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Albert of Saxony

First published Mon Jan 29, 2001; substantive revision Mon Apr 27, 2009

Albert of Saxony (ca. 1316-1390), Master of Arts at Paris, then Rector of the University of Vienna, and finally Bishop of Halberstadt (Germany). As a logician, he was at the forefront of the movement that expanded the analysis of language based on the properties of terms, especially their reference (in Latin: suppositio), but also in the exploration of new fields of logic, especially the theory of consequences. As a natural philosopher, he worked in the tradition of John Buridan and contributed to the spread of Parisian natural philosophy throughout Italy and central Europe.

1. Life and Works

In the later Middle Ages Albert of Saxony (Albertus de Saxonia) was sometimes called Albertucius (Little Albert), to distinguish him from the thirteenth-century theologian Albert the Great. He was born at Rickensdorf, in the region of Helmstedt (Lower Saxony) in present-day Germany around 1316. After initial schooling in his native area, and possibly a sojourn at Erfurt, he made his way to Prague and then on to Paris. He was member of the English-German Nation and became a master of arts in 1351. He was Rector of the University of Paris in 1353. He remained in Paris until 1362, during which time he taught arts and studied theology at the Sorbonne, apparently without obtaining a degree in the latter discipline. His logical and philosophical works were composed during this period. After two years of carrying out diplomatic missions between the Pope and the Duke of Austria, he was charged with founding the University of Vienna, of which he became the first Rector in 1365. Appointed canon of Hildesheim in 1366, he was also named Bishop of Halberstadt the same year, serving in that office until his death on July 8, 1390.

Not having left any theological writings or a commentary on Aristotle's Metaphysics (at least none that we know of), Albert is primarily known for his works on logic and natural philosophy, though he also wrote commentaries on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics and Economics, as well as several short mathematical texts (the Treatise on Proportions and Question on the Squaring of the Circle).

Albert's masterwork in logic is a summa entitled the Perutilis logica (Very Useful Logic). He also composed a voluminous collection of Sophismata, which examines numerous sentences that raise difficulties of interpretation due to the presence of syncategorematic words -- i.e., terms such as quantifiers and certain prepositions, which, according to medieval logicians, do not have a proper and determinate signification but rather modify the signification of the other terms in the propositions in which they occur. He also wrote several question commentaries: Quaestiones on the Ars Vetus or Old Logic (i.e., the Isagoge of Porphyry and Aristotle's Categories and De Interpretatione), Quaestiones on the Posterior Analytics, and a series of 25 Quaestiones logicales (Logical Questions), addressed to semantic problems and the status of logic. Of dubious authenticity are the treatises De consequentiis (On Consequences) and De locis dialecticis (On Dialectical Topics), which have been attributed to him in a Parisian manuscript.

The most renowned philosopher when Albert studied and taught in the Faculty of Arts at Paris was John Buridan. Albert belonged to the first generation of masters who in one form or other carried on the tradition of Buridan in logic and natural philosophy. For a long time he was thought to have been a pupil or follower of Buridan, but this idea has recently been questioned, especially in connection with his logical writings. Albert's work differs from Buridan's in many respects and, unlike Buridan, he seems to have been influenced by certain ideas and methods imported from England. His logic depends very much on Ockham's, but also evident is the influence of William Heytesbury on his Sophismata and Thomas Bradwardine on his treatment of motion. Walter Burley was another important influence on Albert, though this is somewhat puzzling in view of the fact that they had opposing views on the nature of universals. In any case, Burley seems to have been on Albert's mind when he wrote his commentary on the Nicomachean Ethics as well as when we was developing his theory of consequences. It has also been suggested (though the evidence here is more sparse) that Albert was acquainted with and made reference to the views of Thomas Maulfelt, who probably taught at Paris around 1330.

These different influences have sometimes made Albert seem no more than an eclectic compiler of the views of others. But, in addition to providing the context for some of his own contributions, Albert's fluency with the views of his contemporaries gives him a unique place in the development of logic and philosophy at the University of Paris in the fourteenth century.

