Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Abstract Objects

First published Thu Jul 19, 2001

It is widely supposed that every object falls into one of two categories: Some things are concrete; the rest abstract. The distinction is supposed to be of fundamental significance for metaphysics and epistemology. The present article surveys a number of recent attempts to say how it should be drawn.


The abstract/concrete distinction has a curious status in contemporary philosophy. It is widely agreed that the distinction is of fundamental importance. But there is no standard account of how the distinction is to be explained. There is a great deal of agreement about how to classify certain paradigm cases. Thus it is universally acknowledged that numbers and the other objects of pure mathematics are abstract, whereas rocks and trees and human beings are concrete. Indeed the list of paradigms may be extended indefinitely:

Classes       Stars
Propositions       Protons
Concepts       The electromagnetic field
The letter A       Stanford University
Dante's Inferno       James Joyce's copy of Dante's Inferno
...       ...

The challenge remains, however, to say what underlies this alleged dichotomy. In the absence of such an account, the philosophical significance of the contrast remains uncertain. We may know how to classify things as abstract or concrete by appeal to "intuition". But unless we know what makes for abstractness and concreteness, we cannot know what (if anything) hangs on the classification.

Historical Remarks

The contemporary distinction between abstract and concrete is not an ancient distinction. Indeed, there is a strong case for the view that despite occasional anticipations, it plays no significant role in philosophy before the 20th century. The modern distinction bears some resemblance to Plato's distinction between Forms and Sensibles. But Plato's Forms were supposed to be causes par excellence, whereas abstract objects are normally supposed to be causally inert in every sense. The original "abstract"/"concrete" distinction was a distinction among words or terms. Traditional grammar distinguishes the abstract noun "whiteness" from the concrete noun "white" without implying that this linguistic contrast corresponds to a metaphysical distinction in what they stand for. In the 17th century this grammatical distinction was transposed to the domain of ideas. Locke speaks of the general idea of a triangle which is "neither Oblique nor Rectangle, neither Equilateral, Equicrural nor Scalenon; but all and none of these at once," remarking that even this idea is not among the most "abstract, comprehensive and difficult" (Essay IV.vii.9). Locke's conception of an abstract idea as one that is formed from concrete ideas by the omission of distinguishing detail was immediately rejected by Berkeley and then by Hume. But even for Locke there was no suggestion that the distinction between abstract ideas and concrete or particular ideas corresponds to a distinction among objects. "It is plain, …" Locke writes, "that General and Universal, belong not to the real existence of things; but are Inventions and Creatures of the Understanding, made by it for its own use, and concern only signs, whether Words or Ideas" (III.iii.11).

The abstract/concrete distinction in its modern form is meant to mark a line in the domain of objects. So conceived, the distinction becomes a central focus for philosophical discussion only in the twentieth century. The origins of this development are obscure. But one crucial factor appears to have been the breakdown of the allegedly exhaustive distinction between the mental and the material that had formed the main division for ontologically minded philosophers since Descartes. One signal event in this development is Frege's insistence that the objectivity and a prioricity of the truths of mathematics entail that numbers are neither material beings nor ideas in the mind. If numbers were material things (or properties of material things), the laws of arithmetic would have the status of empirical generalizations. If numbers were ideas in the mind, then the same difficulty would arise, as would countless others. (Whose mind contains the number 17? Is there one 17 in your mind and another in mine? In that case, the appearance of a common mathematical subject matter is an illusion.) In The Foundations of Arithmetic (1884), Frege concludes that numbers are neither external ‘concrete’ things nor mental entities of any sort. Later, in his essay "The Thought" (Frege 1918), he claims the same status for the items he calls thoughts -- the senses of declarative sentences -- and also, by implication, for their constituents, the senses of subsentential expressions. Frege does not say that senses are "abstract". He says that they belong to a "third realm" distinct both from the sensible external world and from the internal world of consciousness. Similar claims had been made by Bolzano (1837), and later by Brentano (1874) and his pupils, including Meinong and Husserl. The common theme in these developments is the felt need in semantics and psychology as well as in mathematics for a class of objective (i.e., non-mental) supersensible entities. As this new "realism" was absorbed into English speaking philosophy, the traditional term "abstract" was enlisted to apply to the denizens of this "third realm".

The Way of Negation

Frege's way of drawing the distinction is an instance of what Lewis (1986) calls the Way of Negation. Abstract objects are defined as those that lack certain features possessed by paradigmatic concrete things. Nearly every explicit characterization in the literature has this feature. There are, however, several significant difficulties with this approach, at least in its most familiar implementations.

