William Stanley Jevons

First published Mon Jan 22, 2007

William Stanley Jevons (1835–1882) was an economist and philosopher who foreshadowed several developments of the 20th century. He is one of the main contributors to the ‘marginal revolution’, which revolutionised economic theory and shifted classical to neoclassical economics. He was the first economist to construct index numbers, and he had a tremendous influence on the development of empirical methods and the use of statistics and econometrics in the social sciences. His philosophy can be seen as a precursor of logical empiricism, but because of the peculiar form of his logic, he would not have may direct followers. His textbooks on logic were widely used in class and reprinted many times.

1. Biography

William Stanley Jevons was born in Liverpool on 1 September 1835. His father Thomas Jevons (1791–1855) was an iron merchant; his mother Mary Anne Roscoe (1795–1845) grew up in an intellectual and artistic milieu. The railway boom crisis of 1847 caused the bankruptcy of the family firm. William Stanley Jevons went to University College School in London in 1850, and in 1851 to University College. He studied chemistry under Graham and Williamson, two pioneers in the development of atomic theory and the theory of molecular motion. Another major influence at University College was Augustus De Morgan (1806–1871), with his courses on mathematics and logic. Jevons left University College without taking his degree. In 1854 he travelled to Melbourne, in order to become an assayer at the Australian mint. Jevons devoted much time to private study. His work covered many different areas: railway policy, meteorology, protection, land policy, cloud formation, gunpowder and lightning, geology, etc. Jevons left Australia in 1859 and returned to University College to complete his education. The early 1860s are important for Jevons' intellectual development, and he reports in his diary that he received significant insights in both economics and logic: a “true comprehension of value” (Black 1981: 120, La Nauze 1953) and the “substitution of similars” (Black & Könekamp 1972: 179).

Jevons received his MA degree in 1862, and was awarded the gold medal ‘in the third branch’ which included logic, moral philosophy, political philosophy, history of philosophy and political economy. In 1863 Jevons became a tutor at Owens College, Manchester, and in 1865 a lecturer in political economy and logic. In 1867 Jevons married Harriet A. Taylor, and they subsequently had three children. The family moved to London in 1876, on his taking up a chair at University College. Jevons' short life came to an end in 1882, when he drowned near Hastings.

2. The Laws of Thought

Like many representatives of 19th-century logic and philosophy of science, Jevons starts his investigation by examining the nature of the Laws of Thought. Jevons argues that these Laws are true both “in the nature of thought and things”. Given that science is in the mind and not in the things, the Laws of Thought seem to be purely subjective and only verified in the observation of the external world. However, Jevons argues that it is impossible to prove the fundamental laws of logic by reasoning, since they are already presupposed by the notion of a proof. Hence, the Laws of Thought must be presupposed by science as “the prior conditions of all thought and all knowledge”. Furthermore, our thoughts cannot be used as a criterion of truth, since we all know that mistakes are possible and omnipresent. Hence, we need to presuppose objective Laws of Thought in order to discriminate between correct and incorrect reasoning. It follows that Jevons regards the Laws of Thought as objective laws.

The fundamental mental powers for knowledge acquisition are the power to discriminate, to detect identity and to retain. The fundamental laws of thought are threefold: the Law of Identity, the Law of Contradiction and the Law of Duality. The first law is described as “Whatever is, is” and implies that a thing is always identical with itself. Jevons does not define the concept of “identity”, and tends to regard it as self-evident. The second law is the classical law of contradiction: “A thing cannot both be and not be”. The third law is the law of the excluded middle: “A thing must either be or not be.” Jevons suggests that these three laws are merely different aspects of one and the same Law, but considers it impossible to express this Law in less than three lines. His symbolic representation of these laws is as follows:

(1) A = A Law of Identity
(2) Aa = 0 Law of Contradiction
(3) A = AB ·|· Ab Law of Duality

The absence of a clear definition of ‘identity’ is striking, especially since Jevons recognises that there are different kinds and degrees of sameness. The main problem is then to point out a “sufficient degree of likeness or sameness”. The simplest form of inference is making use of a pattern, proxy, example or sample. If the sample “exactly represents the texture, appearance, and general nature” of a certain commodity, then what is true for the sample will also be true for the commodity as a whole. This approach evades defining similarity, as it presupposes that the sample is an ‘exact representation’ of the commodity whereas it is unclear under what conditions that would be the case. All processes of inference are based on the principle of substitution. All knowledge is derived from sensual experience, which implies that all knowledge is inductive. Deduction is the inverse process of induction, and both rely upon the nature of identity.