2. Logic

On most topics the Perutilis logica is influenced by Ockham's Summa logicae, though it offers an independent approach in the treatises on obligations, insolubles, and consequences, which had assumed greater importance during this period. As has been known for some time, this work is a remarkable handbook organized into six treatises: the first defines the elements of propositions; the second treats of the properties of terms; the third of the truth conditions of different types of proposition; the fourth of consequences (including syllogisms, and in fact adding to it the theory of topics); the fifth of fallacies; and the sixth of insolubles and obligations.

In the first part of the Perutilis logica, which sets out the terminology of the entire text, Albert returns to the Ockhamist conception of the sign in so doing distances himself from the position defended by Buridan. After clearly including the term (an element of the proposition) in the genus of signs -- by which he provides, in the tradition of Ockham, a semiotic approach to logico-linguistic analysis -- he establishes signification through a referential relation to a singular thing, defining the relation of spoken to conceptual signs as a relation of subordination. He is also Ockhamist in his conception of universals, which he regards as spoken or conceptual signs, and in his theory of supposition, which essentially restates the Ockhamist divisions of supposition. In particular, he restores the notion of simple supposition -- i.e., the reference of a term to the concept to which it is subordinated, when it signifies an extra-mental thing -- which had been criticized and rejected by Buridan. Finally, Albert is close to the Venerabilis Inceptor in his theory of the categories, where, in contrast to Buridan, he refuses to consider quantity as something absolutely real, reducing it instead to a disposition of substance and quality. Albert in fact contributed as much as Ockham to the spread of this conception of the relation between substance and quantity in natural philosophy in Paris and Italy.

Albert's treatment of relations is, on the other hand, highly original. Although (like Ockham) he refuses to make relations into things distinct from absolute entities, he clearly ascribes them to an act of the soul by which absolute entities are compared and placed in relation to each other (an act of the referring soul [actus animae referentis]). This leads him to reject completely certain propositions Ockham had admitted as reasonable, even if he did not construe them in quite the same way, e.g., ‘Socrates is a relation’. Both Ockham and Buridan had allowed that the term ‘relation’ could refer to the things related (whether connoted or signified) by concrete relative terms (whether collectively or not).

So Albert was not content with merely repeating Ockhamist arguments. More often than not, he developed and deepened them, e.g., in connection with the notion of the appellation of form. This property of predicates, which had previously been used by the Venerabilis Inceptor, was employed by Albert in an original manner when he adopted it instead of Buridan's appellation of reason (appellatio rationis) to analyze verbs expressing propositional attitudes. Every proposition following a verb such as ‘believe’ or ‘know’ appellates its form. In other words, it must be possible to designate the object of the belief via the expression understood as identical to itself in its material signification and without reformulation. Another area in which Albert deviates from Ockham is his rejection of the idea that any distinction with multiple senses must have an equivocal proposition as its object. According to Albert, equivocal propositions can only be conceded, rejected, or left in doubt.

Albert's semantics becomes innovative when he admits that propositions have their own proper significate, which is not identical to that of their terms (see especially his Questions on the Posterior Analytics I, qq. 2, 7, 33). Like syncategorematic terms (see his Questions on the Categories, qu. 1 ‘On Names’), propositions signify the “mode of a thing [modus rei]”. This position is not repeated in the Logical Questions. In any case, Albert avoids hypostatizing these modes by explaining them as relations between the things to which the terms refer. It cannot be said here that Albert is moving towards the “complexly signifiable [complexe significabile]” of Gregory of Rimini, although his remarks are reminiscent of the latter theory. Still, he uses the idea of the signification of a proposition to define truth and to explain ‘insolubles’, i.e., propositions expressing paradoxes of self-reference. On Albert's view, every proposition signifies that it is true by virtue of its form. Thus, an insoluble proposition is always false because it signifies at the same time that it is true and that it is false.

The Questiones circa logicam (Questions on Logic) were written at roughly the same time as the Perutilis logica and the Questiones circa artem veterem, that is to say about 1356. They explore in a series of disputed questions the status of logic and semantics (on topics such as the relation of words to concepts, the difference between natural and conventional signification, etc.) as well as the theory of reference and truth. Albert defines signification by representation. He disinguishes two ways of understanding suppositio, the first as the act the mind itself; the second as an operation constituting one of the properties of terms.

