Notes to Wilhelm Maximilian Wundt

1. William James saw an inverse ratio between Wundt’s productivity and wisdom:

He aims at being a Napoleon of the intellectual world. Unfortunately he will never have a Waterloo, for he is Napoleon without genius and with no central idea….

Whilst they make mincemeat of some of his views by their criticisms, he is meanwhile writing a book on an entirely different subject. Cut him up like a worm, and each fragment crawls; there is no noeud vital in his mental medulla oblongata, so that you can’t kill him all at once. (Letter to Carl Stumpf, 6 Feb. 1887 in James 1920: 263; Quoted in Perry 1935: 68; cited in Boring 1950: 346)

2. The most complete bibliography of Wundt’s works is by his daughter, Eleonore (E. Wundt 1927), reprinted in Rieber and Robinson 2001. All translations of Wundt’s writings in this article are by the author.

3. Cf. Boring for a more nuanced account of Wundt’s revisions of his system (e.g., Boring 1950: 326).

4. See, for example, the numerous recent articles on Wundt in History of Psychology and History of Behavioral Psychology. According to the current consensus, the once-dominant representations of his work by E.B. Titchener and Titchener’s student, E.G. Boring, have been discredited as one-sided or insufficiently informed by Wundt’s own writings (see, e.g., Blumenthal 1979). Cf. Kusch 1995: 249.

5. Boring calls this text “the most important book in the history of modern psychology” (Boring 1950: 322).

6. For an excellent overview of Helmholtz’s work, see Boring 1950: 297–315. For Wundt’s relation to Helmholtz, see Wundt 1920: 155–169.

7. Boring 1950: 323–4. In fact, William James had established a psychological “laboratory” at Harvard in 1875 (Ben-David and Collins 1966: 455). By 1890, Boring writes, Wundt “had proved that [a psychological laboratory] could be productive. The researches were increasing and the facts were piling up” (Boring 1950: 325).

8. Notably from the U.S.: the “majority of the first generation of experimentalists in America” studied with Wundt: G. Stanley Hall, J.M. Cattell (an expert inventor of apparatus), E.W. Scripture, Frank Angell, E.B. Titchener, G.M. Stratton, and C.H. Judd. Wundt’s student, Hugo Münsterberg, became the first director of the psychological laboratory founded at Harvard by William James (Thompson and Robinson 1979: 425). For more detail on the influence of German academic psychology on the establishment of the field in the United States, see especially Ben-David and Collins 1966: 457, ff.

9. Sluga 1993: 7, 112. Sluga writes that Max was in his “rabidly nationalist and racist ideas [and] … conservative and even reactionary social policies” “far to the right of his father”.

10. Still, as Sluga reminds us, “Wundt nevertheless continued to counsel moderation and completely rejected the goals of German annexationists” (Sluga 1993: 105).

11. See Kusch 1995: 193, ff., on his intervention against the “pure philosophers’” petition.

12. Of course, as Wundt points out, there are limits or thresholds below which we cannot sense, and above which the sensory apparatus itself breaks down. Weber’s ratio holds true anywhere within those limits.

13. There is some confusion as to what precisely is “Weber’s Law”. As Boring writes, Weber himself never formulated a “law”, but merely reported,

that the smallest perceptible difference between two weights can be stated as a ratio between the weights, …independent of the magnitudes of the weights. (Boring 1950: 113)

It was Fechner who later named this relation “Weber’s Law”, except that Fechner used it to name a different equation from \[ \Delta I/I=k \] namely one resulting from several permutations of his own Fundamentalformel—a generalization of \[ \Delta I/I=k \] As Boring points out, the name “Weber’s Law” should be reserved for this simple formula (Boring 1950: 287).

14. Cf. esp. Ben-David and Collins 1966: 463; Hall 1912: 326. Wundt often describes this triangulatory development by contrasting the physiological, the psychophysical, and the psychological (e.g., L III: 164, ff.).