3. Logic

Like many other logicians of the 19th century, Jevons wants to establish clear links between mathematics and logic. He would like to derive mathematics from logic, which is based on the Laws of Thought, and in doing so he makes (a rather controversial) use of mathematical symbols when establishing his logical formalism. Jevons denotes terms by capital letters A, B, C, etc. and their negative counterparts by small italic letters a,b,c, etc. The relation of identity or sameness is represented by the sign ‘=’. The expression ‘A ~ B’ indicates that A and B are not identical with each other; ‘A § B’ indicates that there exists any relation between A and B, which includes but is not restricted to the relations of equality or inequality. The general formula of logical inference implies that from A = B § C we can conclude that A § C. Jevons defines the concept ‘term’ in his Pure Logic: “Term will be used to mean name, or any combination of names and words describing the qualities and circumstances of a thing”. Jevons distinguishes between the extent and the intent of a term or a name. “The objects denoted form the extent of meaning of the term; the qualities implied form the intent of meaning”. It follows that extent and intent of meaning are negatively correlated: when more qualities are added to the meaning of a term, less objects will correspond to that meaning. Abstract qualities, denoted by abstract terms, originate when objects are compared and resemblances and differences identified. Abstract terms possess only one kind of meaning. Substantial terms, such as ‘gold’, denote substances. Nothing is denoted by the symbol ‘0’, which in logic means “the non-existent, the impossible, the self-inconsistent, the inconceivable”. Jevons lists several “special laws” which govern the combination of terms. The “Law of Simplicity” implies that a term combined with itself has no effect, hence A = AA = AAA = etc. The law of commutativeness indicates that the order of the combination does not matter, hence AB = BA, ABC = ACB = BCA = etc.

The truths of science are expressed in the form of propositions. “Propositions may assert an identity of time, space, manner, quantity, degree, or any other circumstance in which things may agree or differ” (Jevons 1874: 36). Simple propositions A = B express the most elementary judgment regarding identity. The use of the mathematical symbol ‘=’ implies that the distinction between subject and predicate vanishes, which makes quantification of the predicate possible. Several logicians opted for what Jevons calls the “indeterminate adjective” ‘some’, represented symbolically by ‘V’. Jevons rejects the usage of indeterminate symbols and suggests that A = VB (All As are some Bs) should be written as A = AB. Propositions of this kind express an identity between a part of B and the whole of A.

Direct inference consists of applying the ‘substitution of similars’ to certain premises in order to arrive at logical conclusions. Jevons lists several forms of inference:

  • immediate inference
    (A=B implies AC=BC);
  • inference with two simple identities
    (B=A and B=C imply A=C);
  • with a simple and a partial identity
    (A = B and B = BC imply A = AC);
  • of a partial from two partial identities
    (A = AB and B = BC imply A = ABC);
  • of a simple from two partial identities
    (A = AB and B = AB imply A = B);
  • of a limited from two partial identities
    (B = AB and B = CB imply AB = CB);
  • and miscellaneous forms of deductive inference.

Jevons indicates that traditional syllogistic forms such as Barbara, Celarent, Darii etc. can be represented easily in his logical system. It is also convenient to represent more complicated cases, such as inferences derived from more than two premises.

Disjunctive propositions are used whenever an abstract term is ‘developed’ in its constituent parts or subclasses – whenever the extent of meaning of a term is explored. In order to represent disjunctive propositions, Jevons suggests to use the symbol ‘·|·’. The words ‘and’ and ‘or’, used in everyday language, can denote exclusive or inexclusive alternatives, but Jevons' symbol ‘·|·’ refers to alternatives that are not exclusive. The law of unity, A ·|· A = A, reveals an imperfect analogy between mathematics and logic. In his earliest work on logic Jevons used the symbol ‘+’ instead of ‘·|·’, but in The Principles of Science he recognises that the analogy between logic and mathematics is imperfect. Contemporaries such as Boole and Robertson were very critical towards Jevons's use of mathematical symbols in logic.

