Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.


First published Thu Sep 23, 1999; substantive revision Mon Dec 18, 2000

Questions about the nature and existence of properties are nearly as old as philosophy itself. Interest in properties has ebbed and flowed over the centuries, but they are now undergoing a resurgence. The last twenty five years have seen a great deal of interesting work on properties, and this entry will focus primarily on that work (thus taking up where Loux's (1972) earlier review of the literature leaves off).

When we turn to the recent literature on properties we find a confusing array of terminology, incompatible standards for evaluating theories of properties, and philosophers talking past one another. It will be easier to follow this literature if we begin by focusing on the point of introducing properties in the first place. Philosophers who argue that properties exist almost always do so because they think properties are needed to solve certain philosophical problems, and their views about the nature of properties are strongly influenced by the problems they think properties are needed to solve. So the discussion here will be organized around the tasks properties have been introduced to perform and the ways in which these tasks influence accounts of the nature of properties.

In §1 I introduce some distinctions and terminology that will be useful in subsequent discussion. The tasks properties are called on to perform are typically explanatory, and so §2 contains a brief discussion of explanation in ontology. §3 contains a discussion of traditional attempts to use properties to explain phenomena in metaphysics, epistemology, philosophy of language, and ethics. §4 focuses on the three areas where contemporary philosophers have offered the most detailed accounts based on properties: philosophy of mathematics, the semantics of natural languages, and topics in a more nebulous area that might be called naturalistic ontology. We then turn to issues about the nature of properties, including their existence conditions (§5), their identity conditions (§6), and the various sorts of properties there might be (§7). §8 provides an introductory, informal discussion of formal theories of properties. After §2 the sections, and in many cases the subsections, are relatively modular, and readers can use the detailed tables of contents and hyperlinks to locate those topics that interest them most.

[Detailed Table of Contents (to subsection level)]
[More Detailed Table of Contents (to subsubsection level) ]

1. Distinctions and Terminology

1.1 Properties: Basic Ideas

Properties include the attributes or qualities or features or characteristics of things. Issues in ontology are so vexed that even those philosophers who agree that properties exist often disagree about which properties there are. This means that there are no wholly uncontroversial examples of properties, but likely candidates include the color and rest mass of the apple on my desk, as well (more controversially) as the properties of being an apple and being a desk. For generality we will also take properties to include relations like being taller than and lying between.

Universals and Particulars

A fundamental question about properties — second only in importance to the question whether there are any — is whether they are universals or particulars. To say that properties are universals is to say that the selfsame property can be instantiated by numerically distinct things. On this view it is possible for two different apples to exemplify exactly the same color, a single universal. The competing view is that properties are just as much individuals or particulars as the things that have them. No matter how similar the colors of the two apples, their colors are numerically distinct properties, the redness of the first apple and the redness of the second. Such individualized properties are variously known as ‘perfect particulars’, ‘abstract particulars’, ‘quality instances’, ‘moments’, and ‘tropes’. Tropes have various attractions and liabilities, but since they are the topic of another entry, we will construe properties (save for any, perhaps those like being identical with Socrates, that could only be exemplified by one thing) as universals.

Properties and Relations

Properties are sometimes distinguished from relations. For example, a specific shade of red or a rest mass of 3 kilograms is a property, while being smaller than or having a weight of 29.4 newtons are typically regarded as relations (both of which relate my laptop computer to the Earth). Relations generate a few special problems of their own, but for the most part properties and relations raise the same philosophical issues and, except where otherwise noted, I will use ‘property’ as a generic term to cover both monadic (one-place, nonrelational) properties and (polyadic, multi-place) relations.

Properties can be Instantiated

Properties are most naturally contrasted with particulars, i.e., with individual things. The fundamental difference between properties and individuals is that properties can be instantiated or exemplified, whereas individuals cannot. Furthermore, at least many properties are general; they can be instantiated by more than one thing.

The things that exemplify a property are called instances of it (the instances of a relation are the things, taken in the relevant order, that stand in that relation). It is a matter of controversy whether properties can exist without actually being exemplified and whether some properties can be exemplified by other properties (in the way, perhaps, that redness exemplifies the property of being a color). Some philosophers even hold that there are unexemplifiable properties, e.g., being red and not red, but even they typically believe that such properties are intimately related to other properties (here being red and not being red) that can be exemplified.

Realism, Nominalism, and Conceptualism

The deepest question about properties is whether there are any. Textbooks feature a triumvirate of answers: realism, nominalism, and conceptualism. There are many species of each view, but the rough distinctions come to this. Realists hold that there are universal properties. Nominalists deny this (though some hold that there are tropes). And conceptualists urge that words (like ‘honesty’) which might seem to refer to properties really refer to concepts. A few contemporary philosophers have defended conceptualism (cf. Cocchiarella, 1986, ch. 3), and recent empirical work on concepts bears on it. It is not a common view nowadays, however, and I will focus on realism here.

The Revival of Properties

Just a few decades ago many philosophers concurred with Quine's dismissal of properties as "creatures of darkness," but philosophers now widely invoke them without guilt or shame. For example, most current discussions of mental causation are couched in terms of the causal efficacy of mental properties, while discussions of supervenience often proceed by way of a claim that one family of properties (e.g., mental properties) is supervenient on some other family of properties (e.g., physical properties). But the resurgence of interest in properties has left us with widely varying accounts of their nature, and questions about their existence have by no means disappeared.

Properties are as Properties Do

It is possible to classify theories of properties in terms of their characterizations of the nature of properties or in terms of the jobs they introduce properties to do. The former kind of characterization is more fundamental, but since views about the nature of properties are typically motivated by accounts of the work properties are invoked to do, it will be more useful to begin with the latter. We will ask what explanatory roles properties have been introduced to fill, and we will then try to determine what something would have to be like in order to occupy those roles. This will also allow us to consider the sorts of arguments that are typically advanced for the claim that properties exist.

1.2 Talking about Properties

Philosophers do not have a settled idiom for talking about properties. Often they make do with a simple distinction between singular terms and predicates. Singular terms are words and phrases (like proper names and definite descriptions) that can occupy subject positions in sentences and that purport to denote or refer to a single thing. Examples include ‘Bill Clinton,’ ‘Chicago’, and ‘The first female Supreme Court Justice’. Predicates, by contrast, can be true of things. When we represent a sentence like ‘Quine is a philosopher’ in a standard formal language (like first-order logic) as ‘Pq’, we absorb the entire expression ‘is a philosopher’ into the predicate ‘P’ (though for some theoretical purposes it is more useful to count ‘philosopher’ or even ‘a philosopher’ as the predicate). The notion of a predicate is supplanted by the notion of a verb phrase in modern grammars, so we don't need to pursue this issue here, but we can raise our first question about property talk at this relatively atheoretical level.

Failed Substitutions

It is perfectly grammatical to say ‘Monica is honest’ or ‘Honesty is a virtue’, but your old English teacher will cringe if you say ‘Honest is a virtue’ or ‘Monica is honesty’. We must use ‘honest’ after the ‘Monica is’, and we have to use the nominalization, ‘honesty’, before ‘is a virtue’. The fact that ‘honest’ and ‘honesty’ cannot be interchanged without destroying the grammaticality of our original sentences has been thought to have various philosophical morals. Some philosophers take it to show that the two expressions cannot stand for the same thing; for example, ‘honest’ might stand for a property and ‘honesty’ might stand for a property-correlate of some sort (Frege draws roughly this moral from his discussion of ‘the concept horse’). Others take it to show that although both expressions are related to the same thing, the property honesty, they are related to by different semantic relations; for example, the nominalization denotes this property, whereas the predicate expresses it.

Frege's argument for the first sort of view is not compelling (see Parsons, 1986, for a good discussion); moreover, it would be desirable to avoid multiplying entities (e.g., property correlates) and semantic relations (e.g., expression) beyond necessity. And mere failures of substitutivity are not enough to show that they are necessary, since various syntactic features of sentences prohibit the exchange of terms that are clearly co-referential. Consider case forms of personal pronouns: ‘I’ and ‘me’ cannot be exchanged (without destroying grammaticality) in sentences like ‘I dropped the hammer, and he returned it to me’. But no one concludes that distinct objects (me and a me-correlate) or distinct semantic relations (nominative-case reference and accusative-case reference) are needed to account for this.

Predicative Expressions

The multiplicity of ways of talking about properties can be obscured when we use familiar formal languages to represent them. The constructions verb (‘lives’), verb + adverb (‘sings badly’), copula + adjective (‘is red’), copula + determiner + common noun (‘is a dog’), copula + noun phrase (‘is a Republican President), and (if Davidson's account of events is correct) even adverbs (‘slowly’) and prepositional phrases (‘in the bathroom’) all go over into the familiar ‘F’s and ‘G’s of standard logical notation. The fact that these expressions can often be handled in the same way without too much violence tells us that they have certain similarities, but there are also many differences, and some of them may turn out to be relevant to ontology.

Singular Terms

The complexities involving property words are even greater when we turn to singular terms. We can form singular terms from predicative expressions in many ways (different ways are appropriate for different predicates). To begin with, English contains a plethora of suffixes that we can append to predicative expressions (sometimes after minor surgery on the original) to form singular terms. These include ‘-hood’ (‘motherhood, ‘falsehood), ‘-ness’ (‘drunkeness’, ‘betweeness’), ‘-ity’ (‘triangularity’, ‘solubility’, ‘stupidity’), ‘-kind’ (‘mankind’), ‘-ship’ (‘friendship’, ‘brinksmanship’), ‘ing’ (‘walking’, ‘loving’), ‘ment’ (‘commitment’, ‘judgment’), ‘cy’ (‘decency’, ‘leniency’), and more.

Various philosophical terms of art serve a similar purpose. The word ‘itself’ plays this role in some translations of Plato (‘The equal itself’, ‘Justice itself’), and contemporary authors use phrases like ‘the property red’, ‘the property of being red’, and ‘the causal relation’ to much the same end. Various gerundive phrases (e.g., ‘being red’ and ‘being a red thing’) and infinitive phrases (‘to be happy’, ‘to be someone who is happy’) work in a similar way. Finally, there are many less systematic ways of talking about properties; for example, we can use a definite description that a property just happens to satisfy (‘the color of my true love's hair’, ‘John's favorite four-place relation’).

The expressions formed in these ways occupy subject positions in sentences where they seem to denote to properties. It is worth noting, however, that it is often impossible to substitute some of these expressions for related ones without destroying the grammaticality or, in some cases, without altering the truth value of the original sentence. Consider ‘wisdom’, ‘being wise’, ‘the property of being wise’, and ‘to be wise’. ‘Wisdom is a virtue’ is unexceptionable, but ‘Being wise is a virtue’ is shaky at best. On the other hand, ‘To be wise is to be virtuous’ and ‘Being wise is a good thing’ are fine, but ‘Wisdom is to be virtuous’ clearly won't do. And ‘The property of being wise is a good thing’ is grammatical, but has a different meaning from ‘Being wise is a good thing’.

The phenomenon of case shows that lack of substitutivity alone doesn't have deep ontological consequences, but it is quite possible that the sorts of phenomena noted in the previous paragraph signal important differences in ontology. Some of these differences might begin to emerge from informal probing, but we cannot expect to settle such matters without detailed, philosophically-sensitive syntactic and semantic theories that are better supported than their rivals. Such theories do not yet exist, and so here I will be fairly cavalier about "property terms," using various phrases, e.g., ‘redness’ and ‘the property of being red’ indifferently to refer to the same property. But this expedient is not meant to suggest that subtle grammatical differences won't eventually turn out to have important ontological implications.

2. Philosophical Explanations: Why Think that Properties Exist?

2.1 Explanation in Ontology

Properties are typically introduced to help explain or account for phenomena of philosophical interest. The existence of properties, we are told, would explain qualitative recurrence or help account for our ability to agree about the instances of general terms like ‘red’. In the terminologies of bygone eras, properties save the phenomena; they afford a fundamentum in re for things like the applicability of general terms. Nowadays philosophers make a similar point when they argue that some phenomenon holds because of or in virtue of this or that property, that a property is its foundation or ground for it, or that a property is the truth maker for a sentence about it. These expressions signify explanations.

When properties are introduced to help explain certain philosophically puzzling phenomena, we have a principled way to learn what properties are like: since they are invoked to play certain explanatory roles, we can ask what they would have to be like in order to play the roles they are introduced to fill. What, for example, would their existence or identity conditions need to be for them to explain the (putative) modal features of natural laws or the a priori status of mathematical truths?

The Limits of Explanation

Perhaps the deepest question in ontology is when (if ever) it is legitimate to postulate the existence of entities (like possible worlds, facts, or properties) that are not evident in experience. Some philosophers insist that it never is. Others urge that at least some entities of this sort, in particular properties, have no explanatory power and that appeals to them are vacuous or otherwise illegitimate (e.g., Quine, 1961, p. 10; Quinton 1973, p. 295).

The more heavy-handed dismissals of properties and other metaphysical creatures have often been based on faulty accounts of concept formation (which led Hume to counsel consignment of metaphysical works to the flames) or defective theories of meaning (which led many positivists to view metaphysics as a series of pseudo explanations offered to solve pseudo problems). Wittgenstein takes a more subtle approach, trying to show us that ‘our disease is one of wanting explanations’ (1991, Pt VI, 31) and striving to cure us of it. Swoyer (1999) has attempted some defense of explanation by postulation in ontology, but the issues are difficult ones that are not amenable to proof or disproof. Fortunately the present task is not to defend explanation in ontology, but it will be useful to briefly note two general views about such explanations.

Two Views of Explanation in Ontology

Metaphysics has traditionally been viewed as first philosophy, and some philosophers hold that its arguments should be demonstrative. Recently Linsky & Zalta (1995) have argued that it is possible to give a transcendental argument for the existence of properties; if this argument is successful, it is demonstrative, and they claim that its conclusion (that a wide range of properties exist) is synthetic a priori. Others (e.g., Swoyer, 1983; 1999) urge that most of the arguments advanced on behalf of properties appear anemic when judged by the demonstrative ideal, but that they look much better when viewed as inferences to the best explanations. We will not pursue this issue, however, since it is impossible to form a satisfactory view about the nature of philosophical explanations in a vacuum. An account of metaphysical explanation should instead emerge from a consideration of the more plausible metaphysical explanations, and we will focus on such explanations here.

2.2 Constraints on Explanations Employing Properties

Parochial Constraints

Philosophical explanations are usually thought to be constrained in various ways, but beyond philosophical family values like consistency, parsimony and comprehensiveness these constraints will often seem parochial to those philosophers who are not committed to them. In Medieval disputations about universals, for example, religion and theology were fundamental, and it was widely held that any account of properties should be able to explain the Trinity, the Eucharist, and the absolutely unchanging nature of God (this last requirement often led to quite tortured accounts of the relations holding between protean finite beings and God). But few philosophers in our naturalistic era would give such considerations a second thought.

More General Constraints

Some proposed constraints on metaphysical explanation depend on more general philosophical orientations. For example, Russell's Principle of Acquaintance, the injunction that we only admit items into our ontology if we are directly acquainted with them, expresses an strong empiricist sentiment. Other constraints are more directly metaphysical. For example, Aristotle upbraids Plato for separating the Forms from their instances, suggesting that this renders them incapable of explaining anything (e.g., Metaphysics,1079b11-1080a10). His point seems to be that properties could explain things about individuals only if they were located in those individuals. The sentiment is that an individual, spatio-temporal object (like my cat) which stands in some obscure relation to some entity entirely outside of space and time (say the Form of the cat) cannot explain anything about the cat itself.

Mandatory Constraints

All accounts of properties must avoid various perennial objections to them. Three criticisms of this sort were anticipated by Plato (worrying about his own doctrines) in the Parmenides.

First, it appears that a universal property can be in two completely different places (i.e., in two different instances) at the same time, but ordinary things can never be separated from themselves in this way. There are scattered individuals (like the former British Empire), but they have different spatial parts in different places. Properties, by contrast, do not seem to have spatial parts; indeed, they are sometimes said to be wholly-present in each of their instances. But how could a single thing be wholly present in widely separated locations?

