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William Heytesbury

First published Mon Jan 6, 2003; substantive revision Wed Mar 21, 2007

William Heytesbury (before 1313–1372/3) was a fellow of Oxford's Merton College from 1330, where, with Richard Kilvington, Richard Swineshead, Thomas Bradwardine and John Dumbleton, the Mertonian “Calculators”, he worked with logical puzzles, applying supposition theory to the logical exposition of problematic statements (sophismata), attending in particular to scope problems and compounded and divided sense. He is particularly noted for applying his methods to puzzles about motion and the continuum. His work curiously anticipates nineteenth-century mathematical analysis of the continuum, and he is well know for developing the Mean Speed Theorem concerning the distance covered over a period of time under uniform acceleration. His work had some influence on the deveopment of early modern science, though he cannot be said to have been doing empirical science, his work being much closer to mathematical analysis.

1. Biography

William Heytesbury first appears to us as a fellow at Merton College in Oxford in 1330. He must have been born before 1313, probably in Wiltshire, Salisbury Diocese. He served as the first bursar in his college in 1338–39, and although he was named a fellow of the new Queen's College in 1340, he soon returned to Merton. He had become a Doctor of Theology by 1348. He was chancellor of the University in 1371–72, and may also have served an earlier term in the same office, if the record do not reflect a mere tenure pro tempore, in 1553–54. William died just as he finished his chancellorship, in the winter of 1372/73.

2. Works and Influence

All of Heytesbury's works were probably written during his regency in the Arts at Merton, so approximately 1331–1339. His most noted work, the Rules for Solving Sophismata [Regulae solvendi sophismata], dated to 1335 by one manuscript, consists of six chapters, (1) On insoluble sentences (concerning self-referential paradoxes) (2) On knowing and doubting (concerning reference in intensional contexts), (3) On relative terms (concerning the supposition of relative pronouns), (4) On beginning and ceasing, (5) On maxima and minima (concerning the limits of capacities), and (6) On the three categories (concerning velocity and acceleration in the three categories of place, quantity and quality). A work supplementing the Rules, On the Proofs of Conclusions from the Treatise of Rules for Resolving Syllogisms [De probationibus conclusionum tractatus regularum solvendi sophismata], which may not be by William himself, appears in early printed editions and manuscripts. The Regulae was an advanced work in logic, and William also wrote a number of more elementary works, focusing chiefly on logical and semantical issues rather than paradoxes involving the continuum, including a collection of 32 Sophismata, and a second collection of 39 sophisms purportedly proving that the respondent is a donkey (tu est asinus), entitled Sophismata Asinina. He produced a number of short works at the more elementary level as well, including On the Compound and Divided Senses [De sensus composito et diviso], and Concerning the Truth and Falsehood of Premises [De veritate et falsitate propositionis]. All of these works appear in the 1494 edition of his works by Locatellus. In addition, some works found only in manuscript include a treatise on consequences, another on obligations, one on future contingents, and a beginner's book of definitions and divisions in natural philosophy. (For the mss. for all these, see Weisheipl 1969. Additional works on insolubilia cited in Weisheipl 1969 have been shown by Spade 1989 to be falsely attributed to Heytesbury.)

Heytesbury was one of the second generation of the Oxford school of “Calculators,” building on Richard Kilvington's Sophismata (before 1325), and Thomas Bradwardine's Insolubilia and Tractatus de Proportionibus (1328). His major work, the Regulae, had considerable influence. It is used in the anonymous Tractatus de Sex Inconvenientibus, and John Dumbleton's Summa Naturalium. In England the tradition of the Oxford School seems to have faded out by 1400, but it became quite popular in Italy. Heytesbury's Regulae and Sophismata influenced Peter of Mantua (d. 1400) in his De Instanti and Logica, Paul of Venice (d. 1429) in his Summa Naturalium and Sophismata, Gaetano of Thiene (1387–1465), who commented on the works (probably 1422–30), Paul of Pergula (d. 1456), who also commented on Heytesbury's works, and a score of more minor authors. Heytesbury's works became part of the curriculum by statute at Padua in 1487, and editions of his works were printed at Pavia in 1481, and Padua in 1491 and 1494. In the early 16th century his works were used at Paris by John Major (d. 1540) and the members of his school. But with the Humanist reaction against medieval logical developments, Heytesbury's work ceased to be used in the schools and descended into obscurity.