Indirect inference or indirect deduction consists of pointing out “what a thing is, by showing that it cannot be anything else”. According to Jevons this is an important method, since “nearly half our logical conclusions rest upon its employment”. The simplest form of indirect inference starts from A = AB. The law of duality implies that b = Ab ·|· ab, or by substitution b = ABb ·|· ab. Since ABb = 0 (a contradiction), it follows that b = ab. Hence, if a metal is an element, it follows that a non-element is a non-metal. Jevons refers to this conclusion as the “contrapositive proposition” of the original. The contrapositive of a simple identity A = B is a = ab, and since A = B implies B = A it also follows that b = ab. The two contrapositives taken together let us conclude that a = b. The method of indirect inference can be used to describe a class of objects or a term, given certain conditions. The class is first of all ‘developed’ using the law of duality, then alternative expressions taken from the premises are substituted, and finally all contradictory alternatives are scrapped. The remaining terms may be equated to the term in question.

Jevons introduces the logical alphabet – a series of combinations that can be formed with a given set of terms. For instance, A and B produce the four combinations AB, Ab, aB and ab. Using the logical alphabet, logic becomes simply an exercise of fully developing all terms and eliminating the contradictory terms. However, when the amount of letters increases, the amount of possible combinations becomes considerable. Jevons considers some techniques and devices to facilitate these endeavours, such as a ‘Logical slate’ (the logical alphabet engraved upon a school writing slate). Nevertheless, when more than six terms are involved, it becomes almost impossible to solve the problem. To facilitate this kind of reasoning Jevons developed a logical abacus, which operates on simple mechanical principles. It can be seen as one of the first computers.

Induction is the inverse process of deduction, but it is a much more complicated mode of reasoning. Induction proceeds according to certain rules of thumb, trial and error, and past attempts. Induction of simple identities becomes very complex as soon as more than just a few terms are involved. Induction of partial identities starts from a certain premise in disjunctive form A = B ·|· C ·|· D ·|· … ·|· P ·|· Q, and then we need propositions that ascribe a certain property to all individuals: B = BX, C = CX, …, Q = QX. Substituting and rearranging yield the desired result A = AX. According to Jevons this is the most important scientific procedure, as “a great mass of scientific truths consists of propositions of this form A = AB”. Jevons recognises the problem of induction — that we can never be sure to predict the future based on past knowledge. Jevons needs to bring in principles of number and theory of probability to deal with this matter.

4. Philosophy of Mathematics, Theory of Probability and Statistics

Jevons' principles of number reflect his insistence that mathematics should be based on logic, not the other way round. He occupies a somewhat contradictory position in the history of logic, since his formalism was inspired by the works of Boole, who gave mathematics priority over logic. Jevons attempts to define ‘number’ by counting ‘units’ in space or time. When counting coins, every coin should receive a proper name: we should count C′ + C″ + C′′′ + C′′′′ + … The coins are equal to each other (they all belong to the class C); they are different only because they reside on different points in space. Before counting, we should reduce all identical alternatives; the remaining ‘units’ reside on different points in space and time. “A unit is any object of thought which can be discriminated from every other object treated as a unit in the same problem” (Jevons 1874: 157). The concept of ‘unit’ encounters some severe difficulties, as noted by Frege. We can only add up Cs that are identical, but they cannot denote different things if the same symbol C is used. Jevons was unable to resolve this contradiction.

Given these problems, the role and importance of Jevons' system of logic and philosophy of mathematics seems to be small. It appears to be limited to a pedagogical aspect: Jevons' writings on logic, such as his Elementary Lessons in Logic, were widely used as textbooks and saw numerous reprints, up to decades after his death. This appraisal would not, however, do justice to Jevons' most important achievement: the introduction of statistics and econometrics in the social sciences and the use of empirical data.