15. “All experimental methods of psychology appeal to physiology for support, since they can never ignore the physiological stimuli [Einwirkungen] upon the organism or its physiological reactions” (L III: 219). Yet Kusch quotes Wundt: “Experimental psychology [can]not be equated with physiology” (Kusch 1995: 154; Kusch cites Wundt 1920: 314). The context is unclear; Wundt generally does identify the two.

16. By “immediate phenomena”, Wundt means such as “do not require mediation through external processes” (L I: 6).

17. This is not to suggest that Wundt does not have a notion of “Seele”: yet he sees it as merely one side—the “inner perspective”—of one and the same unity whose “outer perspective” is the body (Leib) (PP II: 648).

18. But conscious phenomena also include what Wundt calls the “products of consciousness”, i.e., external cultural artifacts such as language, myth, and custom. These latter form the theme of what Wundt calls Völkerpsychologie, or “social psychology”, and are discussed in Section V. In this division of mental (geistig) phenomena, Wundt seems to follow the Hegelian opposition of subjective Geist and its “objectifications” (cf. Ringer 1969: 300).

19. Wundt goes on to list several other ways in which what we might call the “autoimmunity” of our mental representations can remain untainted: focusing on memories, rather than the phenomena themselves, and excluding from inquiry involuntary and obscure processes from study (L III: 162–3).

20. Wundt’s conception of self-observation is not always consistent. Whereas he generally understands it to be a method of focused attention, when it comes to observing the associative processes prior to the activity of apperception (see below), he says that it “is necessary to suppress as much as possible the activity of will, and passively give oneself over to the play of the emerging representations” (PP II: 437).

21. The best source for these is Wundt’s PP. Many accounts of the experiments and apparatus used are also available in the issues of Wundt’s journal, Philosophische Studien; in Hearst 1979a; in Rieber 1980; and in Rieber and Robinson 2001.

22. Hearst is somewhat misleading when he writes that “psychology’s central interest since Wundtian times” was the “study of sensory processes;” this study had been almost the exclusive topic of scientific psychological research for most of the nineteenth century (Hearst 1979b: 29 [italics added]; cf. Littman 1979: 39–40). Boring writes:

Goethe, Purkinje, Johannes Müller, E.H. Weber, and later Fechner, A.W. Volkmann and Helmholtz, all worked out the laws of their own experiences as they were consequent upon stimulation, and the last named five carefully controlled the stimulation. Newton long before had discovered the laws of color mixture in the same way. (Boring 1950: 80)

23. “Wundt distinguished between ‘physical’ and ‘mental causality’, and claimed that ‘no connection of physical processes can ever teach us anything about the manner of connection between psychological elements’ (Wundt 1894: 43)” (Kusch 1995: 134).

24. This kind of perspectivism, which is here expressed as a kind of “double-aspect” approach to the mind-body dichotomy, pervades Wundt’s thinking. Philosophy and the sciences more generally, he holds,

have essentially the same content, suggesting that it [is] merely the viewpoint from which this content [is] studied that distinguish[es] the two realms of knowledge. (Kusch 1995: 129)

Lastly, a perspectivism is evident in one aspect of Wundt’s so-called voluntarism, viz., the view that

different mental processes, like representing, feeling and wanting, were always mere aspects of a unitary event, and they were all equally basic; i.e., none could be derived directly from the other. (Kusch 1995: 136)

25. Cf. esp. PP II: 256. I say “sensations” rather than “sensation”, so as to avoid the possible misunderstanding that Wundt means we have a “faculty” or “power” of sensation.

26. Visual and tactile sensation-compounds moreover display a fourth feature of “spatiality” (räumliche Beschaffenheit) (PP I: 282).

27. They are more perspicuously expressed as \[ K=C(\Delta S/S) \] where \(\Delta S\) is the stimulus-increase necessary to be added to a given stimulus \(S\) in order to effect a just noticeable difference in sensation, \(k\), and \(C\) is a constant magnitude. This formula, given by Wundt, differs from the formula commonly given today: \[ \Delta I/I=k \] where \(\Delta I\) represents the difference threshold, \(I\) represents the initial stimulus intensity, and \(k\) signifies that the proportion on the left side of the equation remains constant, whatever the value of \(I\) (within a given range).