According to Frege's explicit account, the items in the "third realm" are non-mental and non-sensible. But it is unclear what it means to call an object mental or mind-dependent; and to the extent that the notion is intelligible, it is quite unclear whether abstract objects in general satisfy the condition. It is commonly supposed, for example, that the game of chess is an abstract entity (Dummett 1973). But there is certainly a sense in which the game would not have existed were it not for the mental activity of human beings. So at least one sort of mind-dependence would appear to be compatible with abstractness. Moreover, it has sometimes been maintained that the paradigmatic abstract entities -- mathematical objects, universals -- exist only as ideas in the mind of God. The view may be outlandish; but is it a view according to which abstract entities do not exist? Or is it rather a view according to which certain abstract entities are also mind-dependent? Insofar as the latter interpretation is not straightforwardly contradictory, the definition of "abstract" should not require mind-independence.

Perhaps more importantly, Frege's identification of the abstract with the realm of non-sensible non-mental things entails that unobservable physical objects such as quarks and electrons should be classified as abstract entities. But this is at odds with standard usage, and almost certainly with Frege's intention.

The Non-Spatiality Criterion

Contemporary purveyors of the Way of Negation standardly amend Frege's criterion by requiring that abstract objects be non-spatial or causally inefficacious or both. Indeed, if any characterization of the abstract deserves to be regarded as the standard one, it is this: An abstract entity is a non-spatial (or non-spatiotemporal) causally inert thing. But this standard characterization presents a number of perplexities.

Consider the requirement that abstract objects be non-spatial or non-spatiotemporal. Some of the paradigms of abstractness are non-spatiotemporal in a straightforward sense. It makes no sense to ask where the cosine function is. Or if it does make sense to ask, the only sensible answer is that it is nowhere. Similarly, it makes little sense to ask when the Pythagorean theorem came to exist. And if it does make sense to ask, the only sensible answer is that it has always existed, or perhaps, that it does not exist ‘in time’ at all. These paradigmatic abstracta have no non-trivial spatial or temporal properties. They have no spatial location, and they exist nowhere in particular in time. But consider the game of chess. Some philosophers take the view that chess is like a mathematical object in these respects. But that is certainly not the most natural view. The natural view is that chess was invented at a certain place and time (though it may be hard to say exactly where or when); that before it was invented it did not exist at all; that it was imported from India into Persia in the 7th century; that it has changed in various respects over the years, and so on. The only reason to resist this natural description would appear to be the thought that since chess is clearly an abstract object (it's not a physical object, after all!), and since abstract objects do not exist in spacetime (by definition!), chess must resemble the cosine function in its relation to space and time. However, one might with equal justice regard the case of chess and other "artificial" abstract entities as a counterexample to the view that abstract objects in general possess only trivial spatial and temporal properties.

This is not necessarily ground for abandoning the non-spatiotemporality criterion. Even if there is a sense in which some abstract entities possess non-trivial spatiotemporal properties, it might still be said thought that concrete entities ‘exist in spacetime’ in a distinctive way, and that abstract entities may be characterized as items that fail to exist in space and time in the manner characteristic of concrete objects.

The paradigmatic concrete objects generally occupy a relatively determinate spatial volume at each time at which they exist, or a determinate volume of spacetime over the course of their existence. It makes sense to ask of any such object, "Where is it now and how much space does it occupy?", even if the answer must in some cases be somewhat vague. By contrast, even if the game of chess is somehow "implicated" in space and time, it makes no sense to ask how much space it now occupies -- or if it does make sense to ask, the only sensible answer is that it occupies no space at all (which is not to say that it occupies a spatial point.) And so it might be said: An object is abstract if it fails to occupy anything like a determinate region of space (or spacetime).

