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First published Tue Oct 1, 2002; substantive revision Tue Mar 28, 2006

This entry begins with some remarks on Object as a philosophical category, based on a brief selection of statements drawn from the literature. Natural-language uses of ‘object’ are (unsurprisingly) diverse. The modest American College Dictionary, for example, contains some twelve entries for the term, among which appear the following: “something that may be perceived by the senses, especially by sight or touch”, and again, “anything that may be presented to the mind: objects of thought.” Of the two, the latter is plainly the more general use, and from a traditional logico-metaphysical standpoint, it is also the more fundamental—perhaps the most fundamental of any. Just such a conception appears in The Principles of Mathematics, in a remark which will constitute the point of departure for the present commentary. In that work, Russell writes:

Whatever may be an object of thought, or may occur in any true or false proposition, or can be counted as one, I call a term. This, then, is the widest word in the philosophical vocabulary. I shall use as synonymous with it the words unit, individual and entity. The first two emphasize the fact that every term is one, while the third is derived from the fact that every term has being, i.e. is in some sense. A man, a moment, a number, a class, a relation, a chimera, or anything else that can be mentioned, is sure to be a term…[1]

In this remark, a certain extremely general, topic-neutral use of ‘object’ is singled out, a use in which the expression is treated as equivalent to (equally neutral) uses of ‘term’, ‘entity’, ‘unit’, ‘individual’, and ‘thing’. In addition, a claim is made to the effect that the content of the expression, with its emphasis on one, is such as to be adequate to comprehend the sum-total of existence, to include whatever there may be. The import of the remark would therefore seem to be more or less equivalent to that of Leibniz's pithy dictum: “Whatever is, is one”. Cognate assertions are not uncommon in the literature. Locke, for instance, writes that amongst

all the ideas we have… there is none more simple, than that of unity, or one… every idea in our understanding, every thought in our minds, brings this idea along with it… For number applies itself to… everything that either does exist or can be imagined.[2]

Again, E.J. Lowe writes that

‘Thing’, in its most general sense, is interchangeable with ‘entity’ or ‘being’ and is applicable to any item whose existence is acknowledged by a system of ontology, whether that item be particular, universal, abstract, or concrete. In this sense, not only material bodies but also properties, relations, events, numbers, sets, and propositions are—if they are acknowledged as existing—to be accounted ‘things’.[3]

1. The ‘object-concept’ and the ‘object-thesis’

It is fair to say that views of this genre typically include both the articulation of a very general concept or category of object (unit, thing, etc.) and a thesis asserting its universal applicability. Let us call the concept or category in question the object-concept, and the thesis of its universal applicability the object-thesis.[4] Philosophical uses or senses of ‘object’ less comprehensive than this are sometimes sponsored—Frege, most notably, proposes an absolute if puzzling contrast of object with concept or property—but we are here concerned exclusively with the object-concept in its unrestricted sense.

Wittgenstein remarks that the object-concept is a formal concept, or what he also calls a ‘pseudo-concept’; he writes

the variable name ‘x’ is the proper sign of the pseudo-concept object. Wherever the word ‘object’ (‘thing’, ‘entity’, etc.) is rightly used, it is expressed in logical symbolism by the variable name. For example in the proposition ‘there are two objects which…’ by ‘(∃x, y)…’. Whenever it is used otherwise, i.e. as a proper concept word, there arise senseless pseudo-propositions. So one cannot, e.g., say ‘There are objects’ as one says ‘There are books’ … The same holds of the words ‘Complex’, ‘Fact’, ‘Function’, ‘Number’, etc. They all signify formal concepts and are presented in logical symbolism by variables…[5]