Statisticians in the first part of the 19th century were concerned with the collection of data, but not with analysis. The data suggested too many different causes. Statistical journals published tables and numbers, but graphical representations and analysis remained absent. In 1863 Jevons published A Serious Fall in the Value of Gold, which investigated the influence of Australian and Californian gold discoveries of 1851 on the value of gold. For this purpose he constructed index numbers making use of the geometric mean. He argued that multiplicative disturbances will be balanced off against each other when using the geometric mean. There is however no empirical verification of this ‘multiplicative disturbances’ hypothesis. Aldrich (1987) argues that Jevons used probability in two main patterns of argument: in the determination whether events result from certain causes or are rather coincidences, and in the method of the least squares. The first approach entails the application of the ‘inverse method’ in induction: if many observations suggest regularity, then it becomes highly improbable that these result from mere coincidence. The second approach, the method of the least squares, appears when Jevons tries to adjudge weights to commodities (giving more weight to commodities that are less vulnerable to price fluctuations), and when he tries to fit empirical laws starting from an a priori reasoning about the form of the equation. These methods show at least some concern for probability and the theory of errors. But Jevons worked on the limits of his mathematical understanding, and many ideas that he foreshadowed were not developed until decades after his death.

Jevons' use of statistics in the social sciences was inspired by Adolphe Quetelet. Jevons distinguishes between a ‘mean’ (the approximation of a definite existing quantity) and an ‘average’ or ‘fictitious mean’ (an arithmetical average). The fictitious mean is important, since it allows us to ‘conceive in a single result a multitude of details’. For instance, Jevons equates aggregate and average consumption: provided that the community under consideration is large enough, the average consumption of the aggregate community will vary continuously due to price changes, whereas individual behaviour is strongly affected by accidents. If all individuals had exactly the same features (those relevant for consumption), then the average laws of supply and demand would be equal to the conduct of every individual. If however the “powers, wants, habits, and possessions” of different people were widely different, then the average would not represent “the character of any existing thing”. The accidents would cancel each other out and a certain ‘typical’ consumer would emerge. Although this is clearly a case of a fictitious mean, it would not be less useful: “the movements of trade and industry depend upon averages and aggregates, not upon the whim of individuals”.

Jevons thus recognizes that people are not homogeneous and that it would be wrong to create ‘representative agents’ depicting individual behaviour. In the case of large aggregates however, disturbing causes would cancel each other out. Here Jevons brings in the large number argument. If however specific policy questions are at stake, the heterogeneity of different societal subgroups has to be accounted for. Jevons uses the concept of ‘character’ in order to bridge the gap between universal theory and characteristics of specific subgroups in society, as we will see in the next section.

5. Philosophy of Economics

Jevons seems to be a mathematical, deductive economist. Market prices are derived directly from a series of fundamental motive forces, such as “the mechanics of utility and self-interest”. Markets are depicted in the most abstract fashion and economic agents are perfectly rational, perfectly foresighted and in possession of perfect information. A perfectly rational human being would anticipate future feelings and include discounted future utility in his calculations. However, this ability varies according to certain circumstances, as there are “the intellectual standing of the race, or the character of the individual” (Jevons 1879: 34). The ability of foresight depends on the state of civilisation: the class or race with the most foresight will work most for the future, because a powerful feeling for the future is the main incentive to industry and saving. Moreover, even the ‘quality’ of tastes increases with every improvement of civilisation. Jevons' conception of an economic agent should therefore be altered according to the institutional setting in which the agent appears (the class or race to which the individual belongs).

