Notes to Wilhelm von Humboldt

1. There is a French translation of Humboldt's Parisian Diaries: Beyer, Elisabeth: Wilhelm von Humboldt. Journal Parisien (1797–1799). Solin/Actes Sud, 2001.

2. Humboldt's correspondence with the French linguist Abel-Rémusat has been published in France in an excellent edition by Jean Rousseau and Denis Thouard: Lettres Édifiantes et Curieuses sur la Langue Chinoise. Humboldt/Abel Rémusat (1821–1831). Villeneuve and Paris: Presses Universitaires du Septentrion, 1999.

3. There exist translations of this text into English, French, Italian, Japanese, Spanish and Polish.

4. This schema is preserved among Humboldt's unpublished linguistic papers at the Staatsbibliothek Preussischer Kulturbesitz in Berlin, call number Coll.ling.fol.146

5. On Goethe's notion of a protoplant (Urpflanze), see Olaf Breidbach, Goethes Metamorphosenlehre München, 2006: 33f, 106f.

6. The plan for this edition divides Humboldt's writings into seven (7) separate sections (or “Abteilungen”).

  • Section 1 is devoted to the early writings on aesthetics, philology, anthropology, cultural and natural philosophy, and on language.
  • Section 2 is to contain Humboldt's Basque studies
  • Section 3 his work on the American languages
  • Section 4 his writings on general linguistics.
  • Section 5 is devoted to Humboldt's work on specific problems in individual European and non-European languages.
  • Section 6 will contain Humboldt's work on the Pacific languages of the Austronesian language group and will include a critical edition of the Kavi-Work.
  • Section 7 is devoted to Humboldt's scholarly and linguistic correspondence with European and non-European personalities that will provide valuable insight into the historical and disciplinary contexts of his work.

So far 6 volumes have appeared, see Works.

The edition is published by the Schöningh Verlag, Paderborn, Wien, and Zürich and produced under the auspices of the Berlin-Brandenburg Academy of Sciences (Berlin-Brandenburgische Akademie der Wissenschaften). The project is sponsored by the Deutsche Forschungsgemeinschaft (German Research Council). See the Other Internet Resources for the website of the editorial working group.

Copyright © 2016 by
Kurt Mueller-Vollmer
Markus Messling <>

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