The force of calling the object-concept a formal concept is simply that it is no more an empirical concept than is any concept of arithmetic, that it involves no reference to actual or possible kinds of things. And if the object-concept is no empirical concept, the object-thesis is likewise no empirical thesis. It is not, e.g., akin to positing such things as quarks, bacteria or ghosts—not a view concerning what there is in the kinds of ways in which biologists and physicists, or just plain folk, are interested in what there is. It is on the contrary a semantic thesis concerning the content of reference and of predication, and may be expressed in either of two ways—as a thesis concerning a certain feature of the meaning of general terms or predicates (or of the powers of concepts), or as a thesis on the semantics of reference. Couched à la Wittgenstein in terms of variables, the object-thesis declares that all general natural-language sentences may be represented in a formal system on the quantifier/variable model—that (with Quine) we speak of nothing which cannot figure as the value of a variable, or more precisely, that if not restricted to first-order versions, the system of the predicate calculus is ontologically complete. Unless the truth of nominalism is assumed, properties, properties of properties, and so forth, must be allowed to count as objects too. But casting matters in this mode does not advance our understanding, either of the object-concept or the object-thesis; for—as Wittgenstein's remarks themselves imply—it is the variable name ‘x’ which is to be explicated by reference to the formal object-concept, rather than vice-versa.[6]

It remains at this point to be said exactly what the object-concept is. In fact, I will suggest, both the object-concept and the object-thesis are ambiguous, lending themselves to two distinct and incompatible doctrines. In response to the Leibniz maxim ‘Whatever is, is one’, Russell replies ‘Whatever are, are many’.[7] And while these statements are not obviously incompatible as such, nevertheless, the two distinct doctrines correspond, in effect, to these two contrasting pronouncements. An examination of one modern referential formulation of the object-thesis will help to bring this out. And in particular, it will help to clarify the sense in which the question of the bottom-line constraint upon the object-concept is the question of exactly what can or cannot be counted as a unit.

2. Referential formulations of the object-thesis

There is in P.F. Strawson's Individuals a succinct and explicitly semantical formulation of the object-thesis. There, Strawson writes that

Anything whatever can be introduced into discussion by means of a singular, definitely identifying substantival expression…. Anything whatever can be identifyingly referred to; anything whatever can appear as a logical subject, an ‘individual’.

Now put in just these terms—in terms, that is, of ‘singular substantival expressions’—there would seem to be an obvious objection to the doctrine, an objection echoing Russell's rejoinder to Leibniz. Consider, for example, the many beavers presently in Lake Superior. On the one hand, it would seem counterintuitive (if not simply question-begging) to insist that they cannot be included under ‘anything whatever’. And on the other hand, it is plain that they may be ‘introduced into discussion’ by way of plural substantival expressions, e.g. by the definite description ‘the beavers in Lake Superior’ or even by the demonstrative ‘those beavers’. In any natural-language sense of ‘singular’, these phrases do not introduce something into discussion by means of “a singular, definitely identifying substantival expression”, precisely because the referring expressions in such cases are not singular but plural.[8] The beavers in Lake Superior (it could very plausibly be said) are many things and not just one. There are various possible lines of response to this prima facie objection—responses which point to the two basic versions of “the” object-thesis.[9] I call these the monistic and pluralistic versions of the object-thesis respectively.

2.1 The monistic thesis

One uncompromising line of response to ‘the problem’ of the many bases itself on a relatively common doctrine regarding the significance of plural reference itself. This doctrine may be found, e.g., in Russell's Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy.[10] Here, having in the previous chapter examined what he calls “the in the singular” in his account of so-called definite descriptions, Russell writes that in

the present chapter we shall be concerned with the in the plural: the inhabitants of London, the sons of rich men, and so on. In other words, we shall be concerned with classes.

In a similar vein, Max Black maintains that we may build

the idealised set talk of mathematicians upon the rough but serviceable uses in ordinary language of plural referring expressions… to get the abstract notion of a set as… several things referred to at once.[11]

And Lowe, once again, writes

I treat a plural noun phrase like ‘the planets’ as denoting a set… construed… as being, quite simply, a number of things… .[12]

On this approach, the concept of the many, or the use of plural expressions, calls for no modification to the doctrine that whatever is, is one. The many also count as one; what a plural referring expression designates is indeed just one—one set or equally one class. On such accounts, syntactically plural reference is semantically singular; there is a sense of ‘singular’ in which ‘singular’ and ‘reference’ are simply co-extensive, and ‘object’ is correlative with both.[13]