This conundrum has worried some philosophers so much that they have opted for an ontology of tropes in order to avoid it, but realists have two lines of reply (both of which commit us to fairly definite views about the nature of properties). One response is that properties are not located in their instances (or anywhere else), so they are never located in two places at once. The other response is that this objection wrongly judges properties by standards that are only appropriate for individuals. Properties are a very different sort of entity, and they can exist in more than one place at the same time without needing spatial parts to do so.

Second, some properties seem to exemplify themselves. For example, if properties are abstract objects, then the property of being abstract should itself exemplify the property of being abstract. In various passages throughout his dialogues Plato appears to hold that Forms (which are often taken to be his version of properties) participate in themselves. Indeed, this claim serves as a premise in what is known as his Third-Man Argument which, he seems to think, may show that the very notion of a Form is incoherent (Parmenides, 132ff). Russell's paradox raises more serious worries about self-exemplification. It shows that any account which allows properties to exemplify themselves must be carefully formulated if it is to avoid paradox (a polite word for inconsistency).

Third, many critics have charged that properties generate vicious regresses, e.g., the one exhibited in Plato's third man argument or Bradley's regress, and any viable account of properties must have the resources to avoid them.

The disputes about plausible constraints on property-invoking explanations, together with the obvious difficulty of settling such disputes, leave the situation murkier than we would wish. We will see that the use of properties to explain phenomena in the philosophy of mathematics or naturalistic ontology or the semantics of natural languages imposes additional, tighter, constraints that make it easier to evaluate competing accounts. But constraints of the sort noted here have played a central role in many philosophical discussions of properties, and we will often fail to understand those discussions if we forget this.

2.3 The Fundamental Ontological Tradeoff

Metaphysics, like life, is full of tradeoffs, cost-benefit analyses, the attempt to simultaneously satisfy competing constraints. In ontology we must frequently weigh tradeoffs between various desiderata, e.g., between simplicity and comprehensiveness, and even between different kinds of simplicity. But one tradeoff is so pervasive that it deserves a name, and I will call it the fundamental ontological tradeoff. The fundamental ontological tradeoff reflects the perennial tension between explanatory power and epistemic risk, between a rich, lavish ontology that promises to explain a great deal and a more modest ontology that promises epistemological security. The more machinery we postulate, the more we might hope to explain — but the harder it is to believe in the existence of all the machinery.

The dialectic between a realism with chutzpah and a diffident empiricism runs all through philosophy, from ethics to philosophy of science to philosophy of mathematics to metaphysics. Excessive versions of each view are usually unappealing. Extreme realists ask us to believe in things many philosophers find it difficult to believe in; extreme empiricists wind up unable to explain much of anything. But the dialectic between power and risk remains even when we move in from the extremes. It often manifests itself in a yearning for parsimony, a desire for as few entities as we can scrimp by with. Such longings may seem prudish or stuffy or a bit too metaphysically correct. Often the desire is not to achieve parsimony for its own sake, however, but to find an ontology that is modest enough to provide a measure of epistemological security. Choices needn't be all or none, and a principled middle ground is always worth striving for. But no matter where a philosopher tries to stake her claim, the fundamental ontological tradeoff can rarely be avoided and we will encounter it frequently in what follows.

3. Traditional Explanations: An Unscientific Survey

Properties have been invoked to explain a very wide range of phenomena. The things to be explained (explananda; singular explanandum) are a mixed bag, and the explanations vary greatly in plausibility. To fix ideas, we will note several of the most common explanations philosophers have asked properties to provide (for a longer list see Swoyer, 1999, §3).

3.1 Resemblance and Recurrence

There are objective similarities or groupings in the world. Some things are alike in certain ways. They have the same color or shape or size; they are protons or lemons or central processing units. A puzzle, sometimes called the problem of the One over the Many, asks for an account of this. Possession of a common property (e.g., a given shade of yellow) or a common constellation of properties (e.g., those essential to lemons) has often been cited to explain such resemblance. Similarly, different groups of things, e.g., Bill and Hillary, George and Barbara, can be related in similar ways, and the postulation of a relation (here being married to) that each pair jointly instantiates is often cited to explain this similarity. Finally, having different properties, e.g., different colors, is often said to explain qualitative differences. A desire to explain qualitative similarity and qualitative difference has been a traditional motivation for realism with respect to universals, and it continues to motivate many realists today (e.g., Armstrong, 1984, p 250; Butchvarov, 1966; Aaron, 1967, ch. 9).

3.2 Recognition of New and Novel Instances

Many organisms easily recognize and classify newly encountered objects as yellow or round or lemons or rocks, they can recognize that one new thing is larger than a second, and so on. Some philosophers have urged that this ability is based partly on the fact that the novel instances have a property that the organism has encountered before — the old and new cases share a common property — and that the creature is somehow attuned to recognize it.

3.3 Meaning

Our ability to use general terms (like ‘yellow, ‘lemon’, ‘heavier than’, ‘between’) provides a linguistic counterpart to the epistemological phenomenon of recognition and to the metaphysical problem of the One over the Many. Most general terms apply to some things but not to others, and in many cases competent speakers have little trouble knowing when they apply and when they do not. Philosophers have often argued that possession of a common property (like redness), together with certain linguistic conventions, explains why general terms apply to the things that they do. For example Plato noted that ‘we are in the habit of postulating one unique Form for each plurality of objects to which we apply a common name’ (Republic, 596A; see also Phaedo 78e, Timaeus, 52a, Parmenides, 13; Russell, Problems of Philosophy, p. 93). Questions about the meanings (now often known as the ‘semantic values’) of singular terms like ‘honesty’ and ‘hunger’ and ‘being in love’ may be even more pressing, since the chief task of such terms seems to be to refer to things. But what could a word like ‘honesty’ refer to? If there are properties, it could refer to the property honesty.

3.4 Unification and Triangulation

In a brilliant paper on Plato's theory of Forms (which, as noted above, are often taken to be his version of properties), the classicist H. F. Cherniss (1936) argues that Plato intended his theory to solve three fundamental philosophical problems. By the end of the fifth century B.C. the arguments and conundrums of philosophers had cast doubt on several things that Plato thought were obviously true. In ethics Protagorean relativism threatened the view that ethical principles could be objective; in the clamor of individual disagreements, clashes between cultures, and the failure of philosophical inquiry to locate any firm ground, the challenge was to explain how ethical objectivity was possible. When Plato turned to epistemology, various considerations convinced him that there was an important difference between knowledge (episteme) and belief (doxa), even between knowledge and true belief (right opinion). But how could we explain that? Finally, in metaphysics it seemed clear that things change in various ways, but the arguments of Parmenides made even this seem mysterious.

Plato drew on his Forms to explain how these three phenomena were possible. On his view, the Forms exist pure and unadulterated by human thought, and some Forms, most prominently the Good, offer objective standards for values like goodness and justice. In epistemology Plato attempted to explain the difference between knowledge and belief by arguing that Forms are the objects of the former but not the latter (e.g., Timaeus, 51d3ff). In metaphysics Plato argued that change is only possible against a background of things that do not change, and he urged that the Forms provided this (Cratylus, 439d3ff). Finally, although Cherniss doesn't mention it, Plato's theory of Forms helped explain the semantics of general terms (as suggested in Republic, 596A).

This isn't to say that all, or indeed any, of Plato's explanations were successful. But it is worth noting that many philosophers still invoke properties to account for the sorts of things Plato struggled to explain. Early in this century G. E. Moore offered an alternative to ethical naturalism by claiming that goodness is a simple, non-natural property. Few contemporary philosophers would accept Moore's anti-naturalism or his account of non-natural properties, but many would defend ethical naturalism by arguing that moral properties supervene on naturalistically respectable properties.

Virtually no philosophers accept Plato's account of the difference between knowledge and belief, but many still hold that properties have an important role to play in explaining epistemological phenomena. For example, Russell (1912, ch. 10) argued that the only way to explain the possibility of a priori knowledge is to regard it as knowledge of relations among universals . Most philosophers today would question this, but many of them would agree that properties have an important role to play in explaining such epistemological phenomena as our ability to recognize and categorize things in the world around us.

Few contemporary philosophers would endorse Plato's claims about the need for some permanent backdrop for flux, but properties can still be cited to explain change. If my pet chameleon was brown all over yesterday and is green all over today, then the brute existence of the creature isn't enough to explain the change; after all, he persisted throughout. But, some philosophers urge, we can explain the alteration by noting that the chameleon exemplified the property brownness yesterday but he exemplifies the property greenness today.

Finally, many philosophers would concur that Plato's account of the meanings of general terms was on the right track, though as we shall see in §4.2, current accounts of meaning have moved far beyond Plato's in their detail and formal sophistication.

Explanation by Unification

This brief survey of putative explanations that rely on properties isn't meant to be detailed or exhaustive; the point is simply to illustrate how a range of accounts employ properties in an effort to explain philosophically puzzling phenomena. Just as importantly, Plato's account suggests an attractive model for philosophical explanation. A general pattern of explanation by unification, integration or systematization is at work in his attempt to solve three, superficially disparate, problems using the same resources. He attempts to show that at a fundamental level the three phenomena are related, linked by the Forms and the principles than govern them. This unification has explanatory value, since it allows us to see a single pattern or entity at work in a range of superficially diverse cases. At all events, this is one explanatory virtue in the natural sciences, clearly at work in the work of Newton and Maxwell and Darwin, and it is also a pattern we find in Plato's account.

An account that employs properties to do multiple tasks has two further virtues. First, insofar as each of the explanations is plausible, it serves as part of a cumulative case for the existence of properties. Second, if properties can perform multiple tasks, they must simultaneously satisfy multiple constraints, and so different sorts of data can be used to test a theory of properties. The hope is that by considering several tasks of this sort we could begin to triangulate in on the nature of properties; we could begin to see what features properties would need to have in order to play each of the different explanatory roles. It may turn out, of course, that entities well-suited to one explanatory role will be ill-suited to another. For example, we will see below that the existence and identity conditions of entities used to account for causation may be rather different from those needed by entities that could serve as the meanings of intentional idioms (like ‘is thinking of Vienna’). This might lead us to postulate the existence of several kinds of properties; alternatively, it might lead us to conclude that properties cannot do all of the things philosophers has hoped that they could. Either way, as fragmentation increases, cumulative support and triangulation on the nature of properties will slip away.

4. What have you done for us lately? Recent Explanations

Properties alone cannot explain much of anything. A theory of properties — an account that tells us what properties are like and how they do what they are invoked to do — is required for that. A number of theories of properties have been developed over the last quarter century, and many of them possess much more depth, sophistication, and formal detail than the no-frills accounts alluded to in the previous section. I will focus on explanations in three areas where properties are often invoked today: philosophy of mathematics, semantics (the theory of meaning), and naturalistic ontology. These areas are also useful to consider, because if properties can explain things of interest to philosophers who don't specialize in metaphysics, things like mathematical truth or the nature of natural laws, then properties will seem more interesting. Unlike the substantial forms derided by early modern philosophers as dormitive virtues, properties will pay their way by doing interesting and important work.

My aim is to indicate the general lay of the land and point the way to more detailed discussions that interested readers can follow up. In each of the three cases I will indicate:

  1. What is to be explained. As with most things in philosophy, there is often some controversy over which things in a given area stand in need of philosophical explanation. In some cases a few philosophers question the very existence of the things that other philosophers think require explanation; for example, able philosophers have denied that there are such things as mathematical truth (e.g., Field, 1980) or laws of nature (e.g., van Fraassen, 1989). And even those philosophers who think that we need to explain certain things, e.g., various features of mathematical truth, may disagree about precisely what those features are. In the three areas examined in this section, however, there is a reasonable degree of consensus about which things stand in need of explanation, and I will focus on these.
  2. How properties explain. In some cases different philosophers use properties in different ways to explain the same phenomenon. I will focus on the simpler, more common approaches. We will also see that in most cases a theory of properties only explains things when it is conjoined with various background assumptions or auxiliary hypotheses.
  3. Beating the competition. Arguments that properties exist because they explain some particular phenomenon (like qualitative recurrence or mathematical truth) are weak if other sorts of entities can account for it just as well. Arguments that alternative accounts don't work, especially when they involve alternative putative entities (like sets or tropes), are typically based on the claim that these entities lack the requisite features to account for the explanandum. I will also note a few cases where proponents of one account of properties argue against proponents of a rival account, since these arguments typically involve disputes over the nature of properties.
  4. Difficulties. Almost all explanations that employ properties face difficulties, and I will briefly indicate the most serious of these.
  5. Lessons the explanations teach us about properties. Properties often must have certain features in order to provide certain explanations. So once we have examined a given explanation, we will ask what properties would have to be like in order to provide it. In particular, we will ask what lessons are to be learned about the existence and identity conditions of properties, their structure (if any), and their modal and epistemic status.

4.1 Mathematics

Philosophers of mathematics have focused much (arguably too much) of their attention on number theory (arithmetic). Number theory is just the theory of the natural numbers, 0, 1, 2, ..., and the familiar operations (like addition and multiplication) on them. Many sentences of arithmetic, e.g., ‘7 + 5 = 12’ certainly seem to be true, but such truths present various philosophical puzzles and philosophers have tried to explain how they could have the features they seem to have.

Explananda in Philosophy of Mathematics

Most wish lists include hopes for explanations of at least five (putative) facts; philosophers want to know:

  1. How the sentences of arithmetic can have truth values (how they can be true or false)
  2. How the sentences of arithmetic can be objectively true (or false), independently of human language and thought
  3. What the logical forms of the sentences of arithmetic are
  4. How the sentences of arithmetic can be necessarily true (or necessarily false)
  5. How the truth values of sentences of arithmetic can be known independently of experience (a priori), save for a modicum of experience needed to acquire mathematical concepts

Sample Explanations


Most attempts to use properties to explain the items on this list are versions of identificationism, the reductionist strategy that identifies numbers with things that initially seem to be different. This approach is familiar from the original versions of identificationism where numbers were identified with sets, but it is straightforward to adapt this earlier work to identify numbers with properties rather than with sets.

Properties vs. Sets

Sets are often contrasted with properties, and before proceeding it is important to note a fundamental difference between the two. If x and y are sets and have exactly the same members, then x and y are one and the same set. When x and y have precisely the same members they are said to have the same extension, and sets are often called extensional entities. Just as sets can have members, properties can have instances, things that exemplify or instantiate them, and this relation of exemplification is to properties what the membership relation is to sets.

The identity conditions of properties are a matter of dispute. Everyone who believes there are properties at all, however, agrees that numerically distinct properties can have exactly the same instances without being identical. Even if it turns out that exactly the same things exemplify a given shade of green and circularity, these two properties are still distinct. For this reason properties are often said to be intensional entities, although people often concur with this because they agree about what properties' identity conditions are not (they aren't extensional), rather than because they agree about what their identity conditions are.

The ABCs of identificationism

If we have a rich enough theory of properties, it is possible to retrace the steps of earlier versions of identificationism using properties in place of sets. The property theorist can formulate axioms for property theory that parallel the axioms of standard set theories (save for replacing the axiom of extensionality with some other identity condition, perhaps omitting the axiom of foundations, and making other minor emendations to adapt the ideas better to properties; e.g., Jubien, 1989; cf. Bealer, 1982, Ch. 6; Pollard and Martin, 1986).

There are infinitely many natural numbers (the collection of natural numbers in fact has the smallest size an infinite collection can have), so the first step in identificationist programs is to find (or postulate, or imagine) an infinite realm of properties. The next step is to identify one denizen of this realm with the number zero and to identify some operation on this realm of entities with the successor function. The key here is that successive iterations of the function yield a new and different entity every time it's applied.

There are two major species of identificationism. The first views the reducing theory (of sets, or of properties) as a branch of logic; the second views it as a substantive theory (of sets, or of properties) that makes commitments over and above those made by logic. There are important differences between the two approaches, but given the very strong nature of the logic required for logicist identificationism, the differences do not matter greatly here so I will treat both approaches together. (For a discussion of the differences, see Section 1 ("Logicist Identificationism") of the supplementary document Uses of Properties in the Philosophy of Mathematics.)