Michael White elaborates on Jevons' use of the concepts of ‘character’ (White 1994a), ‘gender’ (White 1994b) and ‘race’ (White 1993). Jevons' work was not directed to the explanation of the behaviour of specific individuals per se, unless these individuals were representative for all market participants of a certain uniform character. The science of economics deals with the lowest motives, and the Theory contains ‘representative individuals’, which behave in the way required by the Theory. All economic actors do not have to behave in exactly the same way, but disturbing causes would balance and therefore the ‘representative individual’ may be an appropriate model for the Theory. The theory is however indeterminate in cases when more information is required. For example, it is unclear whether an increase in the real wage rate, proportionate to an increase in labour productivity, results in increased or reduced hours of work. More information about the ‘character’ of the person under consideration is required: whereas learned professionals might be expected to work more severely, common labourers might prefer idleness over labour and prefer greater ‘ease’ in the case of rising real incomes. Irish labourers are said to be responsible for the higher mortality rates in several districts, because Jevons considered the Irish to be a race that would become more easily subject to drunkenness. The proper place of women is the home: women with children younger than three years should not be allowed to work, as this would only give rise no a neglect of the children, and would encourage the males to choose for idleness. In all these cases, the characters of labourers, Irish people or women are taken for granted, and are not in need of further explanation. The Victorian middle-class is used as a yardstick for evaluation.

6. Unitarianism and Evolutionism

Although the bias regarding class, gender and race is obvious in Jevons' work, we should add that he was concerned with the amelioration of society in general and the condition of the working classes in particular. This attitude was inspired by the progressive and Unitarian middle-class background from which Jevons emerged. Some remarks and reflections on religion can be found in his diary and personal correspondence.

Although Jevons does not discuss explicitly the Trinity, it is clear that he believes in the existence of one God. He does not describe him as a personal being or father, but as a general principle of abstract goodness (Black 1973: 258). This abstract principle is in perfect accordance with scientific findings: he reports that his conception of God is derived from an examination of matter and mind. The world is a “vast organism” with order and form expressing intention and mind, which implies that God is inseparable from his works. He is visible “in the wonderful order and simplicity of Nature, in the adaptation of means to ends, and in the creation of man to which everything refers, with power capable of indefinite improvement” (Black & Könekamp 1972: 155). Jevons founds his faith “on Man and his feelings”, because humanity’s mental feelings of love and sympathy are the only places where intentions of good can be discovered. Every religion refers to the same eternal principles or “moral truths”, but the state of civilization determines their degree of misrepresentation. Different religions are merely costumes thrown over these principles, and Unitarianism contains the “most simple and truth-like” set of religious beliefs. God is depicted as a principle of abstract goodness, and Jesus is seen as the messenger who brought the eternal moral truths to humankind. Whereas Newton was a genius of natural science and Mozart of music, Jesus was a moral genius. The history of Unitarianism is also the history of a rational approach to religion, and a critical approach to the Holy Scripture. In general, Unitarians did not oppose scientific development, but on the contrary they argued that science and religion should be seen as two sides of the same coin.

The growing critical attitude of Unitarianism coincides historically with the rise of evolutionary theory: especially Darwinism, but also wider theory such as the work of Auguste Comte and Herbert Spencer. Jevons was particularly favourable towards Spencer’s evolutionary ethics. The evolutionary perspective allows Jevons to integrate his religious beliefs in a view on the world as growing towards higher moral consciousness and rationality. Like Spencer, Jevons argues that there is no conflict at all between science and religion. On the contrary: they are both directed towards truth, and therefore they cannot contradict each other. Jevons congratulated John Herschel for his condemnation of the Theological Declaration of Scientific Man, which equated freedom of inquiry with a tendency to irreligion (Black 1977a: 60). Jevons even intended to write the Tenth Bridgewater Treatise (following Charles Babbage’s Ninth Bridgewater Treatise) to show the perfect compatibility between science and religion, but he never completed this work.

In The Principles of Science Jevons devotes a (short) section on the theory of evolution, followed by a section on the possibility of divine interference (Jevons 1874, pp. 761–9). Jevons embraces Spencer’s idea that the homogenous is unstable and differentiates itself in the process of evolutionary development. This explains why a variety of human institutions and characters emerged. He recognizes that evolutionary theory has not been proved, but nevertheless he adheres to its truthfulness. It is certainly not in conflict with theology, since it does not lead to the conclusion that creation was and is impossible. Evolutionary theory discloses several natural laws that explain how primitive life evolved to humankind by processes of adaptation to changing circumstances — but the initial distribution of atoms in the primeval world is very important as well. Jevons argues that this initial distribution is the result of the “arbitrary choice of the Creator”, which could have been very different and therefore present life would have been very different as well. Evolutionary theory tells us only that similar circumstances will lead to similar results since the same laws apply, but this is not in conflict with an initial act of creation. In close accordance with Spencer’s First Principles, Jevons states that it would be absurd to deny that anything exists, and that it therefore might be equally conceivable that the world was created out of nothing or that it existed from eternity. He also states clearly that science cannot disprove the possibility of divine intervention, which implies that a positivist attitude does not necessarily lead to materialism or atheism. Jevons also takes distance from Comte’s positivistic philosophy, by arguing — like Spencer — that scientific reflection on higher notions of creation must necessarily end up in contradictions.

