Notes to Wittgenstein's Philosophy of Mathematics

1. In his posthumously published (1953*, 334–335), Kurt Gödel says that the “syntactical viewpoint,” “a combination of nominalism and conventionalism,” was developed “[a]round 1930” by “R. Carnap, H. Hahn, and M. Schlick, largely under the influence of L. Wittgenstein” (i.e., “Wittgenstein 1922”).

2. Defenders of the Logicist interpretation of the Tractatus also ignore Wittgenstein's expressed contempt for the second edition of Principia Mathematica (McGuinness and von Wright, 1995*, 186: Letter from F. Ramsey to his mother, Sept. 20, 1923) and his disdain for, and criticism of, Ramsey's defence of Logicism in “The Foundations of Mathematics” [see the Waismann version of Wittgenstein's 1927 letter to Ramsey (WVC 189, Footnote #1)].

3. I would like to thank Dr. Timothy Pope (University of Lethbridge) for the translations that appear here. Any errors in the translations are entirely my responsibility.

4. Wittgenstein probably adapted this example (beginning in 1929 at (PR §132) and (WVC 71)), which he articulates in various similar ways, from Brouwer, who first stated similar ‘propositions’ in his (1908, 110); see §2.4 above.

Copyright © 2011 by
Victor Rodych <>

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