3. Doctrine

Heytesbury's work rotates around sophismata. A sophisma is a statement which one can plausibly argue both to be true and to be false, given certain explicit background assumptions (the casus) which are, for the sake of the argument, not open to challenge. The resolution of these arguments and determination of the real state of affairs forces one to deal with logical matters such as the analysis of the meaning of the statement in question, and the application of logical rules to specific cases. Modern philosophers certainly discuss sophismata even if they don't have the name. For instance, Bertrand Russell inaugurated a discussion entirely in Heytesbury's spirit of the sentence, ‘the present King of France is bald’, given that there is at present no King of France. These sophismata occurred for medieval thinkers in the context of formal debates, in which the aim of the questioner (opponens) was to trap the answerer (respondens) in contradiction or absurdity, while the answerer had to answer each question put, accepting all valid inferences from any admission he had already made. These debates were a training device in dialectic and logic going back to the time of Plato and Aristotle, and Aristotle's Topics and Sophistical Refutation makes reference to the 4th-century Greek version of such debates. A sophistical refutation (a refutation of the sort a Sophist might make) depends on some fallacy that the questioner counts on the answerer not spotting. Every sophisma, of course, would seem to involve at least one sophistical proof, since it cannot be both true and false in the conditions specified.

In what follows I will give some relatively simple examples of particular sophismata and classes of sophismata, and Heytesbury's treatment of them, and some of Heytesbury rules for handling sophismata where the rules are illustrative, or of interest on their own. In most cases I will not work out the sophisma in detail. The reader should go to the texts to see just how complex the cases considered can get, and how sure-footed Heytesbury is in his handling of them. The sophismata dealt with by Heytesbury in his rules were not the most complex discussed (as a comparison to Kilvington will show), but it seems they were intended for higher level students. A large part of the success of Heytesbury's work rests on its having hit the right level of difficulty, as well as its determined effort to bring some order to what inevitably became a chaos of arguments, and to offer the student some firm rules to guide him in the chances of the disputation.

3.1 Insolubles

The opening chapter of the work for which Heytesbury is most known, the Rules for Solving Sophismata, deals with ‘insoluble’ sentences, i.e., self-referential sentences such as ‘what I am now uttering is false’. (The original for these is Eubulides's paradox of the liar.) Heytesbury seems to have thought insolubles to be indeed insoluble. For one thing, at some point even in what he takes to be the best solution one must maintain a strongly counter-intuitive proposition, which can only be justified when one sees that every other solution involves propositions that are even more counter-intuitive. Consider the following case: Someone says, “what I am now saying is false,” and says only that. Now given the conventions that would normally define what the words here signify (what its words ‘commonly pretend to signify’), the statement, if it is true, must be false, and if it is false, it must be true. As Heytesbury sees it, this means that it is contradictory to assume that the person indeed utters the sentence, and that he utters it with the signification specified in the conventions that give meaning to his words. The best way out of the contradiction, Heytesbury thinks, is to hold that the words do not signify what they normally should by the language's conventions. This is, as he confesses, a difficult solution of the case to maintain, for one might ask where the words get their signification if not from the conventions of the language? If the language itself does not have conventions setting its own conventions aside in such cases as this, where do we get off announcing that the words cannot have the meaning assigned to them? Do we want to claim that the fellow somehow secretly assigns a different meaning to them as he speaks? But surely that may not be the case.