Identificationist accounts treat ‘1’ and ‘2’ as singular terms that refer to properties (those properties that are identified as the numbers 1 and 2), and they treat predicates and function symbols as denoting relations and functions. Thus, since the semantics values of ‘1’ and ‘2’ are in the extension of the relation expressed by the predicate ‘<’, the sentence ‘1 < 2’ is true and, indeed, it has the simple logical form of a predication of a two-place predicate, ‘<’, with two singular terms, ‘1’ and ‘2’, i.e., it has the simple logical form Rxy. We apply this idea to all atomic sentences in the language of arithmetic and then extend the account to all sentences in this language by the usual recursive treatments of the logical constants.

This explains how sentences of arithmetic can be objectively true (wishes 1 and 2): they are true because they describe an objective realm of mind-independent properties. And since the language we use has a straightforward referential semantics, it also supplies a very natural and straightforward account of the logical forms of the sentences of number theory (wish 3). Finally, if the properties identified with numbers are ones that exist necessarily, and if they necessarily stand in the arithmetical relations that they do, the truths of arithmetic will be necessarily true (wish 4). But taken alone property-based identificationism does not explain mathematical knowledge (wish 5; we will return to this matter below).

Some recent accounts identify numbers with properties that seem less other-worldly than those invoked by mainstream identificationists. For example, Bigelow and Pargetter (1990) argue that rational numbers are higher-order relations — ratios — among certain kinds of first-order relations. The leading idea is that if Bill is twice as tall as Sam, then Bill stands in the relation twice as tall to Sam. This relation in turn stands in the (second-order) ratio relation of 2:1 to the identity relation among objects. Such higher-order ratio relations are isomorphic to the rational numbers, and Bigelow and Pargetter go on to identify them with the rational numbers. Thus, the second-order relation 5:1 turns out to be the number five. It isn't clear how to extend the ideas to large infinite cardinals or to ordinal numbers, but they propose extending the idea to second-order relations of proportion, and identifying the reals with such proportions.

Other Property-based accounts in the Philosophy of Mathematics

There are also several non-identificationist accounts of mathematical truth that make use of properties.


The most important features, perhaps the only features, of the natural numbers are structural ones. These are the features that axiomatizations capture (zero is the first member of a countably infinite sequence, each member of the sequence has exactly one member that follows it, etc.). Such sequences are said to be omega-sequences. Structuralists (often inspired by Benacerraf, 1965) take this idea to heart and argue that any omega-sequence can play the role of the natural numbers (cf. Resnik, 1995). They claim that it's the structure that such sequences have in common, rather than the particular entities that happen to populate them, that are important for mathematics. And one way to develop this idea is to think of an omega-sequence as a very complex, relational property that could be instantiated by actual sequences of objects of the appropriate sort.

Structuralist accounts avoid one of the problems noted below (that of isomorphic models) which besets all versions of identificationism. They may also make the epistemology of mathematics slightly less puzzling, since many structural or pattern-like properties can be instantiated in the things we perceive (we perceive such a property when we recognize a melody played in different keys, for example). But they cannot deliver explanations of the truth conditions and logical forms of arithmetical sentences that are as straightforward as those provided by identificationist accounts since they don't offer us any objects to serve as the referents of the numerals.

Abstract individuals and situations

Linsky and Zalta (1995) develop a novel account of mathematical truth using Zalta's (1983) theory of abstract objects. (The account is developed in much more detail in Zalta (2000) and (1999).) It is relevant here because it is developed along side a formal account of properties that rivals Bealer's in scope and detail. Abstract objects are correlated with collections of properties (which needn't be either maximal or consistent), situations are defined as a special sort of abstract object, and mathematical theories are identified with situations that encode only propositional properties. The account is too detailed to present here, but we will discuss Zalta's basic ideas below when we turn to the identity conditions of properties.

Beating the Competition

The most obvious competitors to property-based accounts of mathematical truth identify numbers with sets, and as long as we focus solely on mathematics, sets may seem more appealing. After all, sets do have clearer identity conditions than properties. Moreover, the iterative conception of sets, a picture according to which they form a natural hierarchy, fits nicely with our picture of the structure of natural numbers, whereas an iterative conception of properties is less natural. Finally, set theory provides a powerful unifying framework in which all sorts of mathematical entities, like functions and spaces, can be reconstructed (or at least represented) in a common idiom and dealt with by a common stock of techniques (like proofs by mathematical induction).

The most compelling defense of the use of properties in the philosophy of mathematics urges that when we step back and consider the big picture we see that a rich enough stock of properties can do all the work of sets (and numbers — or that we can use them to define sets or numbers) and that properties can do further things that sets simply cannot. For example, it has been argued that properties can be used to give accounts of the semantics of English or explain the nature of natural laws. The appeal of sets, in short, results from a metaphysical myopia, but once we adopt a larger view of things we find that properties provide the best global, overall explanation.


The gravest threats to identificationism are posed by what might be called the Benacerraf problems. Authors who defend such accounts are aware of these difficulties and have proposed various responses to them, but the problems are serious and no solutions are generally accepted.

The Problem of Isomorphic Identifications

As Benacerraf (1965) noted, if there is one way to identify the natural numbers with sets, there are countless ways, e.g., Frege's, Zermelo's, von Neumann's, etc. (For a brief discussion of this, see Section 2 ("Set-theoretic Identificationism") of the supplementary document Uses of Properties in the Philosophy of Mathematics.) Some accounts are better for certain purposes than others. But no account is best for all purposes, and if one was, no one has ever explained how it would follow that it was the true story about numbers.

There is a similar arbitrariness in any particular identification of numbers with properties (as the fact that different property theorists identify numbers with different properties shows). The point is most obvious with those theories that treat properties as intensional analogues of sets, since it is well-known that numbers can be identified with sets in myriad ways. But it will be a problem for any identificatory program, since there will be many isomorphic models of number theory in the realm of properties (if it is commodious enough to provide any models at all). And there is no reason for thinking that any particular model gives The One True Story about what the numbers actually are.

This difficulty also threatens less formal property-based accounts. For example, there is some arbitrariness in Bigelow and Pargetter's identifications, since we can find many different models of the theory of rational numbers among the realm of ratio relations (e.g., we could identify n/m with the relation n:m or with the relation m:n), and there is no clear reason to suppose that one identification is the right one.

The Problem of Epistemic Access

The second problem, suggested by Benacerraf (1973) a few years later, is that most versions of identificationism propose to identify numbers with putative objects that lie outside the spatio-temporal, causal order. The problem is that we are physical organisms living in a spatio-temporal world who cannot interact causally (or in any other discernible way) with abstract, causally inert things. Few people are aware of having any special cognitive faculty that puts them in touch with a timeless realm of abstract objects, neuroscientists have never found any system in the brain that subserves such a capacity, such a story is not suggested by what is known about the ways in which children acquire numerical concepts, and nothing in physics remotely suggests any way in which a physical system (the brain) can make any sort of contact with causally inert, non-physical objects. None of this proves that we don't have some sort of access to an abstract realm of objects, but the claim that we do leaves the epistemology of mathematics a mystery and, more importantly, there seems to be little positive reason to suppose that it's true.

A few philosophers, e.g., Linsky & Zalta (1995) have taken the problem of epistemic access seriously, and proposed solutions that do not involve mysterious cognitive faculties. Philosophers remain divided on this issue, but it is safe to say that if the problem of epistemic access cannot be overcome, it in turn undermines identificationist attempts to use properties to explain arithmetic truth. If we cannot gain epistemic access to the realm of numbers, then there is no clear way for us to establish connections between the items of our language (e.g., ‘one’) and the numbers they denote. We can't, for example, say that zero is the first number until we manage to attach the word ‘number’ to the realm of numbers. It might seem that we could avoid this difficulty by using purely structural descriptions, ones employing only logical vocabulary, for the task. If such descriptions were couched in a sufficiently powerful language they could be used to characterize the natural numbers up to isomorphism. Such a characterization is all we could ask of any formalization, but it isn't enough to pick out the natural numbers themselves, since if there is one model of a purely structural sentence incorporating such a description, there will be many. For example, such a sentence will have models in the domains of the positive real numbers, the negative real numbers, many fragments of the iterative hierarchy of sets, and so on.

Once again we face the fundamental ontological tradeoff: A richer ontology offers to explain many things that might otherwise be mysterious. But in the view of many philosophers, it engenders epistemological mysteries of its own.

Excursus: Other Reductions

Identificationists sometimes speak of reducing numbers to properties. Similarly, one might hope to reduce other things, e.g., possible worlds, to properties (e.g., Zalta, 1983, §4.2; Forrest, 1986). The aim is to show that they such things are nothing over and above very complicated properties.

Bundle Theories

One of the most interesting reductionist programs attempts to reduce individuals or particulars to collections of properties. Such programs are often called bundle theories, since they identify ordinary individuals with bundles of properties. Russell (1948, Pt. IV, ch. 8) developed one account of this sort in which individuals were treated as properties linked together by a relation he called compresence. The evaluation of such accounts would require an excursus into the ontology of individuals where issues like the problem of individuation, the identity of indiscernibles, and identity through time loom large. Such matters lie outside the scope of our present discussion, though it is worth noting that they involve a purer version of ontology than theories of properties; they have relatively few implications outside of ontology itself.

Lessons About Properties

What do property-based versions of identificationism tell us about the nature of properties? We can read off minimum requirements from the fact that in this domain sets can do most of the work that properties are invoked to do.

Existence Conditions: We require an infinite realm containing at least aleph-null (the smallest infinite cardinal number) many properties. Depending on our aspirations, we may need many more. For example, if we want to work with huge transfinite cardinal numbers, we will need a very large infinity of properties.

Identity Conditions: Formalized mathematics is one of the few domains where extensionality reigns, and the fact that sets can be used as surrogates of the natural numbers tells us that entities with very coarse-grained identity conditions can do at least most of the work of numbers.

Structure: The realm of properties has to include enough relations among properties to give it the structure of an omega-sequence. And if we want to identify others sorts of numbers, e.g., the real, or complex, or transfinite ordinal numbers, with properties, we will require many additional properties as well as further relations to structure them in the right sorts of ways.

Modal Status: If the truths or arithmetic are necessarily true, then we need a realm of necessarily existing properties that necessarily stand in the (mathematically relevant) relations that they do.

Epistemic Status: If the truths of arithmetic can be known a priori, then the arithmetic features of those properties that play the role of numbers must be knowable a priori.

4.2 Semantics and Logical Form

Language and logic have long been an important source of data for ontologists. Many philosophers have contented themselves with fairly informal appeals to various features of language to support their claim that properties exist, but in the last two decades some philosophers (along with a few linguists and even computer scientists) have employed properties as parts of detailed accounts of the semantics (meaning) of large fragments of natural languages like English or Choctaw, and some of these accounts contain the most detailed formal theories of properties ever devised. Some property theorists are motivated almost exclusively by a desire to give a semantic account of natural language (e.g., Chierchia and Turner, 1988), others hold that this is but one of several motivations for developing an account of properties (e.g., Bealer, 1982; Zalta, 1993), but it should be noted that still others (e.g., Jubien, 1989; Armstrong, 1997; cf. Mellor, 1986, pp. 180ff) doubt that properties have any serious role to play in semantics at all.

Explananda in Semantics

Logical form

Semantic accounts often go hand in hand with theories of logical form. Logical form is a technical notion motivated by the observation that sentences with a similar surface structure may exhibit quite different logical behavior. For example, ‘John is tall and Tom is tall’ entails ‘Tom is tall’, but ‘You show me someone who dislikes John and I'll show you a real misanthrope’ does not entail ‘I'll show you a real misanthrope’. Furthermore, sentences that appear different on the surface may exhibit similar logical behavior. For example, ‘You show me someone who dislikes John and I'll show you a real misanthrope’ and ‘If you show me someone who dislikes John, then I'll show you a real misanthrope’ evince similar logical behavior.

Such facts led various philosophers to introduce a theoretical notion of logical form and to use it to provide theoretical redescriptions of sentences in terms of their logical form in a way that allows us to explain their logical features (e.g., why they are consistent with some sentences but not with others or why they entail the sentences they do). Although philosophers differ in how systematic they are in developing such accounts, most arguments to the effect that properties are needed to explain linguistic phenomena are linked to some conception of logical form.

Sample Explanations

Informal appeals to language and logic

We will begin with four linguistic phenomena that might be explained by a relatively informal and somewhat piecemeal account of properties.

  1. General terms like ‘blue’ and ‘honest’ can apply to a variety of things, they apply to the things that they do partly because of their meanings, and in some cases where two predicates in fact apply to exactly the same things, they could have applied to different things.
  2. Abstract singular terms like ‘courage’ can occupy subject position in true sentences (‘Courage is a virtue’), they seem to be referring singular terms, and many of sentences of this sort (e.g., ‘Courage is Tom's favorite virtue’) cannot be paraphrased in a way that eliminates the abstract singular term.
  3. We can use pronouns (which certainly seem to be referring expressions) that are anaphorically linked back to predicates (‘Clinton is undisciplined, and that is a bad quality in a president’) or to terms in subject position like gerunds (‘Being undisciplined is deplorable, and it also endangers others’).
  4. Many sentences of English appear to quantify over the semantics values of predicates (‘Clinton is tenacious, so there is at least one virtue that he has’) or abstract singular terms (‘Lethargy is a symptom of mononucleosis, so there is at least one symptom of that malady’). And although some of these sentences can perhaps be paraphrased or reconstrued in ways that dispel the appearance of quantification, many have resisted years of such attempts. For example, ‘There are some properties that will never be named’ cannot be interpreted as an ontologically harmless substitutional quantification. We can also count the things predicates or abstract singular terms stand for (e.g., ‘There are exactly two symptoms that mononucleosis and Barr-Epstein syndrome have in common’) and abstract singular terms can flank the identity predicate (e.g., ‘I believe in the unity of virtue: courage and temperance are the same thing’).

As long as we lack a precise mathematical characterization of English, it isn't possible to prove that certain idioms cannot be paraphrased away. But the use of abstract singular terms is so common and the failures of attempts to paraphrase them away are so clearcut that there is no reason to think that they could be eliminated from English without eviscerating it.

A relatively unsophisticated account of properties can be mobilized to explain the four phenomena listed above in a way that allows us to use a relatively straightforward referential semantics with objectual quantifiers. Such accounts explain the meanings of general terms (item 1) like ‘honest’ by claiming that they denote (or express) properties (like honesty), that a sentence like ‘Tom is honest’ has the logical form of a simple, subject-predicate sentence, and that it is true just in case the individual denoted by ‘Tom’ is in the extension of the property denoted (or expressed) by the predicate ‘honest’, which requires that there be a property expressed by this predicate (a slightly more formal account is given below; see Hochberg, 1968, for a good discussion of related issues).

In a similar spirit, some philosophers argue that abstract singular terms like ‘honesty’ (item 2) denote the property that the associated predicate (‘honest’) denotes or expresses, that sentences like ‘Honesty is a virtue’ have the simple logical form of a subject-predicate sentence, and that the sentence is true exactly when the word ‘honesty’ denotes a property that is in the extension of the property denoted by the verb phrase ‘is a virtue’.

Once we take these steps, it is also straightforward to explain the remaining items on our list. For example the validity of the argument: ‘Clinton is self-indulgent; therefore, there is at least one vice that Clinton has’ can be explained as follows: The logical form of the premise is that a simple subject-predicate sentence and the logical from of the conclusion is that of an existential quantification with a standard objectual quantifier. If the first sentence is true, then ‘self-indulgent’ expresses a property, and this property satisfies the open sentence ‘Clinton is X’. Hence, just as in standard first-order logic, the existential quantification is true. Similar maneuvers allows us to explain the remaining items on this list: if properties are genuine things, then we can count them and we can use different expressions to stand for the same property.

These explanations rely on little more than the following three claims. First, there is a rich enough stock of properties to provide a semantic value (meaning) for every predicate and abstract singular term of English (or better, for all of those that could have such semantic values without leading to paradox). Second, sentences like ‘Courage is a virtue’ and ‘John is courageous’ are simple subject-predicate sentences. Third, such sentences are true just in case the thing denoted by the subject is in the extension of the property denoted (or expressed) by the predicate.