7. Implications for Economic and Social Policy

Black (1995) recognizes that, after 1867, Jevons' “increasing faith in the validity of Spencer’s theory of evolution was combined with decreasing faith in the validity of laissez-faire as a guide for economic policy”. Unitarians struggled with the ‘contradiction’ between the need for individual self-improvement on the one hand, and active interventionism on the other hand. This ‘contradiction’ can also be depicted as a tension existing between a belief in scientific principles on the one hand — the laws of economics — and the recognition that moral and intellectual self-improvement is impossible as long as the first necessaries of life are still out of reach. Unitarians concluded that a rational mode of living had to be imposed on the poor before they could benefit from education. Jevons tried to resolve this paradox by restricting the scientific analysis to what can be accounted for in terms of the accumulation of wealth, and by suggesting that a ‘higher’ calculus of pleasures and pains is needed when ‘higher’ motives interfere. Interventionism could then be justified by pointing out those ‘higher’ motives. The scientific basis of Jevons' economics is utilitarianism and the mechanics of utility and self-interest; like many Unitarians this scientific belief is combined with an emphasis on active interventionism directed towards more possibilities for self-improvement; and evolutionary theory does not only show that there should be development towards the ‘good’ and the ‘happy’, but also that there will be such a development (at least in Jevons' interpretation).

Material nature does not contain goodness; it can only be found in the human mind. Nature is depicted as a mechanical machine and should be studied by the natural sciences. Abstract economic theory is the mechanical analogy of these natural sciences: it is restricted to an investigation of the social world as a mechanical machine, and no ethical or religious considerations are taken into account. Jevons refutes the claims of some “sentimental writers” who regard economics as a “dismal science”, because its scope is restricted to wealth. These authors depict economics as a mechanical and miserable body of theories, whereas they hold true that a moral science should be concerned with sympathies, feelings and duties. Jevons uses an analogy from the natural sciences to refute this opinion: division of labour implies that some people investigate the mechanical aspects of iron, while other researchers devote their time to the study of its electrical or magnetic aspects. A physician may conclude that the health of a particular person will be fostered if he goes to the sea, but this person may decide otherwise by taking other considerations into account. This is the position of economics: charity for humanitarian reasons remains possible, but abstract economic theory shows that this may endanger future accumulation of wealth (Black 1977d, pp. 7–8).

Earlier we discussed Jevons' use of ‘representative individuals’ and the notion of ‘character’. It is also the case that Unitarians believe that the formation of an improved character is essential, since otherwise no religious warmth can emerge. It is unclear to what extent improvement of people with presumed inferior character (due to class, race or gender) can be done. In Jevons we encounter a mixture of enlightened belief in education and prejudiced opinions against certain parts of the population, which is certainly not unusual for the 19th century. Nevertheless, Jevons does believe that policies to ameliorate working class conditions and attitudes are possible, desirable and required.


Primary Sources

The Jevons Archives are located in the John Rylands University Library, University of Manchester. For a complete list of these sources, see McNiven 1983.