This promising suggestion faces two sorts of difficulty. First, according to some interpretations of quantum mechanics, microscopic physical objects fail to occupy anything like a determinate region of space. If we consider an isolated proton whose position has not been measured for some time, the question "Where is it now and how much space does it occupy?" will have no straightforward answer. And yet no one would suggest that an unobserved proton is an abstract entity. Second, it is not out of the question that certain items that are standardly regarded as abstract may nonetheless occupy determinate volumes of space and time. It is generally agreed that sets and functions are abstract entities. So consider the various sets composed from Peter and Paul: {Peter, Paul}, {{Peter}, {Peter, Paul}}, etc. The question, "Where are these things and how much space do they occupy?" does not arise in the normal course of inquiry. Moreover, many philosophers will be inclined to say that either the question makes no sense, or the answer is a simple "Nowhere. None." But this would appear to be another unreflective application of the unpersuasive inference noted above. In this case: Sets are abstract; abstract objects do not exist in space. So sets must not exist in space. But as before, there is reason to doubt the cogency of such an inference. Let it be granted that pure sets are like the cosine function: located nowhere in space and nowhere in particular in time. Is there a principled objection to the view that impure sets exist where and when their members do? It is not unnatural to say that a set of books is located on a certain shelf in the library. So why not say that the sets containing Peter and Paul exist wherever and whenever Peter and Paul themselves exist, and that in general an impure set exists where and when its spatiotemporally located ur-elements are located? To be sure, nothing in set theory forces us to say this. But the applications of set theory to the concrete domain are not inconsistent with this manner of speaking. So, while it may be clear that the impure sets are abstract and not concrete, it is quite unclear whether they fail to exist in space in much the same sense in which paradigmatic concreta exist in space. This suggests that it may have been a mistake from the start to suppose that the distinction between concrete and abstract is at bottom a matter of spatiotemporal locatedness.

The Causal Inefficacy Criterion

The most widely accepted version of the Way of Negation has it that abstract objects are distinguished by their causal inefficacy. Concrete objects (whether mental or physical) have causal powers; numbers and functions and the rest make nothing happen. There is no such thing as causal commerce with the game of chess. And even if impure sets do in some sense exist in space, it is easy enough to believe that they make no distinctive causal contribution to what transpires. Peter and Paul may have effects individually; and they may have effects together which neither has on his own. But these joint effects are naturally construed as effects of two concrete objects acting jointly, or perhaps as effects of their mereological aggregate (itself a paradigm concretum), rather than as effects of some set-theoretic construction. (Suppose Peter and Paul together tip a balance. If we entertain the possibility that this event is caused by a set, we shall have to ask which set caused it: the set containing just Peter and Paul? Some more elaborate construction based on them? Or perhaps the set containing the molecules that compose Peter and Paul? This proliferation of possible answers suggests that it was a mistake to credit causal powers to sets in the first place.)

There are no decisive intuitive counterexamples to this account of the abstract/concrete distinction. The chief difficulty is rather conceptual. The causal relation, strictly speaking, is a relation among events. If we say that the rock caused the window to break, what we mean is that some event involving the rock caused the breaking. If the rock itself is a cause, it is a cause in some derivative sense. But this derivative sense has proved elusive. The rock's hitting the window is an event in which the rock "participates" in a certain way, and it is because the rock participates in events in this way that we credit the rock itself with causal efficacy. But what is it for an object to participate in an event? Suppose John is thinking about the Pythagorean Theorem and you ask him to say what's on his mind. His response is an event: the utterance of a sentence; and one of its causes is the event of John's thinking about the theorem. Does the Pythagorean Theorem "participate" in this event? There is surely some sense in which it does. The event consists in John's coming to stand in a certain relation to the theorem, just as the rock's hitting the window consists in the rock's coming to stand in a certain relation to the window. But we do not credit the Pythagorean Theorem with causal efficacy simply because it participates in this sense in an event which is a cause. The challenge is therefore to characterize the distinctive manner of "participation in the causal order" which distinguishes the concrete entities. This problem has received relatively little attention. There is no reason to believe that it cannot be solved. But in the absence of a solution, this standard version of the Way of Negation must be reckoned unsatisfactory.

The Way of Example

In addition to the Way of Negation, Lewis identifies three main strategies for explaining the abstract/concrete distinction. According to the Way of Example, it suffices to list paradigm cases of abstract and concrete entities in the hope that the sense of the distinction will somehow emerge. If the distinction were primitive and unanalyzable, this might be the only way to explain it. But as we have remarked, this approach is bound to call the interest of the distinction into question. The abstract/concrete distinction matters because abstract objects as a class appear to present certain general problems in epistemology and the philosophy of language. It is supposed to be unclear how we come by our knowledge of abstract objects in a sense in which it is not unclear how we come by our knowledge of concrete objects (Benacerraf 1973). It is supposed to by unclear how we manage to refer determinately to abstract entities in a sense in which it is not unclear how we manage to refer determinately to other things (Benacerraf 1973, Hodes 1984). But if these are genuine problems, there must be some account of why abstract objects as such should be especially problematic in these ways. It is hard to believe that it is simply their primitive abstractness that makes the difference. It is much easier to believe that it is their non-spatiality or their causal inefficacy or something of the sort. It is not out of the question that the abstract/concrete distinction is fundamental, and that the Way of Example is the best we can do by way of elucidation. But if so, it is quite unclear why the distinction should make a difference.