These simple assumptions account for the phenomena on our list in a much better way than their more prominent rivals can. Some philosophers, for example, hold that predicates have a multiple denotation (multiply denoting all of the things to which they apply). Others hold that the semantic values of predicates are sets (the sets of things to which they apply). But these accounts cannot explain the fact that many pairs of predicates that in fact have the same extension (and hence the same multiple denotation‘) could have applied to different groups of things and that their meanings are precisely what allow them to do so. Even more seriously, these two rivals have no plausible account at all of the last three items on the list.

More formal accounts of language and logic

If the goal is simply to argue that there are properties because there is no other way to explain several obvious linguistic and logical phenomena (which is all many philosophers have aspired to show), then the simple accounts sketched above make a plausible (though certainly not unassailable) start. Some philosophers have set their sights higher, however, wanting to provide a rigorous and systematic account of the semantics of a large fragment of English. They try to work the above ideas out in a more detailed way and to extend them to deal with more complex phenomena, including the following:

  1. Various English constructions are quite naturally interpreted as complex predicates: ‘Tom is a boring but honest brother of Sam’ is straightforwardly construed as a containing a compound predicate, ‘is a boring but honest brother of Sam’ that is predicated of the noun ‘Tom’ (and that could be predicated of other nouns too, e.g., ‘Wilbur’). Other constructions are very naturally interpreted as complex singular terms (as in ‘Being a boring but honest brother of Sam is no bed of roses’). Furthermore, these complex expressions are related to simpler expressions in systematic ways. For example, ‘Tom is a boring but not dishonest brother of Sam’ should entail ‘Tom is not dishonest’.
  2. English is full of intensional idioms like ‘necessarily’, ‘believes’ and ‘imagines’ that cannot be handled by any extensional semantics.

The simple, informal claim that there are properties cannot explain such phenomena in a systematic way, especially when they are combined (as in ‘Tom believes that it is necessarily the case that being a seventh son is more like being a sixth son than like being a fifth son’).

In recent years a number of philosophers (e.g., Bealer, 1982, 1994; Zalta, 1983, 1988; Chierchia & Turner, 1988; Menzel, 1993) have developed intricate accounts that include formal logics whose semantics provide systematic ways of forming "compound" properties (e.g., loving Darla) to serve as semantic values of complex predicates (‘loves Darla’) or complex singular terms (‘loving Darla). The details of such accounts are too complex to pursue here (although a generic account of some of the central ideas will be sketched in §8). It should be noted, however, that most philosophers who aspire to a semantic account of large intensional fragments of English introduce propositions, which they treat as zero-place properties.

The proper treatment of intentional idioms like ‘believes that’ also require properties that are very finely individuated, probably as finely individuated as the linguistic expressions that denote or express them. For example Tom's grasp of logic may be so tenuous that he believes of Ortcutt that he is a spy and an auditor for the IRS but doubts that he is an auditor for the IRS and a spy. This is sometimes taken to suggest that being a spy and an auditor for the IRS is distinct from the (necessarily coextensive) property being an auditor for the IRS and a spy. To be sure, few people are guilty of such blatant lapses, but we can certainly make mistakes when necessarily coextensive properties are described in more complicated ways (such errors are routine in mathematics and logic).

On the plausible (though not inevitable) assumption that the structure of many of our thoughts is similar to the structure of the sentences we use to describe the contents of those thoughts (‘Sam thinks Tom is boring but not dishonest’), we might also hope to use properties in an account of mental content that would in many ways parallel an account of the semantics of the more intensional fragments of English.

Beating the Competition

Accounts that treat the semantic values of predicates as sets can handle a certain amount of English if we are willing to twist ("regiment") it into a rather complex, even tortured logical form. But little is gained by this, since such approaches cannot accommodate such simple intensional phenomena as the fact that two predicates might just happen to apply to exactly the same things even though they could have applied to different things. And extensional accounts do even worse with complex nominalizations or more complicated intensional idioms like ‘believes that’. Sets (of ordinary things) are simply too coarse-grained to make the fine distinctions semantic theories require.


The only serious alternative to the use of properties in formal semantics treats the semantic values of noun phrases and verb phrases as intensions. Intensions are functions that assign a set to the expression at each possible world (or related set-theoretic devices that encode the same information). On such accounts, for example, the semantic value of ‘red’ is the function that maps each possible world to the set of things in that world that are red. Montague (1974) and linguists and philosophers inspired by his work have devised systems inspired by this idea that have great elegance and power. Nevertheless, properties are more natural and better suited to handle many linguistic constructions than intensions are.

Properties are more natural, because we learn the meanings of many predicates by ostension, and we group objects together when they share properties that seem salient or important. I recognize the sound of an oboe or the taste of rhubarb; these are very direct and simple experiences that seem completely unrelated to functions from huge infinite sets of possible worlds to objects therein. If we learn to recognize certain properties and categorize objects in terms of such properties, this is relatively easy to understand. But if the semantic values of predicates are intensions, meanings are now incredibly complicated set-theoretic objects that require a huge ontology of possible worlds and, often, merely possible individuals.

Properties are more useful in semantics than intensions because intensions are still too coarse-grained to explain many semantic phenomena involving intensional idioms. For example, semantic accounts that employ intensions would most naturally treat ‘lasted a fortnight’ and ‘lasted two weeks’ as having the same meaning (since they have the same intension), which makes it difficult for such accounts to explain how ‘Tom believes the battle lasted two weeks, but does not believe that it lasted a fortnight’ could be true. Various stratagems are available to deal with problematic cases like this, but they are much less natural and involve a much more dubious ontology (all those sets and possible worlds) than accounts that employ properties. Furthermore, intensions are unlikely to be able to perform tasks in areas outside semantics (like naturalistic ontology) that properties may be able to do. It is natural, for example, to suppose that things have the capacities that they do (e.g., the capacity to exert a force on a distant object) because of the properties they possess (e.g., gravitational mass). But it seems most unlikely that huge, set-theoretic intensions would be able to explain things like this.

Reductions of Properties

Some philosophers have construed intensions as providing a reduction of properties to intensions (properties are nothing over and above functions from the class of possible worlds to classes of objects). We have seen that this account has little to recommend it, and it is much better to view properties (including relations, and perhaps propositions) as primitive entities. Other philosophers, less concerned with formal matters, have sometimes envisioned a reduction of properties to sets of tropes; a discussion of some of the issues this involves will be found in the entry on tropes.


Every large-scale theory of the semantics of English generates anomalies of one sort of another. Furthermore, some accounts require very large ontologies and very finely-drawn distinctions. For example, on really fine-grained accounts of the identity conditions of properties, the relations loving and the converse of its converse are distinct relations. Similarly, the properties being red and square and being square and red are distinct. We might wonder whether such distinctions exist and (if they do) what enables us to match the right linguistic expressions with the right relation? How do we match ‘red and square’ and ‘square and red’ with the correct members of the relevant pair of properties (we will return to this matter below)?

If the properties needed for semantics are completely isolated from the natural world, the epistemological problems noted in the previous subsection (on the philosophy of mathematics) resurface. We might hope to avoid this by holding that all properties are either instantiated or that they can be constructed by a series of applications of logical operations (like conjunction and negation) from properties that are instantiated. But it is far from clear that we can "construct" properties to serve as the semantic values for all English predicative expressions in this way. But could we define properties to serve as semantic values for all the predicates that lack instances? Expressions like ‘witch’ have a good bit of open texture, and it is at best an open question whether we can define them in terms of properties that are actually instantiated.

Current property-based semantic theories do not accommodate vagueness. This is a serious shortcoming, because vague predicates (like ‘bald’) and vague nominalizations (like ‘baldness’) are the rule, rather than the exception. When property-based semantic theories are modified to accommodate them, their proponents will have to decide whether vagueness is an objective feature in the world itself (so that some properties themselves are vague, in the sense of having vague or fuzzy extensions), or whether all vagueness resides in language (with properties having precise extensions and vagueness arising because it is sometimes somewhat indeterminate which sharp-edged property a given predicate or nominalization denotes).

Recent empirical work on concepts reinforces the point that many concepts (and, with them, predicates) have a graded membership and goes on to stress the importance of phenomena like typicality. Some creatures are more typical examples of birds than others, and there is some evidence that we determine whether something is a bird by assessing how similar (according to some psychological standard of similarity) it is to typical birds. This and various other phenomena have inspired a range of accounts of the structures of concepts, beginning with Rosch's (1978) account of prototypes and now including other accounts like exemplar theory (where we store exemplars of a concept in memory and determine what other things fall under that concept by assessing how similar they are to those exemplars).

Different accounts may well apply to different sorts of concepts (and perhaps, derivatively, to the predicates associated with them). For example, most mathematical concepts do have sharp boundaries, whereas many everyday concepts do not. On many recent psychological accounts, concepts involve features and similarity relations. Since features (e.g., having feathers, having a beak) are properties, there is no reason why current property theories could not be emended and extended to make contact with such accounts, and it seems likely that this will be a fruitful line of inquiry in the future (see Margolis & Laurence, 1999, for a useful selection of papers on concepts).

Lessons about Properties

What do semantic theories based on properties tell us about the nature of properties? The lessons here are less straightforward than in the philosophy of mathematics, partly because a detailed semantic theory must include a number of elements in addition to a theory of properties. For example, it must include a theory about the underlying logic in which the theory of properties is formulated, a theory about the logical forms of various English constructions (e.g., belief-sentences, gerundive phrases, parenthetical clauses), and perhaps claims that certain apparent entailment relations among English sentences don't really hold (e.g., because they are implicatures rather than logical entailments).

In short, we test a total package of such assumptions when we see how well a semantic theory accommodates our intuitions about what entails what or which groups of sentences are consistent. Moreover, somewhat different theories of properties may provide equally good accounts if we make compensatory adjustments in their underlying logics, in their accounts of the logical form of various constructions, or in our views about implicatures. Still, we have seen enough to draw some tentative lessons about properties from their use in semantics.

Existence Conditions: If we want to account for the meanings of all predicates or all abstract singular terms (save for those which would lead to paradox), we need a very large stock of properties to serve as their semantic values (and since languages are extensible, we need properties to serve as the semantic values for any words that might ever be added).

Identity Conditions: Even if we only aim to use properties as semantics values for run of the mill predicates, properties must be more finely individuated than sets. And if we hope to use properties as part of a systematic semantic account of belief attributions and other intensional idioms, they will have to be even more finely individuated than intensions. They will have to be (at least) nearly as finely individuated as the linguistic expressions that denote (or express) them.

Structure: If we want to account for the behavior of complex predicates or complex singular terms in a systematic way, properties need to have something akin to a logical structure (we will explore the relevant notion of structure in §8.2).

Modal Status: The use of properties in many parts of semantics does not obviously require that properties exist necessarily. But when we turn to portions of English that explicitly involve the alethic modalities and related notions, i.e., when we turn to sentences (like ‘Red is necessarily a color’, ‘7 is necessarily prime’), the most natural accounts will involve properties that exist necessarily.

Epistemic Status: If properties are used to furnish semantic values for a multitude of expressions of a natural language like English or Choctaw, then we will need a lavish realm of properties that includes properties that are not instantiated. If such properties raise epistemological problems, then there will be difficulties explaining how our linguistic behavior, here in the natural world, involves properties we couldn't know much about. Furthermore, the more facts about language we can know a priori, the more likely it is that we will need some sort of a priori access to properties.

4.3 Naturalistic Ontology

In recent years properties have played a central role in philosophical accounts of scientific realism, measurement, causation, dispositions, and natural laws. This is a less unified set of concerns than those encountered in the previous two subsections, but it is still a clearly recognizable area, and I will call it naturalistic ontology. The use of properties in naturalistic ontology is often less formal and more varied than the work in the areas we have examined. I will indicate the flavor of this work by describing several noteworthy treatments of topics in the area.

Scientific Realism

Even quite modest and selective versions of scientific realism are most easily developed with the aid of properties. This is so because they offer a way to account for the following phenomena.

Quantification over Properties

Claims that appear to quantify over properties are common in science.

  1. If one organism is fitter than a conspecific, then there is at least one property the first organism has that gives it a greater propensity to reproduce than the second.
  2. There are many inherited characteristics, but there are no acquired characteristics that are inherited.
  3. Properties and relations measured on an interval scale are invariant under positive linear transformations, but this isn't true of all properties and relations measured on ordinal scales.
  4. In a Newtonian world all fundamental ("meaningful") properties are invariant under Galilean transformations, whereas the fundamental properties in a special-relativistic world are those that are invariant under Lorentz transformation.

No one has any idea how to paraphrase most of these claims in a non-quantificational idiom, and they certainly seem to assert (or deny) the existence of various sorts of properties. The claim that this is in fact precisely what they do explains how they can be meaningful and, in many cases, true.

Functional Properties

Many important properties like being a simple harmonic oscillator, being a gene, being an edge detector, or being a belief are often thought to be functional properties. To be a gene, for example, is to play a certain causal role in the transmission of hereditary information, and it is in principle possible for quite disparate physical mechanisms to play this role. To say that something exemplifies a functional property is, roughly, to say that there are certain properties that it exemplifies and that together they allow it to play a certain causal role. For example, DNA molecules have certain properties that allow them to transmit genetic information in pretty much in the way described by Mendel's laws. Here again, we have quantifications over properties that seem unavoidable.

Causal Powers

Much explanation in science is causal explanation, and casual explanations often proceed by citing properties of the things involved in causal interactions. For example, electrons repel one another in the way that they do because they have the same charge (we will return to this below).

Reduction and Supervenience

A few decades ago claims that one sort of thing was reducible to a second were common; e.g., one often heard that the temperature of a gas is reducible to its mean molecular kinetic energy. Nowadays we are more likely to hear that one sort of thing supervenes on another: e.g., all biological (or all psychological) features of an organism supervene on its physical properties. Such claims make the best sense if we take them to involve properties. For example the claim that the psychological realm supervenes on the physical realm is plausibly construed as the claim that, necessarily, everything that has any psychological properties also has physical properties and any two things that have exactly the same physical properties will have exactly the same psychological properties. Disputes remain about the best way to spell out the fine print, but almost all of the candidates advert to properties.

Theory Change

Some philosophers of science, most notably Feyerabend and Kuhn, argue that theoretical terms draw their meaning from the theories within which they occur. Hence, they conclude, a change in theory causes a shift in the meanings of all of its constituent terms, and so different theories simply talk about different things. And since Newton's talk of ‘mass’ and Einstein's talk of ‘mass’ are about different things, their theories cannot be rationally compared; the theories are "incommensurable". The common realist rejoinder is that the reference of terms can remain the same even when the surrounding theory shifts (at least as long as it doesn't shift too much). Now it is certainly true that some realists have placed a greater explanatory burden on reference than it can bear. But for this response to work, even in cases of small shifts in theory, terms like ‘mass’ or ‘rest mass’ or ‘mass of 3.4kg’ must refer to something, and the most plausible candidate for this is a property.


Various features of measurement are most easily explained by invoking properties.

Different ways to Measure the Same Thing

Simpler anti-realist theories of measurement (like operationalism) cannot explain how we can use different methods to measure the same thing, e.g., how we can use such different methods to measure lengths and distances in cosmology, geology, histology, and atomic physics. By contrast, the view that measurements aim to discover objective properties can explain this.

Measurement Error is a Fact of Life

In many sciences it is expected that estimates of the magnitude of measurement error will be reported along with measurement results. Indeed, in fields like econometrics and psychometrics, extremely detailed theories of error are always near center stage. But such talk makes little sense unless there is a fact about what a correct measurement would be. Since an object can have one magnitude (e.g., a rest mass of 3kg) at one time and a different magnitude (e.g., a rest mass of 4kg) at another time, the object alone cannot explain this. But it is quite naturally explained by assuming that the object instantiates two different mass properties (namely a rest mass of 3 kg, and a rest mass of 4 kg) at the two different times. It also explains why later techniques for measuring things can be more accurate than earlier methods (e.g., why Atwood's machine allowed him to measure the value of the gravitational constant much more accurately than his predecessors could).