  • Black, R. D. C. (ed.) 1973. Papers and Correspondence of William Stanley Jevons Volume II. Correspondence 1850–1862, London and Basingstoke: MacMillan.
  • ––– (ed.) 1977a. Papers and Correspondence of William Stanley Jevons Volume III. Correspondence 1863–1872, London and Basingstoke: MacMillan.
  • ––– (ed.) 1977b. Papers and Correspondence of William Stanley Jevons Volume IV. Correspondence 1873–1878, London and Basingstoke: MacMillan.
  • ––– (ed.) 1977c. Papers and Correspondence of William Stanley Jevons Volume V. Correspondence 1879–1882, London and Basingstoke: MacMillan.
  • ––– (ed.) 1977d. Papers and Correspondence of William Stanley Jevons Volume VI. Lectures on Political Economy 1875–1876, London and Basingstoke: MacMillan.
  • ––– (ed.) 1981. Papers and Correspondence of William Stanley Jevons Volume VII. Papers on Political Economy, London and Basingstoke: MacMillan.
  • Black, R. D. C. & R. Könekamp (eds.) 1972. Papers and Correspondence of William Stanley Jevons Volume I. Biography and Personal Journal, London and Basingstoke: MacMillan.
  • Jevons, W. S. [1858]. The Social Cesspools of Sydney No. 1. — The Rocks. The Sydney Morning Herald, October 7, 1858, typescript provided by Michael V. White.
  • ––– 1863a. “On the Study of Periodic Commercial Fluctuations.” Report of the British Association for the Advancement of Science, Cambridge, 157–8.
  • ––– 1863b. “Notice of a General Mathematical Theory of Political Economy.” Report of the British Association for the Advancement of Science, Cambridge, 158–9.
  • ––– [1865, 1906] 1965. The Coal Question, New York: Augustus M. Kelley.
  • ––– [1866] 1965. “Brief Account of a General Mathematical Theory of Political Economy.” in The Theory of Political Economy, New York: Augustus M. Kelley, 303–14.
  • ––– [1869]. “The Substitution of Similars.” in [1890] 1991. Pure Logic and Other Minor Works, Bristol: Thoemmes.
  • ––– 1871. The Theory of Political Economy, first edition, London and New York: MacMillan and Co.
  • ––– [1874] 1879. The Principles of Science: A Treatise on Logic and Scientific Method, London: MacMillan.
  • ––– 1875. Money and the Mechanism of Exchange, London: Kegan Paul, Trench, Trübner & Co.
  • ––– [1878] 2001. Science Primers. Political Economy (Writings on Economics Vol. 5, Palgrave Archive Edition), London: Macmillan.
  • ––– [1879, 1957] 1965. The Theory of Political Economy, fifth edition, New York: Augustus M. Kelley.
  • ––– 1879b. “John Stuart Mill's Philosophy Tested. IV.-Utilitarianism.” Contemporary Review, 36: 521–38.
  • ––– [1882, 1910] 1968. The State in Relation to Labour, London: MacMillan.
  • ––– [1883] 1965. Methods of Social Reform, New York: Augustus M. Kelley.
  • ––– [1884] 1909. Investigations in Currency and Finance, London: MacMillan.
  • ––– [1905] 1965. The Principles of Economics, New York: Augustus M. Kelley.
  • ––– 2001. Collected Economic Writings. 9 Volumes, London: Palgrave/MacMillan.
  • ––– 2002. Reviews and Obituaries, 2 Volumes, with a general introduction by Takatoshi Inoue and headnotes by Bert Mosselmans, Bristol: Thoemmes Press.
  • McNiven, P., 1983. Hand-List of the Jevons Archive in the John Rylands University Library. Bulletin of the John Rylands University Library, 66: 213–55.