28. “…eigenthümliche Erregungsgesetze der Nervensubstanz…” (PP I: 390).

29. “[P]sychology is an empirical science co-ordinated with natural science, and the perspectives of both complement each other in such a way that only together do they exhaust the empirical knowledge open to us” (Wundt 1896b: 12, quoted in Kusch 1995: 133).

30. Wundt often uses the substantive, “Geschehen”, which does not admit of easy English translation. As a verb, “geschehen”, it means “to happen” or “to occur”, but “Geschehen” does not mean “a happening” or “an occurrence” (apt translations for the German “Geschehnis”). The closest one could come with a single word would be the gerundive forms, “happening” or “occurring”, where these are understood to mean a process continuing over time. To more clearly render this continuing sense, I will use a phrase like “flow of events”.

31. Cf. PP II: 256. Wundt reserves the term, representation, for compounds of sensations, and does not consider sensations themselves to be representations (cf. PP II: 3, nn. 1, 2).

32. This in turn can be either a “memory-picture [Erinnerungsbild]” or “imaginary representation [Einbildungsvorstellung]”. PP II: 1–2.

33. These “facts” include the many analyses contained in the first 250 pages of PP II, on auditory, visual, and tactile representations and the rules of their “fusion” (Verschmelzung).

34. Wundt’s choice of “apperception” must be compared with both Kant’s and Herbart’s very different uses of the term. Cf., e.g., Boring 1950: 256–7.

35. Even “passive” apperception, which, as Wundt writes, is not a generic difference but merely one of degree of activity (PP II: 277); passive apperception is akin to instinctive or unreflective willing, while active apperception is like the arbitrary action of the will (Willkürhandlung) (PP II: 278, 562).

36. L III: 145, 156, ff. Wundt strictly distinguishes his “psychological” voluntarism, which he believes is simply an expression of a phenomenological fact, from the “metaphysical” voluntarism promoted, say, by Schopenhauer (Wundt 1911a: 158).

37. Through, e.g., the associative functions of “assimilation, complication, and successive association” (PP II: 475–6). “Fusion” and “complication” are again terms Wundt borrows from Herbart (cf. Boring 1950: 258).

38. On Wundt on association and apperception, see PP II: 437, ff.; Eisler 1902: 51–8; König 1901: 103–7, 120–7, 156–60 (Boring 1950: 345–6).

39. “The phenomena in which this psychic process clearly appears are compound words. Every compound word indicates this psychological process [of agglutination], every word, that is, in which the combined word-units have still maintained independent meanings of which we remain conscious” (L I: 39).

40. Nevertheless, Wundt resists collapsing will and consciousness. He writes:

[N]o matter how much the will and the representational contents of consciousness mutually condition each other, we will nevertheless be forced by that developmental process to assign both a different meaning. In the will, the subject immediately grasps its own inner action [Handlung]; in the representational contents, [by contrast,] a reality distinct from the subject is reflected. Yet the relations that obtain between these two express themselves in feelings and emotions [Gefühle und Gemüthsbewegungen]. (PP II: 565)

41. See previous note.

42. Cf. Boring 1950: 321; but cf. 331; Thompson and Robinson 1979: 412–3. One reason for this confusion may have to do with Wundt’s evolution. Natorp, e.g., summarizes Wundt’s apparent development from a psychophysical dualism to a monism beginning with his 1873–4, which he compares with Wundt’s Grundriß der Psychologie (1896a). The position represented in the latter corresponds, according to Natorp, to Wundt’s later writings more generally, including the later editions of his 1874, as well as his Logik. The dualism expressed in the 1874 version of PP is not expressed as an opposition between mind and body, but as between “inner” and “outer” perception. In his 1896a, Wundt argues that

the definition of psychology as ‘science of inner experience’ is inadequate because it could awaken the misunderstanding that inner and outer experience have completely different objects, despite the fact that there is not a single natural phenomenon that is not at the same time, as a [mental] representation, an object of psychology. (Natorp 1912: 263–4; cf. esp. Boring 1950: 332)