Measurement Units are Often Specified Using Properties

Nowadays measurement units are often specified directly in terms of properties. At one time the meter was specified as the length of the standard meter bar in Paris, But we now specify the meter in terms of something that can in principle be instantiated anywhere in the world, e.g., as the length equal to a certain number of wavelengths (in a vacuum) of a particular color of light emitted by krypton 86 atoms.

These facts have led to several adaptations of the representational theory of measurement developed by Suppes and his coworkers to a framework involving properties (Mundy, 1987; Swoyer, 1987). Among other things, these accounts offer characterizations of the algebraic structure of many of the properties involved in measurement.

Causal Powers

Some philosophers have employed properties in reductive accounts of causation (cf. Tooley; 1987; Fales, 1990). It would take us too far afield to explore this work here, but it is worth noting that it is never a single, undifferentiated amorphous blob of an object (or blob of an event) that makes things happen. It is an object (or event) with properties. Furthermore, how it affects things depends on what these properties are. The liquid in the glass causes the litmus paper to turn blue because the liquid is an alkaline (and not because the liquid also happens to be blue). The Earth exerts a gravitational force of the moon because of their respective gravitational masses. And because explanations often cite causes, it is not surprising that explanations frequently cite properties: the liquid's being an alkaline explains why it turned the litmus paper blue (this doesn't preclude deeper explanations involving the molecular mechanisms that underlie this process, but they too will typically involve properties (like valence and charge)).

Some causal powers are deterministic: any object with a gravitational mass will exert a certain amount of force on an object with a certain gravitational mass at a certain distance from it. Others are indeterministic: photons can be prepared in a state that will give them a 50/50 chance of making it through a polarizer set at a certain angle. In some cases the only informative things we can say about a property are what tendencies or powers or capacities it confers on its instances. For example, the things we know about determinate charges have to do with the active and passive powers they confer on particles that instantiate them, their effects on the electromagnetic fields surrounding them, and the like. Thus, two negatively charged particles at a given distance will exert a force with a specific magnitude and direction on each other that depends on their respective charges (monadic properties) and the distance between them (a two-place relation) in accordance with Coulomb's law. Similar points hold for many other properties in science, including mass, momentum, force, electrical resistance, tensile strength, torque, and spin.

Such facts have led some philosophers to claim that properties are essentially dispositional, or even that properties just are dispositions. This led to a debate over whether all properties are dispositional (like charge and spin are) or whether some were non-dispositional (perhaps like squareness). The discussion here was considerably clarified by Shoemaker's (1984, p. 210ff) claim that it is linguistic items, rather than properties, that are dispositional or not. Some predicates, e.g., ‘fragile’, ‘flexible’, and ‘irascible’ are dispositional, whereas predicates, e.g., ‘square’ and ‘table’ arguably are not. But all properties confer causal powers on their instances; a square peg does not have the capacity to fit into a round hole (below a certain size).

Properties and Powers

Philosophers who focus on the causal or nomological capacities that properties confer on their instances often urge that properties are identical just in case they confer the same capacities on their instances (e.g., Achinstein, 1974; Armstrong, 1978, Ch. 16; Shoemaker 1984, Ch. 10-11). This general idea leaves us with questions about the relationship between properties and the capacities they bestow, but using fairly intuitive (though not incontrovertible) counting principles for properties and capacities, we can say the following:

Different Properties, Same Power: Different properties can bestow the same powers on their instances. For example, charge and gravitational mass both bestow a power to exert a force on nearby objects (that have the right sorts of properties).

Same Property, Different Powers: A single property can bestow different powers on its instances. For example, a determinate charge like the unit negative charge that characterizes electrons confers an ability to exert an attractive force on positively-charged particles and it confers an ability to exert a repulsive force on negatively-charged particles.

Although the connection between properties and powers is important, it isn't fully understood. Is a capacity an additional sort of property over and above the property that confers it? This sounds unduly complicated, but if this is not the case we need an account of the relationship.

Laws of Nature

Properties have played a central role in several recent accounts of natural laws. I will focus on two accounts that put properties at center stage; hybrids are possible, but the examples discussed here typify much recent work.

N-relation Theories

Laws of nature (e.g., the ideal gas laws, Newton's laws, Shrödinger's equation, Einstein's field equations for general relativity, conservation laws) have several important features, and the task of a philosophical account of laws is to explain how this is so. Different philosophers view different (and sometimes incompatible) features as central to laws, but those who favor what I will call N-relation theories agree that laws have (at least most of) the following five features. I will focus primarily on deterministic laws, not because they are more important than probabilistic laws, but because if an account cannot get deterministic laws right, it will have little chance with probabilistic laws.

  1. Laws are objective. We don't invent laws, we discover them.
  2. Laws have modal force. This shows up when we describe laws (or their implications) using words like ‘must’, ‘require’, ‘preclude’, and ‘impossible’.
  3. Laws, unlike accidental generalizations, are confirmed by their instances and underwrite predictions.
  4. The line between laws and non-laws is sharp; nomologicality does not come in degrees (this is implicit in the work of many N-relation theorists; Armstrong, 1983, p. 71 notes that his account depends on it).
  5. Laws have genuine explanatory power. They play a central role in scientific explanation that accidental generalizations cannot.
N-relation theories have been defended by Armstrong (e.g., 1978, 1983), Dretske (1977), Tooley (1977) and others. Their accounts differ in detail, but they share the core idea that laws of nature are relations among properties. A law is a second-order relation of nomic necessitation (N, for short) holding among two or more first-order properties. Hence the logical form of a statement of a simple law is not ‘All Fs are Gs’; in the case of a law involving two first-order properties, it is a second-order atomic sentence of the form ‘N(F,G)’.

In the more exact sciences these first-order properties (our Fs and Gs) will typically be determinate magnitudes like a kinetic energy of 1.6 × 10-2 joule or a force of 1 newton or an electrical resistance of 12.3 ohms (rather than mass or force or resistance simpliciter). Hence the laws specified by an equation (like Newton's second law) are really infinite families of specific laws where each specific, determinate mass m (a scalar, and so a monadic property) and total impressed force f (a vector, and so a relational property) stand in the N-relation to the appropriate relation (vector) of acceleration a (= f/m).

The Background: N-Relation Theories vs. Regularity Theories

The dominant accounts of laws during much of this century were regularity theories, and N-relation theories were originally devised to avoid perceived shortcomings of these earlier accounts. There are many versions of the regularity theory, but they share the core idea that laws are simply contingent regularities (or the sentences expressing them). On such views there is no metaphysical difference between genuine laws and true accidental generalizations (at least accidental generalizations involving purely qualitative predicates or properties) like ‘all cubes of pure gold weigh less than ten tons’ (which I'll assume is true). According to regularity theorists, the only difference between laws and accidental regularities is that laws have some special epistemic or pragmatic or logical trappings (e.g., they contain projectible predicates like ‘rest mass’ rather than ‘grue’ or they form part of a powerful deductive theory). The most prominent version of the regularity theory nowadays is the Ramsey-Lewis account, according to which laws are those universal generalizations that would be part of the overall systematization of our theories about the world that best combines simplicity and strength.

One of the chief attractions of regularity theories is that they have a relatively low epistemological cost. We observe instances of many regularities here in the actual world, and the additional features used to upgrade regularities to laws are not epistemically problematic in any deep way. Indeed, although there are various detailed problems with regularity theories, the major issues between N-relation theorists and regularity theorists involve the fundamental ontological tradeoff. According to N-relation theorists, regularity theories only achieve their epistemic security by being so weak that they cannot explain the fundamental features of laws. Regularity theorists counter that the N-relation is a mysterious bit of metaphysics, and that there is no way we could ever gain epistemic access to it. N-relation theorists respond that we should believe in it because it provides the best explanation of the five items on the above list. Is this response plausible? To evaluate it we need to look briefly at how those explanations are supposed to work.

N-relation Theories: Sample Explanations


According to N-relation theories, laws are objective because the N-relation relates those properties it does quite independently of our language and thought (in the case of properties that don't specifically involve our language or thought). By contrast, the epistemic and pragmatic features used by regularity theorists to demarcate laws from accidental generalizations are too anthropocentric to account for the objectivity of laws.

Modal Force

Many laws seem to necessitate some things and to preclude others. Pauli's exclusion principle requires that two fermions occupy different quantum states. The special theory of relativity doesn't allow a signal to be propagated at a velocity exceeding that of light. The laws of thermodynamics show the impossibility of perpetual motion machines. Conservation laws assure us that such quantities as angular momentum, mass-energy, and charge cannot be created or destroyed. The modal force of laws is also said to manifest itself in the way laws support counterfactuals; had there been a tenth planet, it too would have obeyed Kepler's Laws. But, N-relation theorists insist, since regularity theorists forswear everything modal, they can never account for the modal aspects of laws.

Confirmation and Prediction
N-relation theorists often argue that their accounts can, and that regularity theories cannot, explain how laws are confirmed by their instances. If laws were mere regularities, then the fact that observed Fs have been Gs would give us no reason to conclude that those Fs we haven't encountered will also be G. If the Fs we have observed are to be relevant to our belief that unobserved Fs are Gs, then there needs to be something about an object's being F that requires (or, in the case of probabilistic laws, makes it probable) that it will also be G. And if the properties F and G stand in a nomic relation, then the properties themselves (and not merely their instances) are related in a law-like way. Hence, if N-relation accounts are right, there will be something about an object's being an F that will make it be a G, and the examined cases will be related to the unexamined cases in the relevant way.
A Nice Sharp Line

Properties either stand in the N-relation or they do not. When they do, we have a law; when they do not, we don't.


The accidental regularity that all cubes of gold weigh less than ten tons doesn't explain why any particular cube of gold weighs less than ten tons. But, N-relation theorists often argue, if one property nomically necessitates a second, that does explain why anything having the first also has the second.

The Upshot

If N-relation accounts are on the right track, there is a reasonably rich realm of properties that is structured by one or more nomic relations. But before drawing this conclusion we should note that N-relation theories face difficulties of their own. Indeed, it is unclear whether N-relation theories can successfully explain all of the things they were introduced to explain, but we will focus on two more general difficulties here. (A fuller discussion of the problems for N-relation theories can be found in the supplementary document Difficulties for N-relation Accounts of Natural Laws.) First, it is not clear how to extend N-relation accounts to deal with several important kinds of laws, most prominently conservation laws and symmetry principles. Second, even in the case of laws that can be coaxed (or crammed) into the N-relation scheme, the account involves a highly idealized notion whose connection to the things that go by the name ‘law’ in labs and research centers is rather remote.

At this point some philosophers propose a distinction between the current laws of science and the true laws of nature. The former are approximate, idealized and provisional, whereas the later are precise, definite and unchanging. Furthermore, they continue, while it is perfectly respectable for philosophers to discuss the current laws of science, philosophy should also provide an account of the true laws of nature. But although some philosophers propose lists (like the one above) of features that are supposed to characterize the true laws of nature, it is not clear that there are any laws of this sort. At all events, current science doesn't force this conclusion on us, and the claim that there are such laws involves a bit of metaphysical speculation.

Properties, Powers and Laws

If we begin with actual scientific laws, we are likely to come up with quite different features from those on the list above.

  1. Laws almost always involve approximation and idealization Sometimes the idealization is so great that a law is quite inaccurate over parts of the range of phenomena it is supposed to cover (as is the law for the simple pendulum or the general gas laws). Most laws only hold ceteris paribus, "other things being equal," but other things rarely are.
  2. When we apply a law to a situation, we often use a highly simplified version of the law that everyone acknowledges is false.
  3. Laws are not in any straightforward way confirmed by their instances. Actual data and phenomena that provide evidence for a law rarely fit it exactly (even when we discount for measurement error).
  4. We often explain things by citing the causal mechanisms and processes they involve, rather than by subsuming them under general laws. For example, we do not explain why all crows are black by saying (in some more idiomatic way) that the N-relation holds between the properties being a crow and being black. We explain it by finding causal (in this case genetic) mechanisms that link the two properties. In other cases we appeal to a deeper theory, e.g., we explain why Kepler's laws hold (to the extent that they do) by deriving (approximations of) them from Newton's laws.
  5. The distinction between laws and accidental generalizations is a matter of degree. We often talk as though some laws (e.g., various conservation laws) are very fundamental and robust, while other laws (e.g., Hooke's Law, Boyle's Law, Gresham's Law) are less so.

A philosopher who sees 1-5 as central features of laws will be drawn to an account that is very different from that proposed by N-relation theorists. Far from involving universal (or even precise probabilistic) nomological relations, actual laws are idealized, approximate, and limited in scope (often applying only to highly artificial systems created in laboratories or even just to simplified models of real systems).

When N-relation theories first appeared on the scene much of their appeal was that they promised a better account of the objectivity and (perhaps) the modal status of laws than regularity theories could provide. But it is now possible to discern the beginnings of an account that explains these things (to the limited degree that they hold) and that also explains how actual laws work. I will quickly sketch a generic version of such an account here (several versions are in the air, but most of them owe a large debt to Cartwright, 1983; 1989).

We have already noted that (at least many) properties confer causal capacities and tendencies on their instances. For example, electrically charged particles have a capacity to exert forces on other particles and to affect an electromagnetic field around them in virtue of the property of having a specific, determinate charge. This is a perfectly objective fact, and it has a certain modal force (if the particles had moved away from each other, the forces would have fallen off with the square of the distance between them). This suggests the view that laws result from the operations of capacities (including probabilistic capacities). Laws tell us what happens when we shield off (or hold constant) the influence of other capacities and allow a single capacity (or just a few capacities) to work without interference. In a few cases we can shield the operation of a single capacity from outside influences in a way that allows us to make fairly precise and accurate predictions, and cases like this may approximate the N-relation theorist's conception of a law. But most laws, and most applications of laws, aren't like this. The detailed behavior of most things, including many relatively simple physical systems, results from the joint operation of many capacities or tendencies, and often it cannot be predicted, or even explained, on the basis of such laws. Accounts like Cartwright's take science at face value and they leave room for laws in fields other than basic physics. But for our purposes the most important thing about them is that they, like N-relation theories, place properties at center stage.

Lessons About Properties

The work discussed in this subsection suggests that properties include determinate physical magnitudes like being a mass of 3.7 kg and being an electrical resistance of 7 ohms. Furthermore, such properties typically form families of ordered determinates (e.g., the family of determinate masses) that have a definite algebraic structure (Mundy, 1987; Swoyer, 1987). It also suggests that a fundamental feature of at least many properties is that they confer causal capacities on their instances. Work on naturalistic ontology doesn't entail detailed answers to every question about the nature of properties, but it does suggest answers to some of them.

Existence Conditions: A natural, though not inevitable, conclusion to draw from the work discussed in this subsection is that properties exist only if they confer causal or nomological capacities on their instances. For properties: to be is to (be able to) confer causal capacities.

Identity Conditions: The most natural conclusion to draw here is that properties are identical just in case they confer exactly the same causal powers on their instances.

Structure: If N-relation theories are right, the realm of properties is structured in at least the minimal sense that many pairs of properties stand in one or more higher-order nomological relations. Properties are also related to the causal powers they confer on their instances in some intimate, though not clearly understood, way.

Modal Status: If laws of nature are metaphysically necessary, then properties that actually stand in the N-relation stand in that relation in all possible worlds in which they exist. The fact that properties confer causal powers on their instances is also naturally understood as the claim that the instances of a property have those powers in all possible worlds in which that property exists.

Epistemic Status: Philosophers who employ properties to provide explanations in naturalistic ontology typically hold that we learn about properties empirically. On some accounts all properties are instantiated, and we learn about them because their instances affect our sensory apparatus or our measuring instruments. On other accounts some properties are uninstantiated, but they are related to properties that are instantiated in systematic ways. For example, a specific determinate mass (e.g., 4 kg) might be uninstantiated, but we can describe it quite precisely (as twice as great a mass as 2 kg, which is, let us suppose, exemplified). Furthermore, we can say what causal powers it would have conferred on its instances, had it had any (e.g., we can say what gravitational force its instances would have exerted on a 2 kg object 5 meters away).