2.2 The eliminativist response

On this view, plural reference poses no challenge, for as Quine maintains, “by certain standardizations of phrasing the contexts that call for plurals can in principle be paraphrased away altogether.”[14] And indeed, there are very many contexts, some noted by Quine, in which plural constructions may be ‘paraphrased away’ into the essentially singular semantics of the predicate calculus. Nonetheless in the absence of a program of reduction significantly more thoroughgoing than that standardly involved in paraphrase into the calculus, this addresses only a limited set of plural constructions. George Boolos has drawn attention to quite simple sentences, e.g. ‘The rocks rained down’, which (chiefly on account of the non-distributive character of the predicate) are essentially plural. In connection with such sentences, Boolos plausibly remarks that

it would appear hopeless to try to say anything more about the meaning of a sentence of the form ‘The Ks M’ other than that it means that there are some things such that they are the Ks and they M.[15]

None of this involves denying the utility of the concept of a set or class; it insists only that the proper introduction of set-theoretical concepts calls for resources which go beyond the semantics of plural reference.

2.3 The pluralistic thesis

On this view, it is just a needlessly restrictive or illiberal version of the object-thesis which requires all reference to be semantically singular. The fundamental spirit of the object-thesis involves affirming simply that our talk is indeed talk exclusively of objects—that we may speak of objects in the plural as well as in the singular, and that plural talk of objects is talk of the very same category of things as is talk of objects in the singular. Properly conceived, the object-thesis does not require that philosophically respectable references be always somehow singular, and there is no such single object as the object of a plural reference, no such unit as ‘the many’.

This line of response bases itself on an approach to the dichotomy of singular and plural which, while less influential than the ‘individual versus class’ approach of monism, has gained a certain prominence in the recent past. The approach is best represented by the work of Boolos, for whom the dichotomy of singular and plural, one and many—though it is ‘merely’ semantical, and not also ontological— is to be accepted as absolute or as such.[16] Semantically, the plural is not the singular writ large. Boolos urges us to

Abandon the idea that the use of plural forms must be understood to commit one to the existence of sets (‘classes’, etc.)… Entities are not to be multiplied beyond necessity… It is not as though there were two sorts of things in the world, individuals and collections… There are, rather, two different ways of referring to the same ‘things’.[17]

Boolos thus maintains that

neither the use of plurals nor the employment of second order logic commits us to the existence of extra items beyond those to which we are already committed.[18]

Although ‘the many’ might be thought by some to always constitute a certain collective kind of ‘one’, plural reference itself has no single corresponding object; it is reference to ‘many distinct ones’, and not ‘a single one’. Recognition of plural sentences as an additional and distinct semantic category is taken to imply no extra ontic category.[19] The monistic thesis, on this account, involves ontologising what is in fact a merely semantic contrast.[20]

The pluralist response thus involves a certain liberalised reformulation of the object-thesis. This response accepts as irreducible the semantical dichotomy of singular and plural, one and many, but denies that ‘the many’ constitute an objection to the spirit of the object-thesis. On this view, even if there is a significant semantical distinction here, the content of the maxim that “Whatever is, is one” is not contradicted by that of the maxim that “Whatever are, are many”; ontologically, these two maxims are precisely equivalent; and there may be no reason to privilege the singular. In effect, this is to reformulate the object-thesis in a way that Locke's remark in particular (with its emphasis not only on one, but also on number quite generally) might support.[21]

3. Russellian pluralism

Among other things, The Principles of Mathematics contains a defense of the pluralist option against the monistic thesis, a defense which though incompletely developed is of sufficient importance to briefly here rehearse. Russell focusses on what are prima facie essentially plural sentences such as

(a) Brown and Jones are two of Miss Smith's suitors

He notes that “it is Brown and Jones who are two, and this is not true of either separately.” Clearly on this basis it would seem not implausible to conclude that ‘two’ is true of both collectively—that ‘Brown and Jones’, in short, denotes a unified collective subject for the collective predication (or in other words, a set or class). Nevertheless Russell insists that

it is Brown and Jones who are two… nevertheless it is not the whole composed of Brown and Jones which is two, for this is only one (57).