Secondary Sources

  • Adamson, R., [1881] 1988. “Review of W. S. Jevons' ‘Studies in Deductive Logic’,” Mind, 6: 427–33. Reprinted in J.C. Wood (ed.), William Stanley Jevons: Critical Assessments Vol. I, London & New York: Routledge, 30–36.
  • Aldrich, J., 1987. “Jevons as Statistician: The Role of Probability,” Manchester School of Economics and Social Studies, 55(3): 233–56.
  • Black, R.D.C., 1995. “Transitions in Political Economy” in Economic Theory and Policy in Context, Aldershot: Edgar Elgar, 163–201.
  • Frege, G., [1884] 1968. Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik (translated title: The Foundations of Arithmetic), Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Grattan-Guinness, I., 1991. “The Correspondence between George Boole and Stanley Jevons, 1863–1864,” History and Philosophy of Logic, 12: 15–35.
  • Hempel, C. G. & P. Oppenheim, [1948] 1953. “The Logic of Explanation,” in Feigl, Herbert and May Brodbeck (eds.), Readings in the Philosophy of Science, New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts, 319-52.
  • Inoue, T. & M. V. White, 1993. “Bibliography of Published Works by W. S. Jevons,” Journal of the History of Economic Thought, 15: 122–47. Updated and reprinted in Jevons, 2001, Collected Economic Writings Volume 1, London: Palgrave/MacMillan.
  • Könekamp, R., 1972. “Biographical Introduction,” in R.D.C. Black and R. Könekamp (eds.), Papers and Correspondence of William Stanley Jevons Volume I, London and Basingstoke: MacMillan, 1–52.
  • Laidler, D., 1982. “Jevons on Money,” The Manchester School, 50(4): 326–53.
  • La Nauze, J.A., [1953] 1988. “The Conception of Jevons' Utility Theory,” Economica, 20: 356–8. Reprinted in J.C. Wood (ed.), William Stanley Jevons: Critical Assessments Vol. III, London & New York: Routledge, 58–60.
  • McNiven, P., 1983. “Hand-List of the Jevons Archive in the John Rylands University Library,” Bulletin of the John Rylands University Library, 66: 213–55.
  • Mosselmans, B., 1998. “William Stanley Jevons and the Extent of Meaning in Logic and Economics,” History and Philosophy of Logic, 19: 83–99.
  • –––, 2001. Bibliography of Secondary Sources, in Collected Economic Writings of W. S. Jevons, 9 Volumes, London: Palgrave/MacMillan, pp. xliv-liv.
  • –––, 2005. “Adolphe Quetelet, the Average Man and the Development of Economic Methodology”, European Journal of the History of Economic Thought, 12(4): 565–582.
  • Mosselmans, B. and G.D. Chryssides, 2005. “Unitarianism and Evolutionism in W. S. Jevons' Thought,” Faith and Freedom, 58 (160): 18–44.
  • Mosselmans, B. & E. Mathijs, 1999. “Jevons' Music Manuscript and the Political Economy of Music”, History of Political Economy, 31 (Supplement): 121–156.
  • Mosselmans, B. & M. V. White, 2001. “General Introduction”, in Collected Economic Writings of W. S. Jevons, 9 Volumes, London: Palgrave/MacMillan, pp. v-xxv.
  • Peart, S., 1996. The Economics of William Stanley Jevons, London: Routledge.
  • Porter, T. M., 1986. The Rise of Statistical Thinking: 1820–1900, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 1995. “Statistical and Social Facts from Quetelet to Durkheim,” Sociological Perspectives, 38(1): 15–26.
  • Quetelet, A., [1835] 1991. Sur l'homme et le développement de ses facultés, ou essai de physique sociale, Paris: Bachelier.
  • Robertson, G., [1876] 1988. “Mr. Jevons' Formal Logic,” Mind, 1: 206–22. Reprinted in J.C. Wood (ed.), William Stanley Jevons: Critical Assessments Volume 1, London and New York: Routledge, 11–25.
  • Schabas, M., 1990. A World Ruled by Number. William Stanley Jevons and the Rise of Mathematical Economics, Princeton: Princeton Unversity Press.
  • Stigler, S. M., 1986. The History of Statistics. The Measurement of Uncertainty before 1900, Cambridge, MA & London: Belknap Press of Harvard University Press.
  • White, M. V., 1993. “The ‘Irish Factor’ in Jevons' Statistics: a Note,” History of Economics Review, 19: 79–85.
  • –––, 1994a. “Bridging the Natural and the Social: Science and Character in Jevons' Political Economy,” Economic Inquiry, 32: 429–44.
  • –––, 1994b. “Following Strange Gods: Women in Jevons' Political Economy,” in Groenewegen (ed.) Feminism and Political Economy in Victorian England, Aldershot: Edward Elgar, 46–78.

Academic Tools

sep man icon How to cite this entry.
sep man icon Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society.
inpho icon Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO).
phil papers icon Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

Boole, George | De Morgan, Augustus

Copyright © 2007 by
Bert Mosselmans <bmosselm@vub.ac.be>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free