At this point it is useful to step back to note the fundamental way in which the general conception of properties discussed in this subsection differs from many of the conceptions discussed earlier. On those earlier conceptions at least many properties are causally inert, other-worldly, abstract entities that exist outside space and time; they are timeless, necessary beings, and since we cannot come into causal contact with them, our knowledge of them is problematic.

By contrast, the view that emerges from much of the work in naturalistic ontology treats properties as contingent beings that are intimately related to the causal, spatio-temporal order, and we learn what properties there are and what they are like through empirical investigation. Such properties are not much like meanings or concepts, and so it is possible to discover that a property conceived of in one way (e.g., the property of being water) is identical with a property conceived in some quite different way (e.g., the property of being H2O). It might be misleading to call such properties ‘concrete’ (the standard antonym of the slippery word ‘abstract’), but it isn't quite right to call them ‘abstract’ either. Indeed, the stark dichotomy between the abstract and concrete is probably too simple to be useful here.

5. Existence Conditions

What properties are there? Under what conditions does a property exist? In formal accounts — those modeled on axiomatic set theory or axiomatic treatments of other mathematical entities — the goal is typically to find formal principles (like comprehension schemas) that state sufficient (and, with luck, necessary) conditions for the existence of properties. But the basic issues about the existence conditions of properties are not really formal ones. Indeed, views about their existence conditions typically derive from an interplay of views about the explanatory tasks of properties and legitimate constraints on philosophical explanation.

We can view the array of views about the existence conditions of properties as a continuum, with claims that the realm of properties is sparse over on the right (conservative) end and claims that it is bountiful over on the left (liberal) end.

5.1 Minimalism

According to minimalist conceptions of properties, the realm of properties is sparsely populated. This is a comparative claim (it is more thinly populated than many realists suppose), rather than a claim about cardinality. Indeed, a minimalist could hold that there is a large infinite number of properties, say that there are at least as many properties as real numbers. This would be a natural view, for example, for a philosopher who thought that each value of a physical magnitude is a separate property and that field theories of such properties as gravitational potentials are correct in their claim that the field intensity drops off continuously as we move away from the source of the field.

The best-known contemporary exponent of minimalism is David Armstrong (e.g., 1978, 1984, 1997), though it has also been defended by others (e.g., Swoyer, 1996). Specific reductionist motivations (e.g., a commitment to physicalism) can lead to minimalism, but here we will focus on more general motivations. These motivations typically involve some combination of the view that everything that exists at all exists in space and time (or space-time), a desire for epistemic security, and a distrust of modal notions like necessity. Hence, a minimalist is likely to subscribe to at least most of the following four principles.

1. The Principle of Instantiation

The principle of instantiation says that there are no uninstantiated properties. For properties: to be is to be exemplified. Taken alone the principle of instantiation doesn't enforce a strong version of minimalism, since it might be that a wide array of properties are exemplified. For example, someone who thinks that numbers or individual essences or other abstract objects exist would doubtless think that a vast number of properties are exemplified. So it is useful to distinguish two versions of the principle of instantiation.

Weak Instantiation: All properties are instantiated; there are no uninstantiated properties.

Strong Instantiation: All properties are instantiated by things that exist in space and time (or, if properties can themselves instantiate properties, each property is part of a descending chain of instantiations that bottoms out in individuals in space and time).

Armstrong (1978) holds that properties enjoy a timeless sort of existence; if a property is ever instantiated, then it always exists. A more rigorous minimalism holds that properties are mortal; a property only exists when it is exemplified. This account has an admirable purity about it, but it is hard pressed to explain very much; for example, if laws are relations among properties, then a law would seem to come and go as the properties involved did.

2. Properties are Contingent Beings

Philosophers who subscribe to the strong principle of instantiation are almost certain to hold that properties are contingent beings. It is a contingent matter just which individuals exist and what properties they happen to exemplify, so it is a contingent matter what properties there are.

3. The Empirical Conception of Properties

A natural consequence of the view that properties are contingent beings is that questions about which properties exist are empirical. There are no logical or conceptual or any other a priori methods to determine which properties exist.

4. Properties are Coarse Grained

Those who hold that properties are very finely individuated will be inclined to hold that the realm of properties is fairly bountiful. For example, if the relation of loving and the converse of its converse (and the converse of the converse of that, and so on) are distinct, then properties will be plentiful. Minimalists, by contrast, are more likely to hold that properties are identical just in case they necessarily have the same instances or just in case they bestow the same causal powers on their instances. On these views the converse of the converse of a binary relation will just be that relation itself (we will return to this matter in the section on identity conditions of properties).


The strong principle of instantiation opens the door to the claim that properties are literally located in their instances. This is a version of Medieval philosophers' doctrine of universalia in rebus, which was contrasted with the picture of universalia ante rem, the view that properties are transcendent beings that exist apart from their instances. With properties firmly rooted here in the spatio-temporal world, it may seem less mysterious how we could learn about them, talk about them, and use them to provide illuminating explanations. For it isn't some weird, other-worldly entity that explains why this apple is red; it is something in the apple, some aspect of it, that accounts for this. It is easier, however, to think of monadic properties as located in their instances than it is to view relations in this way (this may be why Aristotle and the moderate realists of the middle ages viewed a relation as an accident that inheres in a single thing). Nevertheless, the general feeling that transcendent properties couldn't explain anything about their instances has figured prominently in many debates over properties.

Minimalists must pay a price for their epistemic security (there's no escaping the fundamental ontological tradeoff). They will have little hope of finding enough properties for a semantic account of even a modest fragment of any natural language and they will be hard pressed (though Armstrong, 1997, does try) to use properties to account for phenomena in the philosophy of mathematics. Minimalists may not be greatly bothered by this, however, for many of them are primarily concerned with issues in naturalistic ontology.

5.2 Maximalism

At the other, left, end of the spectrum we find maximalist conceptions of properties. Borrowing a term from Arthur Lovejoy, maximalists argue that properties obey a principle of plenitude. Every property that could possibly exist does exist. For properties: To be is to be possible (Linsky & Zalta, 1995; cf. Jubien, 1989). If one accepts the view that properties are necessary beings, then it is a simple modal fact that if a property is possible it is necessary and, hence, actual.

Just as the principle of instantiation alone does not guarantee minimalism, the principle of plenitude alone does not guarantee maximalism. One can endorse the former while holding that all sorts of properties are instantiated, and one can endorse the latter by holding that very few properties are possible (an actualist who subscribed to the strong principle of instantiation might hold this). So to get to the maximalist end of the spectrum we need to add the claim that a vast array of properties is possible. Various formal principles, e.g., a strong comprehension principle (e.g., Zalta, 1988) and axioms ensuring very finely-individuated properties (e.g., Bealer, 1982, p. 65; Menzel, 1986, p. 38) are two formal ways to achieve this.

Maximalist accounts are often propounded by philosophers who want to explain meaning and mental content, but since such accounts postulate so many properties that maximalists have the resources to offer accounts of other things (e.g., phenomena in the foundations of mathematics), and many do. Indeed, the great strength of maximalism is that its enormously rich ontology offers the resources to explain all sorts of things.

Epistemology is the Achilles' heel of maximalism. At least some philosophers find it difficult to see how our minds could make epistemic contact (and how our words could make semantic contact) with entities lying outside the spatio-temporal, causal order. But maximalism has its advantages. Those maximalists who are untroubled by epistemic angst typically remain maximalists. By contrast, philosophers who begin as minimalists sometimes feel pressure to move to a richer conception of properties, either to extend their explanations to cover more phenomena or, sometimes, even just to adequately explain the things they started out trying to explain (e.g., Armstrong's more recent work is somewhat less minimalist than his earliest work).

5.3 Centrism

There is a large middle ground between extreme minimalism and extreme maximalism. For example, several philosophers primarily concerned with physical ontology have urged that a limited number of uninstantiated properties are needed to account for features of measurement (Mundy, 1987), vectors (Bigelow and Pargetter, 1990, p. 77), or natural laws (Tooley, 1987). Such accounts can, like minimalism, treat properties as contingent, fairly coarsely individuated, and too sparse to satisfy any general comprehension principles (e.g., they may deny that there are negative or disjunctive properties). One can also arrive at a centrist position by endorsing a comprehension principle but adding that it only guarantees the existence of properties built up from an initial, sparse, stock of simple properties (cf. Bealer, 1994, p. 167).

Being moderate isn't always easy, and it can be difficult to stake out a position in the center that doesn't appear arbitrary. Once any uninstantiated properties are admitted, we are in much the same epistemological boat as the maximalist. No doubt the minimalist will see this as a reason to reject any uninstantiated properties, while the maximalist (who believes that epistemological problems can be overcome) will see it as a reason to admit as many as possible.

5.4 Dual-Entity Accounts

There is some reason to think that accounts in different fields (e.g., semantics and natural ontology) may call for entities with different identity conditions; for example, semantics requires very finely individuated properties whereas naturalist ontology may need more coarsely individuated ones. If this is so, then no single kind of entity could do both kinds of jobs. The minimalist is likely to conclude that it is a mistake to employ properties in semantics. But less squeamish philosophers may instead conclude that there are (at least) two different sorts of property-like entities. Bealer's (1982) qualities and concepts and Lewis's (1986) sparse and abundant properties are examples of this approach. But this happy hybrid won't satisfy everyone, since minimalists (and some centrists) will reject the view that there are any concepts or abundant properties.


Disputes over the existence conditions of properties splinter into several related, but distinct, issues.

  1. Instantiation issues: Must a property be exemplified to exist?
  2. Localization Issues: Do exemplified properties exist in space and time (namely where they are instantiated)?
  3. Modal issues: Are properties contingent beings or are at least some necessary beings?
  4. Epistemological issues: Is the only way to discover the existence of properties though empirical means?
  5. Individuation issues: How finely individuated are properties?

Minimalists hold that all properties are contingent beings, that they must be exemplified in space and time to exist, that we can only discover their existence empirically, and that they are fairly coarsely individuated. Some minimalists also hold that they exist in those locations where they are instantiated. Maximalists reject all of these views. These two sets of views form fairly natural packages, but other combinations are possible, and they lead to views falling between the two extremes.

6. Identity Conditions

What are the identity conditions for properties? An answer would give us necessary and sufficient conditions for the properties x and y to be one and the same property. Another way to pose the question is to ask how finely individuated properties are, and here we find a spectrum of views.

On most medium-fine views, formal considerations alone do not determine identity conditions for properties.

6.1 Necessary Coextension

Probably the best-known candidate for an identity condition for properties is necessary coextensiveness. This seems to transpose the identity conditions for sets into an appropriately intensional key, and this is precisely how identity conditions for properties work in accounts that treat them as intensions (as functions from possible worlds to objects therein). Bealer also views this as the identity condition for his sparse properties, qualities and connections (though he is undogmatic about this).

Although necessary coextension may be the most-discussed candidate identity condition for properties, many realists reject it because it doesn't comport well with the explanations they want to develop. Identity conditions don't matter greatly when the aim is simply to explain mathematical phenomena; even extensional entities like sets could do that job, so we don't need necessary coextension as an identity condition here. This proposal is also in tension with the picture that properties are individuated by their functional roles, at least on the assumption that necessarily coextensive properties can confer different causal powers on their instances (Sober, 1982, contains a strong argument that this can happen, though the jury is probably still out on this issue). And in semantics we need hyper-intensional properties that are individuated much more finely than the necessary-coextension condition allows.

6.2 Functional Role

The view that properties are identical just in case they confer the same causal, or more generally, the same nomological or functional roles on their instances has been endorsed by various philosophers who work primarily in scientific ontology. On this conception, there are few, if any, purely formal identity conditions for properties (unless, as seems unlikely, someone devises a purely formal account of causal roles). One cost of this view is that the notion of a causal role and the relationship between such roles and properties is not completely clear.

6.3 Property Identity in Terms of Encoding

We have encountered all of the major current views about the identity conditions of properties except for one in previous sections, so we will go into it in a bit more detail here. The encoding account of property identity, proposed in Zalta (1983; 1988), is developed in the context of a rich theory of properties that goes along with a rich theory of abstract objects. In this theory, ordinary objects (like Bill Clinton) exist, exemplify properties, but cannot encode properties. By contrast (on the most common interpretation of his system), abstract objects (like Pegasus and the Euclidean triangle) exist necessarily, but they necessarily fail to have a spatio-temporal location. Abstract objects encode, as well as exemplify, properties; indeed, an abstract object is constituted by the properties it encodes. For example, the abstract object the Euclidean triangle encodes all and only those properties implied by being a triangle of Euclidean geometry (e.g., being a closed three-side plane figure whose interior angles sum to 180 degrees). This abstract object also exemplifies properties, e.g., being mentioned in all textbooks on plane geometry.

The metaphysical theory of abstract objects is linked to our actual thought and talk by the bridge principle that the English copula is ambiguous; sometimes ‘is’ means ‘exemplifies’, sometimes ‘encodes’. The existence condition for abstract objects is given by a comprehension schema according to which there is (necessarily) a unique abstract object that encodes just those properties satisfying each condition on properties specifiable in the language of the theory, and abstract objects are identical just in case they encode exactly the same properties. More importantly, for current purposes, properties are identical just in case they are, necessarily and always, encoded by exactly the same individuals.

On this account, properties that necessarily have the same encoding extensions are identical, but properties that necessarily have the same exemplification extensions may be distinct. To see the difference, note that the property of being a round square and the property of being a round triangle necessarily have the same exemplification extension. Hence, accounts (like those noted in §6.3) that treat necessary (exemplification) coextension as sufficient for identity tell us that they are one and the same property. But since these properties have different encoding extensions, the present account treats them as distinct. One can even make this work without any actual abstract objects, though the nonidentity of two properties would still require that there could have been an abstract object that encodes one but not the other. This is one of the few novel accounts of property identity to be proposed in recent decades. It has the virtue of being part of a detailed theory that has been employed to explain a wide range of phenomena, and it expresses the identity conditions for properties in terms of one of their most fundamental features, namely that they are predicable entities. The price is that it requires us to hold that there are two modes of predication and that there are, or at least that there could have been, abstract objects.

6.4 Ultra-fine Properties

The view that properties have ultra-fine identity conditions is typically developed in the context of a rich formal theory of properties. One could mandate fine-grained identity conditions by brute force, e.g., by laying down axioms that each set of objects is in the extension of more than one property, or in the extension of many different properties. But the intuitive idea behind property theories tailored to semantics is that there are "compound properties" which are built up from simpler properties by logical operations akin to conjunction, negation, and so on. On such accounts the property being red and square is distinct (because built up in a different way) from the property being square and red. Similarly, the converse of the converse of a two-place relation is distinct from that relation itself.

Such accounts may be well-suited for explaining strongly intensional phenomena (like belief sentences or mental content), but they also raise certain questions. For example, what is the difference between the property being red and square and the distinct property being square and red, and what allows us to link the right complex predicate (say ‘is red and square’) to the right property (being red and square) rather than to the wrong one (being square and red)? If properties literally had parts, the answer might be that the arrangements of things in the two properties is different (e.g., being red comes "first" in being red and square). Explaining what such structural differences amount to would not be easy, but at least such differences might point to the beginnings of a solution. By contrast, if properties lack genuine internal structure, it is less clear how an account of the difference between being red and square and being square and red would even begin. We will return briefly to such matters in the final section.

7. Kinds of Properties

Most realists agree that there are various sorts of properties, and in this section we will review the main kinds of properties they have proposed. But many realists are also selective; they believe that some, but not all, of these kinds of properties exist. Indeed, almost none of the putative kinds of properties discussed here is accepted by all realists, but to avoid constant qualifications (like ‘putative kind of property’) I will present each sort of property as though it were unproblematic.

7.1 First-order vs. Higher-order Properties

The first set of issues we will examine involve the most fundamental logical or structural features of properties. We will begin with a picture of a hierarchy of properties arranged according to order. First-order properties and relations are those that can only be instantiated by individuals. For example redness can be instantiated by the apple on my desk and being married to can be instantiated by Bill and Hillary, but no properties can be red or married. It is natural to suppose, however, that at least many first-order properties and relations can themselves have properties and relations. For example, redness might be thought to exemplify the property of being a color and being married to might be thought to exemplify the property of being a symmetrical relation. Once we think of second-order properties, it is natural to wonder whether there are third-order properties (properties of second- or, perhaps in cumulative fashion, of second- and first-order properties), and so on up through ever-higher orders.