Russell's point would seem to be that supposing Brown and Jones to constitute a set, the fact remains that it is the members of the set who are two—the predication of ‘are two’ attaches to the members, rather than to any set itself. And he insists, furthermore, that a class

in one sense at least, is distinct from the whole composed of its terms, for the latter is only and essentially one, while the former, where it has many terms, is… the very kind of object of which many is to be asserted… (69).

Russell here introduces his notorious but suggestive terminology of ‘the class as many’, insisting that there must be

an ultimate distinction between a class as many and a class as one… the many are only many, and are not also one (76).

Or as he also writes, in

such a proposition as ‘A and B are two’, there is no logical subject: the assertion is not about A, nor about B, nor about the whole composed of both, but strictly and only about A and B (77).

And again, with something of an air of paradox, he insists that a

plurality of terms is not the logical subject when a number is asserted of it; such propositions have not one subject, but many subjects (69, fn.).

Conceiving the notion of ‘the many’ as some one to be just plain incoherent, Russell wishes to give theoretical articulation to a notion of the absolute diversity of the many. He attempts to promote the idea—by no means an intuitively outrageous one—that there is simply no such object as ‘the many’—no such thing as the logical subject of a semantically plural sentence, the (possibly collective) nature of the predication notwithstanding. There can, Russell is inclined to think, be no single subject for a collective (and here, specifically numerical) predication; “there is not a single term at all which is the collection of the many terms…”(514).

4. Predicative formulation of the object-thesis

The pluralistic version of the object-thesis is semantically richer, and by the same token ontologically more economical, than its monistic version, and the work of Russell and Boolos suggests that it is also the more plausible account. But just how plausible, at the end of the day, is this account? I conclude with some comments on the predicative formulation of the object-thesis which have a bearing on this question.

As a thesis concerning the meaning of general terms, the object-thesis may be expressed as the requirement that all substantival predicate-expressions (concepts, kinds) satisfy the object-concept—in effect, that they are constrained by a numerical constituent. And it is clear, for example, that the terms ‘rabbit’, ‘tree’ and ‘planet’ satisfy the object-concept; for insofar as such a (singular) general term as ‘rabbit’, ‘tree’ or ‘planet’ is true of anything, it is true, in virtue of its meaning, of just one item at a time. But here again, the ambiguity of the object-thesis as between singular-exclusively and singular-and-plural readings must be recorded: plural invariable nouns such as ‘cattle’ and ‘clothes’, unlike ‘tree’ and ‘planet’, apply only collectively or plurally. While ‘All trees have leaves’ becomes, according to the canon, ‘If something is a tree then it has leaves’, such singular paraphrase of ‘All cattle have tails’ is ruled out by the grammar. The legitimacy of a plural formulation of the object-thesis seems here too in need of recognition.

The qualification ‘substantival predicate-expressions’ above is suggested by an issue noted by Frege, who writes that

Only a concept which isolates what falls under it in a definite manner, and which does not permit any arbitrary division into parts, can be a unit relative to a finite number… Not all concepts posses this quality. We can, for example, divide up something falling under the concept ‘red’ into parts in a variety of ways, without the parts thereby ceasing to fall under the same concept ‘red’.[22]

In current terms, Frege's point could be put by saying that while terms like ‘rabbit’ and ‘planet’ are terms of ‘divided reference’, or come with built-in principles for counting that to which they are applied, an adjectival term like ‘red’ does not. To say that something is red does not directly involve its being countable as one, in the way that to say that something is a planet, or (equally) is round, plainly does. Further argument would clearly be required, to establish that concepts such as ‘red’ must, indirectly, satisfy the object-concept, though what that argument would be is hardly clear.

And this is not the end of the matter, for it does not address the issue of such substantival terms as ‘blood’ and ‘gold’—so called ‘mass nouns’, non-count nouns which do not appear to satisfy the object-concept either, whether in the monistic or pluralistic formulations. There seem to be non-singular sentences involving such nouns which are not obviously plural—e.g. ‘All water contains impurities’ as against ‘All apples contain pesticides’ or ‘All cattle have tails’—for which therefore the object-thesis may, even in its most liberal form, be difficult to sustain. This issue in particular is considered in Words without Objects (Laycock, 2006a), in which the overall status of non-singular sentences is examined at some length.


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