In his Sophismata, Albert usually follows Heytesbury. The distinction between compounded and divided senses, which is presented in a highly systematic way in Heytesbury's Tractatus de sensu composito et diviso, is the primary instrument (besides the appellation of form) for resolving difficulties connected with epistemic verbs and with propositional attitudes more generally. This is abundantly clear in his discussion of infinity. Rather than appealing to the increasingly common distinction between the categorematic and syncategorematic uses of the term ‘infinite’ and then indicating the different senses it can have depending on where it occurs in a proposition, he treats the infinite itself as a term. Albert's approach involves analyzing the logical and linguistic conditions of every proposition involving the term ‘infinite’ that is significant and capable of being true. This leads him to sketch a certain number of possible definitions (where he appears to take into account the teachings of Gregory of Rimini), as well as to raise other questions, e.g., on the relation between finite and infinite beings (in propositions such as ‘Infinite things are finite [infinita sunt finita]’), on the divisibility of the continuum, and on qualitative infinity. There are echoes in Albert not only of the approach Buridan had systematically implemented in his Physics, but also of the analyses of English authors -- again, especially Heytesbury. As is often the case, although the treatment proposed by Albert in the Sophismata is quick and somewhat eclectic, it provides good evidence of the extent to which philosophers were gripped by questions about infinity at that time.

Finally, one of the fields in which Albert is considered a major contributor is the theory of consequences. In the treatise of the Perutilis Logica devoted to consequences, Albert often seems to follow Buridan. But whereas Buridan maintained the central role of Aristotelian syllogistic, Albert, like Burley, integrated syllogistic and the study of conversions into the theory of consequences. Consequence is defined as the impossibility of the antecedent's being true without the consequent's also being true -- truth itself being such that howsoever the proposition signifies things to be, so they are. The primary division is between formal and material consequences, the latter being subdivided into consequences simpliciter and ut nunc. A syllogistic consequence is a formal consequence whose antecedent is a conjunction of two quantified propositions and whose consequent is a third quantified proposition. Albert is thus led to present a highly systematic theory of the forms of inference, which represents a major step forward in the medieval theory of logical deduction.

3. Natural Philosophy

It is this analysis of language together with a particularist ontology that places Albert in the tradition of nominalism. This is combined with an epistemological realism that emerges, e.g., in his analysis of the vacuum. In certain respects, Albert's work is an extension of physical analysis to imaginary cases. Distinguishing, as Buridan did, between what is absolutely impossible or contradictory and what is impossible “in the common course of nature” (Questions on De Caelo I, qu. 15), he considers hypotheses under circumstances that are not naturally possible but imaginable given God's absolute power (e.g., the existence of a vacuum and the plurality of worlds). However, even if we can imagine a vacuum existing by divine omnipotence, no vacuum can occur naturally (Questions on the Physics IV, qu. 8). Albert refuses to extend the reference of physical terms to supernatural, purely imaginary possibilities. In the same way, one can certainly use the concept of a point, although this would only be an abbreviation of a connotative and negative expression. There is no simple concept of a point, a vacuum, or the infinite, and although imaginary hypotheses provide an interesting detour, physics must in the end provide an account of the natural order of things.

Historically, Albert does not enjoy the kind of reputation in natural philosophy he has in logic. His commentaries on the Physics and De caelo are close to Buridan's, and he appeals to the authority of his “revered masters from the Faculty of Arts at Paris” at the beginning of his questions on De caelo. Even so, it should be noted that his Physics was written before the final version of Buridan's Questions on the Physics (between 1355 and 1358), which means that he could not have benefited from the final version of Buridan's lectures.

We have already seen that on the question of the status of the category of quantity, then at the forefront of logic and physics, Albert followed Ockham and distanced himself from Buridan by reducing quantity to a disposition of substance or quality. This move becomes evident in certain physical questions, e.g., in the study of condensation and rarefaction, where Albert openly disagrees with his Parisian master by arguing that condensation and rarefaction are possible only through the local motion of the parts of a body, and without needing to assume some quantity that would have a distinct reality on its own. Nevertheless, he defines the concept of a “lump of matter [materie massa]” without giving it any autonomous reality, although it does help fill out the idea of a ‘quantity of matter’, which Giles of Rome had already distinguished from simple extension.

