subsequent to his translation, an original Sanskrit manuscript was discovered in Tibet by Rāhula Sāṃkṛtyāyana, and edited separately by Pradhan (1967; herein AKBh) and Śāstrī (2008). English translations based upon the Sanskrit include, for the first chapter Hall (1983), and for the ninth chapter Kapstein (2001a) and Duerlinger (2003). Pruden (1988-90) is an English translation of Poussin's French translation of the Chinese translation(s) of Vasubandhu's Sanskrit. Appropriate caution should be taken with regard to any close readings.

13. What is “best known” is of course somewhat arbitrary, but given the most likely readership of this encyclopedia, I mean here what is most often written about by modern, English language philosophers. All three have been discovered and edited in Sanskrit manuscript (Lévi 1925; herein Viṃś) and translated repeatedly. Available in English are the translations of all three texts in Anacker (1998) and Kochumuttom (1982), of the Twenty Verses and the Three Natures Exposition in Tola & Dragonetti (2004), and of the Three Natures Exposition alone in Tola & Dragonetti (1983) and Wood (1991) and, from the Tibetan, Garfield (2009).

14. These have all been translated by Anacker (1998).

15. This text has been studied by Cabezón (1992), Nance (2012), Skilling (2000) and Verhagen (2005).

16. This section is a summary analysis of AKBh, Ch. IX, relying primarily upon the work of La Vallée Poussin (1923–25), Kapstein (2001a), Duerlinger (2003), Siderits (2003), and Goodman (2009a). Each of these sources may be used to fill in gaps here.

17. Vasubandhu generally accepts not two, but three valid means of knowledge (pramāṇa): perception (pratyakśa), inference (anumāna) and valid testimony (śabda). He will turn to scriptural supports for his no-self view in a later section, so here he relies only upon the first two.

18. Given the complex arguments that Buddhists have engaged in around the issue of self-cognition, it is of interest that here Vasubandhu simply states, without argument, that we can perceive the mind directly. See Yao (2005) and Williams (1998).

19. Vasubandhu provides this correlation in the Treasury of the Abhidharma (I.14–15, Hall 1983: 80ff), and in his Explanation of the Five Aggregates (Anacker 1998: 72).

20. Here “substance” is a translation of dharma and “quality” is a translation of dharmin. Buddhists reject substance/quality talk, but Vasubandhu believes that the personalists are attempting to recover this mistaken worldview through a back door. The quotation is from a section where Vasubandhu is directly countering a position of the Sāṃkhya school, which does accept such talk.

21. Readers familiar with Dennett (1989) will perhaps notice a resemblance.

22. Goodman (2009b) reads this, and the arguments above, as evidence of Vasubandhu as a determinist. This is a possible reading, and certainly Vasubandhu does not advocate the ordinary freedom attributed to a self. But also possible is that Vasubandhu here allows for a small degree of genuine optionality in the moment here translated as “willful effort” (cetanā), and an accumulation of such moments might produce meaningful change, as claimed by Gold (2015). Either way, like all Buddhists, he will want to preserve the notion that your state of suffering or liberation depends upon what you think and intend and do. See Meyers (2014) for a lucid treatment of these issues.

23. Griffiths (1991) is an excellent study of the Buddhist problem of continuity.

24. On momentariness, see von Rospatt (1995), Katsura (2003) and Bronkhorst (2006).

25. AKBh 193.2–8.

26. Schmithausen (2007) and Griffiths (1991) have both dedicated extensive research to this problem.

27. AKBh 196.6–199.10: IV.4abff. The word vijñapti is sometimes translated “informative” instead of “cognized” or “visible” or “manifest” because it is explained as “informing one about the intention” of a speaker or agent. The idea is that when you speak or move your body, your having acted intentionally is made apparent, whereas the actions in question here do not display the agent's intention.

28. Vasubandhu says this is the view of the badhanta, (AKBh 198.7), which La Vallée Poussin (Vol. III, p. 22) says P’ou Kouang says is Dharmatrāta.

29. See Katsura (2003) and Hayes (1988) on AKBh 101.19–102.17. Patil (2009) is a study of later Indian developments of this argument.

30. Bronkhorst (2006) argues that this penchant is a characteristic “episteme” of Indian thought in the early centuries of the first millennium CE.

31. Cabezon (1992), Nance (2012), Skilling (2000) and Verhagen (2005) have made important, recent contributions to the study of the Proper Mode of Exposition, and all agree that further work in this area is necessary.

