#### Supplement to Hermann Weyl

## Weyl's metric-independent construction of the symmetric linear connection

Weyl characterizes the notion of a symmetric linear connection as follows:

**Definition A.1 (Affine Connection)** *Let*
*T*(*M*_{p}) *denote the tangent space
of* *M* *at* *p* ∈ *M**. A*
*point* p ∈ M *is affinely connected with its
immediate neighborhood, if and only if for every vector*
*v*_{p} ∈
*T*(*M*_{p})*, a vector at* *q*

viq∈T(M_{q}) =vip+dvip(44)

*is determined to which the vector*
*v*_{p} ∈
*T*(*M*_{p}) *gives* *rise under
parallel displacement from* *p* *to the infinitesimally
neighboring point* *q**.*

Of the notion of parallel displacement, Weyl requires that it satisfy the following condition.

**Definition A.2 (Parallel Displacement)** *The
transport of a vector* *v*_{p} ∈
*T*(*M*_{p}) *to an infinitesimally*
*neighboring point* q ∈ M *constitutes a parallel
displacement if and only if there exists a coordinate system*
x^{i}
*(called a* geodesic *coordinate system)* *for the
neighborhood of* *p* ∈ *M**, relative*
*to which the transported vector* *v*_{q} *possesses the same
components as* *v*_{p}*;* *that is,*

viq−vip=dvip= 0.(45)

The requirement that there exist a geodesic coordinate system such that (45) is satisfied, characterizes the essential nature of parallel transport.

It is natural to require that for an arbitrary coordinate system the
components *d**v**i**p* in (44) vanish whenever
*v**i**p* or *d**x**i**p*
vanish. Hence, the simplest assumption that can be made about the
components *d**v**i**p* is that they are linearly
dependent on the two vectors *v**i**p* and
*d**x**i**p*. That is, *d**v**i**p*
must be bilinear in *v**i**p* and in *d**x**i**p*;
that is,

dvip= −Γijk(x)vjpdxkp,(46)

where the *n*^{3} coefficients Γ*i**jk*(x)
are coordinate functions, that is functions of
*x*^{i} (i = 1, … , *n*), and the
minus sign is introduced to agree with convention.

The *v**j**p* and *d**x**k**p* in
(46) are vectors, but *d**v**i**p* =
*v**i**q* − *v**i**p* is
not a vector since the vectors *v**i**q* and
*v**i**p* lie in different tangent planes
and cannot be subtracted. Hence the coefficients Γ*i**jk*(x)
do not constitute a tensor; they conform to a linear but
non-homogeneous transformation law. The vector

viq=vip+dvip=vip− Γijkvjpdxkp

is called the *parallel displaced vector*.

Weyl (1918b, 1923b) proves the following theorem.

**Theorem A.3** *If for every point* *p*
*in a neighborhood* *U* *of* *M**, there
exists a geodesic* *coordinate system* x *such that the change
in the components of a vector under parallel transport to an
infinitesimally near point* *q* *is given*
*by*

dvip= 0,(47)

*then locally in any other coordinate system*
*x**,*

dvip= −Γijk(x)vjpdxkp,(48)

*where* Γ*i**jk*(x) = Γ*i**kj*(x)*,* *and
conversely.*

The idea of parallel displacement leads immediately to the idea of
the *covariant derivative* of a vector field. Consider a
vector field *v*^{i}(*x*) evaluated at two
nearby points *p* and *q* with arbitrary coordinates
*x*^{i} and *x*^{i} +
δ*x*^{i} respectively. A first-order Taylor
expansion yields

uiq=vip(x+ δx) =vip(x) +δ

∂ v^{i}∂ x^{j}xjp.(49)

If we set

δ

∂ v^{i}∂ x^{j}xjp= δvip(x),(50)

then

δ vip(x) =vip(x+ δx) −vip(x),(51)

and

uiq=vip+ δvip.(52)