This metaphysical picture finds a formal parallel in higher-order logics. On one common system of classification, we move from familiar first-order logic to second-order logic by adding first-order variables, from second- to third-order logic by adding second-order constants, from third- to fourth-order logic by adding second-order variables, and so on up, alternating constants and variables at successive steps.

Realists differ over which niches in this proposed hierarchy of orders are occupied. Proponents of the empirical conception of properties will hold that it is an empirical question whether there are second- or forth- or fifty-seventh-order properties. The issue for them is likely to be whether putative higher-order properties confer any causal powers on their instances over and above those already conferred by lower-order properties. But it is also possible to have less empirically motivated views about which parts of the hierarchy are occupied.

Elementarism (Bergmann, 1968) is the view that there are first-order properties but that there are no properties of any higher-order. There are first-order properties like various shades of red, but there is no higher-order property (like being a color) that such properties share nor are they related by any higher-order relations (like being darker than).

Elementarism has sometimes been defended by appealing to something like Russell's principle of acquaintance, the tenet that only things with which we are acquainted should be thought to exist, together with the claim that we are acquainted with first-order properties but not with those of any higher orders. To the extent that first-order properties are able to perform all of the tasks that properties are called on to do, elementarism could also be defended on grounds of parsimony. But it is now widely acknowledged, even by minimalists, that at the very least some higher-order relations are needed to confer structure on first-order properties.

7.2 Self-predication and Theories of Types

In May of 1901 Russell discovered his famous paradox. If every predicative expression determines or corresponds to a property, then the expressions ‘is a property that does not instantiate itself’ should do so. This raises the question: does this property instantiate itself? Suppose that it does. Then it is a property that does not instantiate itself; so if it does instantiate itself, it doesn't instantiate itself. Now suppose that it does not instantiate itself. Then it is one of those properties that does not instantiate itself; so it does instantiate itself. Such a property, which instantiates itself if and only if it does not instantiate itself, cannot exist (on pain of contradiction). This led Russell to introduce a theory of types which institutes a total ban on self-exemplification by a strict segregation of properties into orders (his account is actually even more restrictive than this; see the entry on Russell's paradox for details).

7.3 Untyped Conceptions of Properties

Russell's reaction seems extreme, because many cases of self-exemplification are innocuous. Furthermore, realists who are not minimalists or conservative centrists are likely to think that self-exemplification is common. For example, the property of being a property is itself a property, so it exemplifies itself. There also seem to be transcendental properties and relations. A transcendental relation like thinks about is one that can relate quite different types of things: Hans can think about Vienna and he can think about triangularity. But typed theories cannot accommodate transcendental properties without several epicycles.

Several recent accounts (e.g., Bealer, 1982; Menzel, 1993) treat properties as entities that can exemplify themselves. From this perspective, the picture of a hierarchy of orders is fundamentally misguided; there are simply properties (which can be exemplified — in many cases by other properties, even by themselves) and individuals (which cannot be exemplified). One challenge here is to develop formal accounts that allow as much self-exemplification as possible without teetering over the brink into paradox. In formal systems where abstract singular terms or predicates may (but need not) denote properties (cf. Swoyer, 1998), formal counterparts of (complex) predicates like ‘being a property that does not exemplify itself’ could exist in the object language without denoting properties; from this perspective Russell's paradox would merely show that this predicate lacked a denotation, rather than that the logic was inconsistent.

7.4 Relations

We have treated relations as properties (with more than one argument place); for example the properties of loving and being shorter than are two-place relations, that of being in between (two other things) is a three-place relation, and so on. On abundant conceptions of properties, there are relations of every finite number of argument places, but on sparse conceptions it is an empirical question whether there are relations of any particular degree (i.e., with any particular number of argument places). What we think of as genuine relations were not recognized by philosophers until about a century and a half ago (with the work of DeMorgan, Schroeder, and Peirce and, somewhat later, Russell). Until then relations were treated as a special sort of monadic property (when they were acknowledged at all).

We have seen how several selective realisms focus on the hierarchy of orders, but selective realisms can also focus on the degree (the number of argument places) of relations. Leibniz argued that relations could be reduced to monadic properties (though he never really explained just how this was to work) and so were dispensable. Some philosophers still hold that relations supervene on the monadic properties of their relata in a very strong sense that shows that relations are not actually real (some trope theorists hold this view; it is defended at length in Fisk, 1972). But no one has been able to show that all relations do supervene on monadic properties, and there are strong reasons for thinking that at least some sorts of relations, e.g., spatio-temporal ones, do not. Hence, most contemporary realists hold that there are genuine relations.

Other selective realisms are possible. For example, in contrast with Leibniz's view one might hold that there are relations but no monadic properties (this view is sometimes attributed, with very little textual support, to Peirce). And Armstrong (1978, ch. 24) proposes the tentative hypothesis that there are first- and second-level monadic properties, but no monadic properties of any higher-level.

7.5 Fixed-degree vs. Multigrade Properties

Many predicates are multigrade or variably polyadic; they can be true of various numbers of things. For example, the predicate ‘robbed a bank together’ is true of Bonnie and Clyde, Ma Barker and her two boys, Patti Hearst and three members of the Symbionese Liberation Army, and so on. Multigrade predicates are very common (e.g., ‘work well together’, ‘conspired to commit murder’, ‘are lovers’). Some of them can be analyzed as conjunctions of fixed-degree predicates, but many of them cannot. Standard logic does not accommodate multigrade predicates, but they are very common, and if the goal is to use properties as semantic values of English predicates, then multigrade properties are needed. They have also been used in naturalistic ontology in an ingenious treatment of measurement (Mundy, 1989). A truly flexible account of properties would abandon both the restrictive hierarchy of orders and the equally restrictive view that all properties come with a fixed number of argument places, but as yet little work of this sort has been done.

7.6 Propositions

In ancient and Medieval times propositions were not seen as a special kind of property (in those days philosophers didn't even recognize genuine autonomous relations), and many contemporary philosophers who focus on physical ontology or philosophy of mathematics do not regard propositions as a kind of property (many of them doubt that there are any such things). But those who work on the semantics of natural language often postulate the existence of propositions, noting that we can think of them as a limiting case of a property. Consider a two-place property like loves and think of plugging one of its open places up with Darla to obtain the one-place property loves Darla. If we can do this, it is sometimes argued, then we can plug the remaining (last) open place up with Sam to get the zero-place property, or proposition, that Sam loves Darla.

7.7 Structured vs. Unstructured Properties

Some philosophers (e.g., Grossman, 1983, §§58-61) argue that all properties are simple. Others argue that there is a distinction between simple properties and compound properties, that some compound properties exist, and that they have a structure that involves or incorporates simpler properties. Properties might have different sorts of structure, including various sorts of algebraic or logical structure. Because such issues often arise in connection with formal accounts of properties, this issue is discussed in the section on formal theories of properties.

7.8 Instantiation

If instantiation or exemplification is just another run-of-the-mill relation, it appears to lead to a vicious regress. This is often known as Bradley's regress, although it is doubtful that Bradley himself had this particular regress in mind. The construal of the Bradley's regress that has passed into the literature goes like this. Suppose that the individual a has the property F. For a to instantiate F it must be linked to F by a relation of instantiation, I. But (here's where the trouble begins), this requires a further pair of relations, R1 and R2, one to connect a to I and a second to connect I to F. This in turn requires four additional relations to bind R1 and R2 to the things that they are supposed to relate, then eight further relations to fasten these four relations to their relata, and so on without end. It is sometimes suggested that the regress is innocuous, but the problem isn't simply that there is a regress. The problem is that at each "stage" further relations are required, but they are never able to link their would-be relata. The difficulty is that nothing ever gets connected to anything else.

The only way to avoid this difficulty is to insist that instantiation is not a relation, at least not a normal one. Some philosophers hold that it is a sui generis linkage that hooks things up without intermediaries. Strawson (1959), following W. E. Johnson, calls it a non-relational tie; others stress that it is a mode of predication. It may even be that there is no such thing as instantiation at all and that talk of it is just a misleading figure of speech. At this point it is natural to resort to metaphors like Frege's claim that properties have gaps that can be filled by objects or the early Wittgenstein's suggestion (if we read him as a realist about properties) that objects and properties can be hooked together like links in a chain. Broad likened instantiation to Metaphysical Glue, noting that when we glue two sheets of paper together we don't need additional glue, or mortar, or some other adhesive to bind the glue to the paper (Broad 1933, p.85). Glue just sticks. And instantiation just relates. It is metaphysically self-adhesive.

7.9 Particularizing Properties

Some properties are metaphysical analogues of count nouns. They have been called sortal properties (by Strawson) and particularizing properties (by Armstrong), but the ideas involved here have a long history. Strawson borrows the word ‘sortal’ from Locke, and at least some particularizing properties correspond closely to Aristotle's secondary substances. Particularizing properties provide counting principles, or principles on identity, in the sense that they allow us to count objects. For example, the properties of being a table and being a cat are particularizing properties; there are definite facts of the matter as to how many tables are in the kitchen and how many cats are on those tables. There are also properties, e.g., intervention, bombing, that particularize events.

Characterizing Properties

Particularizing properties are naturally contrasted with characterizing properties. Characterizing properties like redness and triangularity do not divide the world up into a definite number of things. To the extent that a property like redness seems to allow us to count red things, it is because we are relying on the umbrella count noun ‘thing’ to help with the count.

Mass Properties

Particularizing properties may also be contrasted with mass properties. These are properties, like water, gold, and furniture, that apply to stuff. Like characterizing properties, mass properties do not divide the world up into definite numbers of things, but many characterizing properties apply to individuals, whereas mass properties apply to stuff. It was noted above that different sorts of linguistic categories that might correspond to important ontological distinctions are run together we represent all of them as predicates of a formal language. It now appears, for example, that common nouns express particularizing properties, while adjectives typically express characterizing properties.

7.10 Genus and Species

Although the notions of genus and species play a relatively small role in contemporary metaphysics, they figured prominently in Aristotle's philosophy and in the many centuries of work inspired by it. When we construe these notions as properties (rather than as linguistic expressions), a genus is a general property and a species is a more specific subtype of it. The distinction is typically thought to be a relative one: being a mammal is a species relative to the genus being an animal, but it is a genus relative to the species being a donkey. It has usually been assumed that in such chains there is a top-most, absolute genus, and a bottom-most, absolute species.

It was traditionally supposed that a species could be uniquely specified or defined in terms of a genus and a differentia. For example, the property being a human is completely determined by the properties being an animal (genus) and being rational (differentia). It is difficult, by today's lights, to draw a principled distinction between genera and differentiae, but the idea that species properties are compound, conjunctive properties remains a natural one. For example, the property of being a human might be identified with the conjunctive property being a human and being rational. But it is now rarely assumed, as it was for many centuries, that all compound properties are conjunctive.

7.11 Determinables and Determinates

The concepts of determinables and determinates were popularized by the Cambridge philosopher W. E. Johnson. Properties like color and shape are determinables, while more specific versions of these properties (like redness and octagonality) are determinates. Like the distinction between genus and species, the distinction between determinables and determinates is a relative one; redness is a determinate with respect to color but a determinable with respect to specific shades of red. The hierarchy is generally thought to bottom out, however, in completely specific, absolute determinates.

Species are often thought to be definable in terms of a genus and a differentia. But determinates are not definable in terms of a determinable and a differentia; indeed, they are not conjunctive properties of any obvious sort. Determinates under the same determinable are incompatible; nothing can instantiate both of them at the same time, and anything that exemplifies a determinate must exemplify its determinables as well. The distinction between determinables and determinates has played a larger role in recent metaphysics than the more venerable distinction between genus and species. For example, much recent work in naturalistic ontology treats physical magnitudes as absolute determinate properties (like being a mass of 3 kg or being a force of 17 newtons) falling under determinables like mass and force.

Any object that instantiates a determinate (e.g. red) must have the corresponding determinable (e.g., color), and Armstrong has raised the question whether determinables are genuine properties or whether we simply apply determinable predicates to things on the basis of the determinate properties that they have. The determinable properties of a thing (if there are any), are necessarily supervenient on the determinates of the thing, in the sense that two things that have exactly the same determinates must also have exactly the same determinables. For example, if two things exemplify the same determinate mass, then both must have a mass. Armstrong (1997, p. 45) urges that this issue is part of a more general issue as to whether necessarily supervenient properties are anything over and above the properties on which they supervene. His answer is that they are not; they are a "metaphysical free lunch." He offers little argument for this claim, however, and many philosophers would demur.

7.12 Natural Kinds

Natural Kind Properties are important properties that carve nature at its natural joints. Paradigms include the property of being a specific sort of elementary particle (e.g., the property of being a neutron), chemical element (e.g., the property of being gold), and biological species (e.g., the property of being a jackal). Natural kinds are often contrasted with artificial kinds (e.g., being a central processing unit).

In recent years a good deal of work has been done on the semantics of natural kind terms (involving such issues as whether they are rigid designators). Less work has been done on the ontology of natural kinds, but it is clear that it is most plausible to speak of natural kinds in those cases where something has what Locke called a real essence (in the way that elementary particles or chemical elements probably do). In these cases it seems plausible to suppose that natural kind properties are compound properties that involve simpler properties (e.g., the quantum numbers, for elementary particles; being made of simpler parts standing in specific relations in the way that chemical elements are made up of atoms related by chemical bondings).

The distinctions between natural and artificial kinds and that between particularizing and mass properties are orthogonal to each other. Some natural kind properties, e.g., being a dog, are particularizing while others, e.g., gold, are not. Likewise, some artificial properties, e.g., being a table, are particularizing while others, e.g., furniture, are not. The chief issue here is whether there are any natural kinds or whether our classifications are primarily a matter of cultural and linguistic conventions that represent just one of many ways of classifying things (so that joints are a result of the way that we happen to carve things up).

7.13 Purely Qualitative Properties

Some properties involve or incorporate particulars. The properties of being identical with Harry and being in love with Harry involve Harry. Even those who think that lots of properties exist necessarily often believe that non-qualitative properties like this are contingent; they depend upon Harry, and they only exist in circumstances in which he exists. By contrast, purely qualitative properties (like being a unit negative charge or being in love) do not involve individuals in this way. The distinction between properties that are purely qualitative and those that are not is usually easy to draw in practice, but a precise characterization of it is elusive.

7.14 Essential Properties and Internal Relations

A (monadic) property is an essential property of an individual just in case that individual has the property in every possible circumstance in which the individual exists. Essential properties are contrasted with accidental properties, properties that things just happen, quite contingently, to have. My car is red but it could have been blue (had I painted it), so its color is an accidental property. It is doubtless an essential property of my car that it is extended, but interesting examples of essential properties are more controversial — so controversial that some philosophers have doubted whether there are any. It is sometimes suggested, though, that if something is a member of a natural kind, then being a member of that kind is essential to it; for example, being human is an essential property of Saul Kripke.

The phrase ‘internal relation’ has been used in different ways, but it is often used as the relational analogue of an essential (monadic) property. For example, if a bears the relation R to b, then R internally relates a to b just in case a bears this relation to b in every possible circumstance in which they both exist. Relations that are not internal, that contingently link their relata (the things they relate), are external. Bill and Hillary are married, but they might not have been, so this relation between them is external. By contrast, some philosophers have suggested that the relation being a biological parent of is an internal relation. In every world in which Bill and Chelsea both exist, Bill is her father. If this is correct, then the relational property, being a child of Bill is essential to Chelsea, but being the father of Chelsea is not essential to Bill (he and Hillary might never have met, in which case they would not have had Chelsea).