32. Such a danger justifies the translation “nihilism,” because the false belief in the “destruction” (uccheda) of the mental series leads the believer to adopt moral nihilism. It should be noted, however, that this is a figurative, not a literal translation.

33. Here Vasubandhu might just mean that since the entities implicit in perception (sensory organs and sensory objects) are disproven by the falsity of the apparent world (which they seem to perceive), those who understand the latter will reject the belief in the former.

34. In addition to sources mentioned in the “Doctrinal Positions and Works” section, see Siderits (2007, pp. 146–173) for an insightful summary of the argument discussed in this section, and Kapstein (2001b) for a close analysis of the argument about perceptual objects.

35. Viṃś, p. 3). The translator's choice is difficult here; there seems to be no option that is not in some way misleading. The word vijñapti is the opposite of avijñapti, which was translated above as “invisible” in the discussion of “invisible physicality.” See note 27. Clearly, as Hall (1986) argues, Vasubandhu's claim is intended to exclude “invisible physicality” from possible existents.

36. Failure to appreciate this fact lies at the root of many of the most common critiques of Vasubandhu's argument, both traditional and modern. See, for instance Sarachchandra (1976) and Feldman (2005).

37. See Gold (2006a), and sources cited therein, for further discussion of Vasubandhu's use of the dream example.

38. This is what Siderits (2007, p. 157) calls Vasubandhu's use of the “Principle of Lightness,” or Occam's Razor. It may also be recast as a declaration that the doctrine of appearance-only solves the continuity problems associated with the causal relationship between physical and mental entities. See also the section on momentariness and continuity.

39. See Siderits (2007) and Kapstein (2001b) on these arguments.

40. Sthiramati's famous commentary on the Thirty Verses does include extensive philosophical defenses of the doctrines advanced in the verses. But Vasubandhu's own arguments, if he had any, are lost. The verses include only definitions and lists of terms. The Three Natures Exposition is also a systematic survey with none of Vasubandhu's (or anyone else's) commentarial defenses. It is possible, of course, that one or both of these works is/are misattributed to Vasubandhu. The Three Natures Exposition is certainly quite different in style from his other works. Philosophically, however, it follows quite logically from his other works.

41. Based on the Sanskrit and Tibetan editions of TSN.

42. See Gold (2006a) for detailed treatment of duality in early Yogācāra. See sources cited therein for a diversity of opinions on this complex topic.

43. Based on the Sanskrit and Tibetan editions of TSN. See D'Amato (2003), Garfield (2002, pp. 170-185), Gold (2006b) and Tzohar (2011) for this view's relevance for Yogācāra Buddhist philosophy of language.

44. Based on the Sanskrit of Viṃś, p. 3.

45. Griffiths (1994) chooses “mode of appearance” for ākāra, a translation that conveys the idea of an appearance that has no independent reality.

46. Bhāviveka, Candrakīrti and Śāntideva all leveled such arguments. See Eckel (2008) and Williams (1998).

47. It should be mentioned, however, that Vasubandhu never declared the unknowable “thing in itself” to be causally related to our perceptions. Vasubandhu might be said to have eluded Schopenhauer's critique of Kant that what causes our sensations might be posited as mind-independent. See also the entry on Arthur Schopenhauer in this encyclopedia.

48. Since Vasubandhu argues this based on the necessity that external objects be objects of perception, it might be possible to argue that Vasubandhu could allow some kind of external objects that are outside of the range of possible perception.

49. For this reason, Lusthaus (2002, p. 313, n. 66) is probably mistaken to express uncertainty as to the ultimate reality of real “things” (vastu) for Vasubandhu. Nothing genuinely real could fit into our ordinary categories of existence and non-existence; but a “thing” is an ordinary reality. It is important not to confuse doctrinal discussions of conventional realities with the ultimate. Yogācāra traditions include a number of categories of analysis—including various forms of physicality (rūpa)—in their doctrinal systems as merely conventional, but not ultimate realities (Gold 2006a, pp. 36–37 n. 70).

50. Lusthaus (2002) is primarily an investigation of Hsüan-tsang's commentary on Vasubandhu's Triṃśikā, and I am not arguing here that Lusthaus has misrepresented Hsüan-tsang's view in his analysis of Yogācāra as “phenomenology.” For a critique of Lusthaus's treatment of the question of idealism in Hsüan-tsang's Ch’eng Wei-shih lun, see Schmithausen (2005). I am concerned here only with Lusthaus's interpretation of Vasubandhu based on Sanskrit and Tibetan sources.

Copyright © 2015 by
Jonathan C. Gold <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free