The Way of Conflation

According to the Way of Conflation, the abstract/concrete distinction is to be identified with one or another metaphysical distinction already familiar under another name: as it might be, the distinction between sets and individuals, or the distinction between universals and particulars. There is no doubt that some authors have used the terms in this way. But this sort of conflation is relatively rare nowadays. As most philosophers use the term, a claim to the effect that sets (or universals) are the only abstract objects would amount to a substantive metaphysical thesis in need of substantive defense.

The Way of Abstraction

The most important alternative to the Way of Negation is what Lewis calls the Way of Abstraction. According to a longstanding tradition in philosophical psychology, abstraction is a distinctive mental process in which new ideas or conceptions are formed by considering several objects or ideas and omitting the features that distinguish them. One is given a range of white things of varying shapes and sizes; one ignores or "abstracts from" the respects in which they differ, and thereby attains the abstract idea of whiteness. Nothing in this tradition requires that ideas formed in this way represent or correspond to a distinctive class of objects. But it might be maintained that the distinction between abstract and concrete objects should be explained by reference to the psychological process of abstract ion or something like it. The simplest version of this strategy would be to say that an object is abstract if it is (or might be) the referent of an abstract idea, i.e., an idea formed by abstraction.

So conceived, the Way of Abstraction is wedded to an outmoded philosophy of mind. But a related approach has gained considerable currency in recent years. Crispin Wright (1983) and Bob Hale (1987) have developed an account of abstract objects that takes leave from certain suggestive remarks in Frege (1884). Frege notes (in effect) that many of the singular terms that refer to abstract entities are formed by means of functional expressions. We speak of the shape of an object, the direction of a line, the number of books. Of course many singular terms formed by means of functional expressions denote ordinary concrete objects: "the father of Plato", "the capital of France". But the functional terms that pick out abstract entities are distinctive in the following respect: W here ‘f(a)’ is such an expression, there is typically an equation of the form

f(a) = f(b) if and only if a R b,

where R is an equivalence relation. (An equivalence relation is a relation that is reflexive, symmetric and transitive.) For example,

The direction of a = the direction of b iff a is parallel to b.

The number of Fs = the number of Gs iff there are just as many Fs as Gs.

Moreover, these equations (or abstraction principles, as they are sometimes called) appear to have a special semantic status. While they are not strictly speaking definitions of the functional expression that occurs on the left, they would appear to hold in virtue of the meaning of that expression. To understand the term "direction" is (in part) to know that "the direction of a" and "the direction of b" refer to the same entity if and only if the lines a and b are parallel. Moreover, the equivalence relation that appears on the right hand side of the equation would appear to be semantically and perhaps epistemologically prior to the functional expression on the left (Noonan 1978). Mastery of the concept of a direction presupposes mastery of the concept of parallelism, but not vice versa.

The availability of abstraction principles meeting these conditions may be exploited in several ways to yield an account of the distinction between abstract and concrete objects. When ‘f’ is a functional expression governed by an abstraction principle, there will be a corresponding concept Kf such that

X is Kf iff for some y, x = f(y).

The simplest version of this approach to the Way of Abstraction is then to say that X is an abstract object if (and only if?) X is an instance of some kind Kf whose associated functional expression ‘f’ is governed by a suitable abstraction principle.

This simple account is liable to a number of objections.

It is unclear whether these objections apply to the more sophisticated abstractionist proposals of Wright and Hale. This Fregean approach to the abstract/concrete distinction is clearly promising. But like most other approaches to explaining the distinction, it has not yet assumed its final form. Definitive assessment would therefore be premature.

Further Reading

Zalta (1983) is an axiomatic theory of abstract objects. Putnam (1975) makes the case for abstract objects on scientific grounds. Field (1980) and (1989) make the case against abstract objects. Bealer (1993) and Tennant (1997) present a priori arguments for the necessary existence of abstract entities. The dispute over the existence of abstracta is reviewed in Burgess and Rosen (1997).


Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

Frege, Gottlob | Frege, Gottlob: logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic | individuals | object | properties