The array of derivatives

∂ v^{i}∂ x^{j}

do not constitute a tensorial entity, because the derivatives are
formed by the inadmissible procedure of subtracting the vector
*v**i**p*(*x*) at *p* from the
vector *u**i**q* = *v**i**p*(*x* + δ*x*) at
*q*. Their difference δ*v**i**p*(*x*) is not a vector since
the vectors lie in the different tangent spaces
*T*(*M*_{p}) and
*T*(*M*_{q}), respectively. Since
δ*x**i**p* *is* a vector whereas
δ*v**i**p* is not, the array of derivatives

∂ v^{i}∂ x^{j}

in (50) cannot therefore be a tensorial entity. To form a derivative
that is tensorial, that is *covariant* or *invariant*,
we must subtract from the vector *u**i**q* =
*v**i**p* + δ*v**i**p* not
the vector *v**i**p*, but another vector
**at** *q* which “represents” the
original vector *v**i**p* as “unchanged” as we
proceed from *p* to *q*. Such a representative vector at
*q* may be obtained by *parallel* *transport* of
the vector *v**i**p* to the nearby point *q*,
and will be denoted, given an arbitrary coordinate system *x*,
by

viq=vip+dvip.(53)

Since *d**v**i**p* is the difference between
*v**i**p* and *v**i**q*,
*d**v**i**p* is also not a vector for the for
the reasons given above; however, the difference

u_{q}−v_{q}= vip+ δvip− [vip+dvip]= δ vip−dvip(54)

*is* a vector and is therefore a tensorial entity.

Figure 16: Covariant differentiation

The covariant derivative can now be defined by the limiting process

∇ _{k}vip= lim _{δxkp →0}

( vip+ δvip−vip−dvip)δ xkp= lim _{δxkp →0}

δ vip−dvipδ xkp= + Γ

∂ vip∂ x^{k}ijkvjp.(55)

In general, one writes the covariant derivative of a vector field
*v*^{i} simply as

∇ _{k}v^{i}= ∂_{k}v^{i}+ Γijkv^{j}.(56)

Weyl (1918b, §3.I.B) also provided a more synthetic argument to
establish the symmetry of the affine connection. He considers two
infinitesimal vectors *P**P*_{1} and *P**P*_{2} at a point *P*. The
vector *P**P*_{1} under parallel transport
along *P**P*_{2} goes into *P*_{2}*P*_{21}. Similarly,
the vector *P**P*_{2} under parallel transport
along *P**P*_{1} goes into *P*_{1}*P*_{12}. These
relationships are illustrated in figure 17

Figure 17: Symmetry of Parallel Transport

The condition imposed on parallel transport is that the four vectors
*P**P*_{1}, *P*_{1}*P*_{12}, *P**P*_{2} and *P*_{2}*P*_{21} form a
closed parallelogram; that is, the points *P*_{12} and
*P*_{21} coincide. It follows that

PP_{1}+P_{1}P_{12}=PP_{2}+P_{2}P_{21}.(57)

Denote the coordinates of *P**P*_{1} and *P**P*_{2} by
*d**x*^{i} and
δ*x*^{i}, respectively. The coordinates of
*P*_{2}*P*_{21} and *P*_{1}*P*_{12} are
respectively denoted by *d**x*^{i} +
δ*d**x*^{i} and
δ*x*^{i} +
*d*δ*x*^{i}. Substitution into (57)
yields

dx^{i}+ δx^{i}+dδx^{i}= δx^{i}+dx^{i}+ δdx^{i},(58)

or

dδx^{i}= δdx^{i}.(59)

From the assumption that the vectors transform linearly, one has

δ dx^{i}= −δγirdx^{r}anddδx^{i}= −dγirδx^{r}.(60)

From the assumption that the infinitesimal transformation
coefficients δγ*i**r* and *d*γ*i**r* are
of the same order as the corresponding differentials
δ*x*^{i} and
*d**x*^{i}, one obtains

δγ ir= Γirsδx^{s}and dγir= Γirsdx^{s}.(61)

Substitution of (60) and (61) into (59) yields

Γ ijk= Γikj.(62)