Similarly, Albert is sometimes seen as standing alongside Ockham on the nature of motion, rejecting the idea of motion as a flux (fluxus), which is the position Buridan had adopted. In contrast to his Buridan, Albert treats locomotion in the same way as alteration (movement according to quality): in neither case is it necessary to imagine local motion as a res successiva distinct from permanent things, at least if the common course of nature holds and one does not take into account the possibility of divine intervention.

Concerning the motion of projectiles, gravitational acceleration, and the motion of celestial bodies, Albert adopts Buridan's major innovation, i.e., the theory of impetus, a quality acquired by a moving body (see Buridan's Questions on the Physics VIII, qu. 13, on projectile motion). Like Buridan, he extends this approach to celestial bodies in his commentary on De caelo, clearly following its consequences in rejecting intelligences as agents of motion and in treating celestial and terrestrial bodies using the same principles. Nevertheless, he formulates the idea of impetus in more classical terms as a virtus impressa (impressed force) and virtus motiva (motive force). Albert makes no pronouncements about the nature of this force, claiming that this is a question for the metaphysician. His work also mentions the mean speed theorem, a method of finding the total velocity of a uniformly accelerated (or decelerated) body, which had been stated (though without being demonstrated) in Heytesbury's Tractatus de motu, and also adopted by Nicole Oresme. Albert was part of a general scientific trend which sought the first formulations of the principles of dynamics. He explained a number of curious natural phenomena, taking particular interest in earthquakes, tidal phenomena, and geology

Albert explains in a synthetic way the elements of the theory of proportions, applying this theory to different motions (local motion, alteration, augmentation and diminution). Motion is to be studied "from the point of view of the cause" and from the point of view of the effect. Like Oresme, Albert adopts the idea that motion varies according to a geometrical progression when the relation of motive forces to resistances varies arithmetically. His treatise is less innovative than Oresme's, but it is a clear exposition that was very widely read.

Like Buridan his predecessor, Albert was interested in certain mathematical problems. To this end, he wrote a question on the squaring of the circle as well as questions on John of Sacrobosco's Treatise on the Sphere. In addition to authoritative arguments and purely empirical justifications, his question on the squaring of the circle uses properly mathematical arguments appealing to both Euclid (in the version of Campanus of Novarra) and Archimedes (translated by Gerard of Cremona). His most original contribution is a proposal to dispense with Euclid's proposition X.1, replacing it with a postulate stating that if A is less than B, then there exists a quantity C such that A<C<B.

4. Impact and Influence

Albert of Saxony's teachings on logic and metaphysics were extremely influential. Although Buridan remained the predominant figure in logic, Albert's Perutilis logica was destined to serve as a popular text because of its systematic nature and also because it takes up and develops essential aspects of the Ockhamist position. But it was his commentary on Aristotle's Physics that was especially widely read. Many manuscripts of it can be found in France and Italy, in Erfurt and Prague. Thanks to Albert of Saxony, many new ideas raised in Parisian physics and cosmology in the later Middle Ages became widespread in Central Europe. Albert's Physics, much more than Oresme's and even Buridan's, basically guaranteed the transmission of the Parisian tradition also in Italy, where it was authoritative along with the works of Heytesbury and John Dumbleton. His commentary on Aristotle's De caelo was also influential, eventually eclipsing Buridan's commentary on this text (although Albert often follows Buridan's commentary). Blasius of Parma read it in Bologna between 1379 and 1382. A little later, it enjoyed a wide audience at Vienna. His Treatise on Proportions was often quoted in Italy where, in addition to the texts of Bradwardine and Oresme, it influenced the application of the theory of proportions to motion.

Albert played an essential role in the diffusion throughout Italy and central Europe of Parisian ideas which bore the mark of Buridan's teachings, but which were also clearly shaped by Albert's own grasp of English innovations. At the same time, Albert was not merely a compiler of the work of others. He knew how to construct proofs of undeniable originality on many topics in logic and physics.


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Related Entries

Bradwardine, Thomas | Buridan, John [Jean] | Burley [Burleigh], Walter | Heytesbury, William | Ockham [Occam], William


The author gratefully acknowledges Jack Zupko for translating this entry into English.