7.15 Intrinsic vs. Extrinsic Properties

Some properties are instantiated by individuals because of the relations they bear to other things. For example the property being married is instantiated by Bill Clinton because he is married to Hillary Clinton. Such properties are sometimes called extrinsic or relational properties. Objects have them because of their relations to other things. By contrast, intrinsic or non-relational properties are properties that a thing has quite independently of its relationships to other things. Many properties that seem to be intrinsic turn out to be extrinsic when we examine them carefully. The main questions here are whether there are any interesting intrinsic properties and how the notions of intrinsicness and extrinsicness are to be explicated.

7.16 Primary vs. Secondary Properties

The distinction between primary and secondary properties goes back to the Greek atomists. It lay dormant for centuries, but was revived by Galileo, Descartes, Boyle, Locke, and others during the seventeenth century. Locke's influence is so pervasive that such properties still often go under the names he gave them, primary and secondary qualities.

The intuitive idea is that primary properties are objective features of the world; on many accounts they are also fundamental properties that explain why things have the other properties that they do. Early lists of primary properties included shape, size, and (once Newton's influence was absorbed) mass. Today we might add properties like charge, spin or the four-vectors of special relativity to the list of primary properties. By contrast, secondary properties somehow depend on the mind; standard lists of secondary properties include colors, tastes, sounds, and smells. On Locke's account secondary properties are powers of objects that are rooted in the primary properties. The most pressing question about the two kinds of properties is how (if at all) a precise and informative distinction can be drawn between them. Issues involving primary and secondary properties have been revived in the recent flurry of discussions of color.

7.17 Supervenient Properties

Supervenience is sometimes taken to be a relationship between two fragments of language (e.g., between psychological vocabulary and physical vocabulary), but it is increasingly taken to be a relationship between pairs of families of properties. To say that psychological properties supervene on physical properties, for example, is to say that, necessarily, everything that has any psychological properties also has physical properties and any two things that have exactly the same physical properties will have exactly the same psychological properties. There are no differences in psychological properties without some difference in physical properties.

There is no consensus as to how globally to construe supervenience claims. In the case of psychological and physical properties it seems too narrow to say that the non-relational psychological properties of a person supervene on her non-relational physical properties (too many important psychological properties involve relationships to things outside the organism for this to be right). And it seems unhelpfully narrow just to say that any two worlds that are just alike in their distributions of physical properties will be just alike in their distributions of psychological properties. But however we phrase the doctrine (and no doubt different versions will be useful for different purposes), supervenience is very naturally construed as a relation between pairs of families of properties.

In some cases it also seems plausible to think of the supervenient realm as linguistic and the supporting, subvenient realm in terms of properties: there can be no difference in truths in the upper realm (e.g., those employing psychological vocabulary) without a difference in properties (e.g., physical properties) at the lower level. But this hybrid approach has not received much attention.

7.18 Fictional Properties

We might arrive at a notion of fictional properties in the following way. In Naming and Necessity Kripke discusses what he calls ‘mythical species’ (1980, pp. 156-158). On Kripke's view, ‘Sherlock Holmes’ does not denote anyone, neither an actual individual or a merely possible one. The name fails to denote because all our descriptions of Holmes are essentially incomplete. They do not fully specify a unique person (not even a unique merely possible person), and so there are many different possible detectives who have all of the properties ascribed to Holmes but who differ in other ways. No one of them has any more claim on being Holmes than any of the rest, and so there are no counterfactual situations that could correctly be described as ones in which Holmes exists.

The properties ascribed to unicorns are similarly incomplete. There are many different possible species that have the properties we commonly ascribe to unicorns but which differ in other ways. No one of these species has any more claim on being unicorns than any of the rest, and so there are no counterfactual situations that could correctly be described as ones in which unicorns exists. It may also be the case, though Kripke doesn't discuss the matter, that notions like phlogiston and caloric fluid are similarly incomplete, and that there are no counterfactual situations that could correctly be described as ones in which anything has the property of being phlogiston or that of being caloric fluid. But even if this further claim isn't true, Kripke's example of unicorns suggests that there may be a distinction between actual properties and fictional properties. There are interesting philosophical issues about fictional characters, individuals like Holmes and Pegasus and the bride of Frankenstein, and there may be similarly interesting questions about fictional properties. Aside from Zalta (1983), however, little work has been done on this topic.

8. Formal Theories of Properties

In this section I will explain some of the most rudimentary ideas behind several recent formal theories of properties. The aim is to convey the intuitive flavor of this work, so I will proceed primarily by example rather than with definitions and proofs (interested readers can find plenty of both in the works cited below).

There are several important choices that must be made in devising a formal theory of properties; they include the following:

  1. Should the account be developed as a formal theory in a familiar logic (in the way set theories are now standardly axiomatized in standard first-order logic)? This was the approach in the early formal theories of Barcan-Marcus (1963) and Lemmon (1963), who used first-order modal logic (see Jubien, 1989, for a recent, more sophisticated (and non-modal) implementation of this approach). Alternatively, should a formal account of properties be developed as a richer "logic of properties" (e.g., Bealer, 1982; Zalta, 1983; Menzel, 1993; Swoyer, 1998)?
  2. Should we employ a typed or an untyped conception of properties (the latter is much more flexible, but it must be handled with care to avoid paradox)?
  3. Should we make provisions for complex predicates (or complex singular terms, or both) with something akin to a logical structure?
  4. Should we require all of the expressions in the syntactic categories that can denote (or express) properties to do so or should we allow some or all of them not to?

Different choices are recommended by different conceptions of properties. For the sake of exposition I will begin with those choices that minimize the departures from familiar logical systems like non-modal first-order logic. This means a logic of properties that is typed, that does not include complex properties, and in which every predicate expresses a property. We will then see how to extend this approach in various ways.

8.1 A Bare-Bones Logic of Properties

Think of your favorite formulation of first-order logic with identity. Then just add n-place predicate variables (for all positive integers n) to its syntax and count any n-place predicate variable followed by n individual terms (i.e., by individual variables and constants) as a formula. Finally, allow n-place predicate variables to be bound by quantifiers containing an n-place predicate variable (in just the same way that individual variables can be), and count formulas with no free variables as sentences. For example, the expression ‘X3abc’ is a formula consisting of the three-place predicate variable ‘X3’ followed by the three individual terms ‘a’, ‘b’, and ‘c’; since the predicate variable is unbound, this formula is not a sentence. By contrast, ‘(∃X2)X2ab’ is a sentence (here ‘∃’ is the existential quantifier; this sentence says that there is at least one two-place relation that relates a to b or, more idiomatically, that a stands in some binary relation to b).

We interpret languages in this logical system over Intensional Relational Structures (IRSs). An IRS is an ordered triple:

I = < DI, DP, ext >,

where DI and DP are non-empty, non-overlapping sets. On intended interpretations (which we will take for granted here) DI is the domain of individuals and DP is the domain of properties (including relations). DP is in turn the union of an infinite number of non-overlapping, non-empty sets: 1DP (the set of one-place properties), 2DP (the set of two-place relations), 3DP (the set of three-place relations), and so on for each positive integer n. Finally, ext is an extension assignment function; it assigns an extension to every property in the property domain DP in accordance with the following rule:

Where Pn is an n-place property, ext assigns Pn a (possibly empty) set of ordered n-tuples whose members are drawn from the individual domain DI

(we take an ordered one-tuple whose member is a to be a itself). Hence, the extension assignment assigns each one-place property a subset of the individual domain, each two-place property (i.e., each binary relation) a set of ordered pairs on individuals, and so on. In other words, it assigns exactly the same sorts of extensions to n-place properties that interpretations in standard first-order logic assign to n-place predicates.

Finally, a model or interpretation on an IRS interprets our formal language over it. It assigns a denotation to each individual constant (exactly as in standard first-order logic) and an n-place property to each n-place predicate (here we go beyond standard first-order logic). The fundamental idea is just that:

As in first-order logic, we must add variable assignments (or their equivalents) to explain the workings of quantifiers. A variable assignment assigns an object of the appropriate sort to each variable of the language (it assigns individuals to individual variables, one-place properties to one-place predicate variables, two-place properties (binary relations) to two-place predicate variables, and so on). We then define satisfaction conditions for formulas (in a model and relative to a variable assignment) just as we do in standard first-order logic. Finally, a formula is true in a model just in case it contains no unbound variables and is satisfied by every variable assignment with respect to the model; a sentence is valid if is true in all models; and a set of sentences entails a sentence if that sentence is true in every model in which all of the sentences in the set are true. It is routine to extend such logics to higher orders, so that first-level properties can have second-level properties and stand in second-order relations, and so on up.

Untyped Variants

Philosophers, linguists, and computer scientists have increasingly chafed under the inflexible aspects of typed theories, and several recent accounts treat properties as individuals that are included in the range of the quantifiers for ordinary individuals. One way to accommodate this approach is to modify IRSs so that they include just a single domain that contains both properties and individuals. We then introduce n-place property-designating singular terms and require that an interpretation assign them denotations of the appropriate sort. For example, a one-place term of this sort might be used to represent the word ‘honesty’, and a three-place term of this sort might be used to represent ‘betweeness’. We can still allow predicates to denote properties (or we can introduce a new semantic relation, expression, which assigns properties to predicates). This allows something akin to self predication; if ‘F’ denotes (or expresses) the same property that the one-place singular term ‘a’ denotes, then ‘Fa’ will be true just in case the property denoted by ‘a’ is in the extension of itself. Quite intricate variations on this basic theme are possible; the most detailed is Bealer's (1982) first-order intensional logic that includes intensional abstracts among its singular terms.

Complex Terms and "Compound" Properties

It is much easier to deal with some features of natural language if we include complex predicates in our language and introduce a systematic way of interpreting them over IRSs. In the 1970s it occurred to several people that a rigorous formal system embodying this conception of properties could be constructed by investing the operations on linguistic expression in systems like Quine's predicate functor logic (1960) with an extra-linguistic, ontological status (e.g., Bealer, 1973, 1982; McMichael & Zalta, 1981; Leeds, 1978). Adding the machinery necessary to accommodate all of the complex predicates we might want is quite intricate (see Zalta, 1983 for a very readable account), and here I will just mention two examples to convey the general idea.

The first step is to introduce a variable-binding operator, λ, that allows us to construct complex predicates from open formulas. For example, we can apply ‘λ’ to the open formula, ‘Rx & Sx’ to form the one-place complex predicate ‘[λx (Rx & Sx)]’; if ‘R’ denotes being red and ‘S’ denotes being square, then this complex predicate denotes the compound, conjunctive property being red and square (a stilted, but sometimes useful rendering of this is ‘the property of being a thing that is both red and square’). Similarly, we can apply the operator to the open formula ‘∃y(Lxy)’ to form the one-place predicate ‘[λx  ∃y(Lxy)]’; if ‘L’ stands for loves, this complex predicate denotes the compound property loving someone (whereas ‘[λy  ∃x(Lxy)]’ would denote being loved by someone).2

Although the guiding ideas here are relatively straightforward, considerable delicacy is required to ensure that everything works out in precisely the right way. For example, an object should exemplify the conjunctive property denoted by ‘[λx (Rx & Sx)]’ if and only if it exemplifies both the properties R and S. And an object should exemplify the property denoted by ‘[λy  ∃x(Lxy]’ just in case it loves some object (and just in case it does not exemplify the property denoted by ‘[λy ~∃x(Lxy]’). There are many systematic connections of this sort among complex predicates, compound properties, and the things that exemplify them, and some fairly heavy machinery is required to ensure that things work smoothly for properties of arbitrarily complexity. (Consider, for example, [λxyz  ∃w(Fxyw & ~(Gy or ∃v(Hzvy)))].)

One way to make all of this work as it should is to add operations to IRSs that allow us to "build" compound properties up out of simpler ones. For example, to accommodate conjunctive properties we introduce an operation, &, that maps each pair of properties, P and Q (having the same number of argument places, though this restriction can be dropped at a slight cost of simplicity) to the conjunctive property P & Q. To ensure that things work properly we must also add a clause specifying how the &-operation interacts with the extension assignment function. In particular, we require that ext(P & Q) be the intersection of ext(P) and ext(Q).

By adding a handful of additional "property-building" operations (corresponding to the various connectives, quantifiers, operations on relations like conversion, and the syntactic operation of substitution), clauses specifying how each operation interlocks with the extension assignment, and a recursive definition of the denotations of predicates, we can ensure that complex predicates denote properties that behave as they should (Zalta, 1983 contains an elegant account of one way to do this; Swoyer, 1998 contains a slightly different approach in which assignments of denotations to complex predicates and assignments of extensions to the properties they denote are both treated as homomorphisms). With such a rich stock of properties we can add a comprehension schema to our logic which tells us that each condition (open formula) determines a property, i.e., there is at least one property that an ordered group of things has just in case the open formula is true of them.3 It is also possible to add complex singular terms to the language; these are formal counterparts of nominalizations like being poor but happy. We can then set up the semantics so that these abstract singular terms denote compound properties.

Logic and the Empirical Conception of Properties

Some realists hold that it is an empirical question just which properties there are. On this view, there can be no logical or a priori existence conditions for properties. It is possible to formulate a very minimal logic (Swoyer, 1993; 1998) that fits nicely with this conception. Because it is so minimal, it has a philosophical neutrality that provides a framework in which various richer theories of properties (including ones with complex predicates) can be formulated, classified, and compared.

The Status of Formal Theories

There are two ways to view the kinds of formal systems described in this section (whether we call them ‘logics’ or not). We can view them as attempts to tell the One True Story about an abstract realm of properties (or the One True Story about the logical structure underlying a natural language like English or Hindi). On this construal the various systems are competitors. But it is also possible to view such formal systems in a more prosaic way, as abstract models that allow us to represent and reason about various phenomena involving properties (including various fragments of English). On this picture, such systems are similar in important respects to formal models in the sciences. They always involve simplifications and idealizations, and different models are useful for different purposes. Moreover, if a simpler model is enough to handle the phenomenon we are interested, it is overkill to employ more complex models even if they are available.

Future Directions

Various combinations of the features discussed in this section are possible. At this point several extensions also seem desirable, including allowing multigrade predicates like ‘had a knock-down, drag-out fight with each other’ and multigrade properties. It is also important to extend current accounts to deal with vagueness, and it would be gratifying to see them make contact with recent empirical work on concepts and categorization.

8.2 The Mereology of the Forms?

There has been some discussion of complex or structural properties in the recent literature, and certainly the metaphor of relation-building operations (like &) may suggest that some properties literally have parts. This idea can be traced back to Plato's later dialogues, where he speaks of one Form being part of another (Sophist, 257d). It has been defended recently by Armstrong (1978, pp. 36-39, pp. 67f) and Bigelow and Pargetter (1989). This view may have some plausibility for certain sorts of properties, e.g., conjunctive properties. But the general view (which these philosophers do not endorse) that properties literally have logical structures that mirror the syntactic structures of the complex predicates that denote them is less appealing. In the case of a negative property, for example, it would require us to think that the property F is somehow part of the negative property, being a non-F.

Structured Specifications vs. Specifications of Structure

On an alternative view, the appearance that some properties are literally structured is an artifact of our use of structured terms (complex, λ-predicates like ‘[λx (Rx & Sx)]’) to denote them. But our use of structured terms and structural metaphors doesn't mean that the properties themselves are genuinely structured or that they literally have parts. There is a difference between structured specifications, which we do employ, and specifications of structure, which is another matter entirely. There are logical relations among properties; being F and being not F are inconsistent (in the sense that nothing could exemplify both at once); being F and G entails being F (in the sense that anything exemplifying the former property must also exemplify the latter). These logical relations do structure the realm of properties. This makes a structured specification a natural device for singling out a member of this structured realm of entities, since it identifies it by its place — its logical location — in that domain. But the role of the syntactic structure of a complex predicate is not to exhibit the internal structure of a property; it is to disclose that property's niche in the logical network of properties. We should add the cautionary note that a picture of compound properties needn't be a package deal. It is possible to argue that there are no compound properties, that there are some but not others (e.g., there might be conjunctive, but no disjunctive, properties), or that there is a multitude of them. Which view is correct? That is a philosophical question, and formal work alone cannot answer it.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Frege, Gottlob: logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic | propositional function | Russell's paradox | tropes | universals: the medieval problem of | vagueness