Natorp quotes Wundt:

“There is no such thing as an inner sense that could, as an organ of psychic perception, be contrasted with the outer senses as the organs of the knowledge of nature [Naturerkenntnis]”. (Wundt 1896a: §1,1; quoted at Natorp 1912: 264)

43. This is, e.g., Boring’s position:

Wundt never held that the experimental method is adequate to the whole of psychology: the higher processes, he thought, must be got at by the study of the history of human nature, his Völkerpsychologie. (Boring 1950: 328)

A case has recently been made, however, that Wundt did not consider all völkerpsychologische phenomena to be in principle beyond the scope of experimentation (Greenwood 2003).

44. Wundt inherited the term from the Herbartian psychologists, Heymann Steinthal and Moritz Lazarus (cf. L III: 226, n.*). While it literally means “psychology of peoples”, it is translated as “social” or “cultural” psychology; Titchener’s translation, “folk psychology”, has an entirely different connotation in contemporary philosophy of mind and should be avoided.

45. Largely on the strength of the first two volumes of his Völkerpsychologie dealing with language, Wundt is considered the father of psycholinguistics. He explains that language is the “most important of cultural-psychological products [Erzeugnis]” (L III: 225), because

it expresses the lawfulness [Gesetzmäßigkeit] of thinking, [and] the different language types correspond to specific phases [Stufen] in the development of this basic spiritual function [geistige Grundfunktion]. (L III: 230)

For VP,

linguistic processes are merely a means by which it can first find the psychological laws of linguistic phenomena, and then to draw conclusions from these about the general connection of psychic processes. (L III: 228)

46. Wundt specifically distinguishes Völkerpsychologie from what he calls “ethnic characterology” (L III: 227); yet this is what he seems to have pursued in his 1915 book, obviously under the influence of war, on The Nations and their Philosophy. Sluga writes that this work

derived from [Wundt’s Völkerpsychologie], which was at best a doubtful undertaking but which, under the conditions of the time, served to lend recognition to all kinds of questionable speculations about the distinctive character of the German nation. (Sluga 1993: 105)

47. “In truth, psychology is as much an empirical science (Erfahrungswissenschaft) as physics and chemistry…” (PP I: 8).

48. It is just in this sense that it is right to say that Wundt

regarded psychology as the common basis for all scientific and cultural knowledge and the bond uniting all the individual sciences, and therefore as the “science directly preparatory to philosophy”. (Wellek 1967: 349)

Psychology is a preparatory part of philosophy, not a distinct science.

49. As discussed above, the natural and the spiritual aspects are distinguished according to whether they are mediated (via the senses) to consciousness, or are directly given. Thus natural science

seeks to determine the properties and reciprocal relations among objects, … thus abstract[ing] … from the subject…[, whereas] [p]sychology cancels that abstraction and thus … investigates experience in its immediate reality. (Wundt 1896b: 12, quoted from Kusch 1995: 133, slightly modified)

50. Cf. Kusch 1995: 132. More specifically, it is VP’s quest to

discern [Erkennen], in the spiritual evolution and earliest and simplest forms of [communal] life, the spiritual essence of humanity [das geistige Wesen des Menschen] and so too the basic precondition of historical life, (L III: 234)

that lets psychology found the historical sciences (L III: 227–8).

51. Logic “separates out of our manifold representational connections of consciousness those [representations] that have a legislative [gesetzgebenden] character for the development of our knowledge [Wissen]” (L I: 1).

52. Thus, for example, the Marburg neo-Kantians share with Wundt a conception of the relation of philosophy to the natural sciences, while Wundt distinguishes, like the Southwest School neo-Kantians between nomothetic (natural) and idiographic (historical) sciences. Later, Husserl, who like Wundt faced the task of simultaneously establishing a new method and object for philosophical inquiry, conceived his phenomenology as a “pure psychology” that would reveal the essential structures of consciousness through a meditative form of introspection or Wesensschau, by which Husserl held philosophy could attain the status of a rigorous science. Much research remains to be done on Wundt’s relation to Husserl.

53. See note 1, above.

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