The only reason to accept this resolution of the difficulty, Heytesbury thinks, is that every other resolution is worse. The other positions he considers, supposing that the sentence does signify as the conventions of the language say, are (1) a true sentence is not merely one that signifies things are as in fact they are, but also does not falsify itself, and so the insoluble is false, as is its contradictory, (2) that insolubles are not really sentences at all, though they do signify, and so are neither true nor false, and (3) that even though an insoluble is a sentence which is true or false, it is not true, and it is not false. (This last was no doubt inspired by a line taken on the question of future contingents raised in Aristotle's On Intrepretation 9, holding that although it is true or false that the sea-battle will take place tomorrow, if the general has not decided whether to commit his forces or withdraw, then it is not true, and it is not false, that it will take place.) Heytesbury thinks that the answerer can be caught in flat out contradictions if he follows any of these lines, and so the only line left for him is to deny that the sentence signifies in accord with the usual conventions, and defend the implausibilities that arise. But these implausibilities are not the worst of it, for, as Heytesbury sees, a case can be constructed specifically against his position as follows: A person utters the sentence ‘this sentence signifies that things are not as it signifies by the conventions actually establishing its signification.’ He has no reply to offer to that insoluble. Heytesbury's treatment of insolubilia is reasonably straightforward, and convincing enough to have served as a starting point for the considerations of most later medieval authors on the subject.

3.2 On Knowing and Doubting

The second chapter of the Regulae deals with sophismata based on the notions of knowing and doubting. In each case it is argued on the assumptions given both that one knows something, and that one is in doubt whether it is the case, or ignorant that it is the case. So, assume that one does not know whether the proposition that has just been uttered is ‘God exists’, which one knows must be true, or ‘a man is a donkey’, which one knows must be false. Assume also that one does know that it is one or the other of these. Finally, assume that the sentence is in fact ‘God exists’. Then one knows that that sentence (‘God exists’) must be true, but one is in doubt whether that sentence (the one just uttered) is true. Or, in a different case, assume that you saw Socrates yesterday, and know that the man you saw yesterday was Socrates, and you see Socrates today, but don't realize that it is Socrates, but mistake him for Plato. Then you know that this (the one you saw yesterday) is Socrates, but you do not know that this (the same person, seen today) is Socrates. (These are versions, again, of one of Eubulides's paradoxes, this time, the paradox of the veiled person.)

Heytesbury treats these cases by making a distinction. In the first case, let A be the offending sentence. Then ‘A, I know to be true’ does not mean the same thing as ‘I know A to be true’. The first means that I know of A that it is true (the ‘divided sense’), the second that I know ‘A is true’(the ‘compounded sense’). Neither of the sentences ‘I know A to be true’ and ‘A, I know to be true’ follows from the other. I might know that ‘God exists’ is true, but not know of sentence A, which says ‘God exists’, that it is true, if I don't know what sentence A says. Or I might know of sentence A that it is true, on the basis of reliable authority, but not know what A says, and doubt that God exists. Similarly, one might think Socrates dead, and still, Socrates one might know to be alive. One does not know that Socrates is alive, but one knows of Socrates (whom one takes to be Plato) that he is alive. In the one case (the compounded sense) the sentence taken as a whole (the dictum) is what one knows to be true, in the second (the divided sense) what is known is the subject, a part of the sentence, and the predicate is known of it. (Note that Heytesbury works out his solution here without assuming a distinction between the sentence and the proposition expressed by it. He generally takes a nominalist line, and will have no truck with propositions expressed by sentences. It should also be noted that the Latin propositio is best translated as ‘sentence,’ or even ‘sentence-token,’ where it does not mean instead ‘premise.’ To express ‘proposition’ in the modern sense, one would have had to speak, perhaps, of significatio.) In the treatise On the Compounded and Divided Senses this sort of case falls under the 8th way in which that distinction occurs, in connection with verbs indicating mental acts and acts of will. (Heytesbury takes these cases to be very like the 1st way in which he says the distinction occurs, involving modality de dicto and de re.) There the simple case first examined is ‘You know one or the other of these to be true, therefore one or the other of these you know to be true’, which is clearly invalid, for I may know that the sea-battle either will or will not occur, and not know which. Here the divided sense (one of them I know to be true) is concluded illegitimately from the compounded sense (I know one-or-the-other-of-them to be true). Similar false inferences are ‘the man appears to be a donkey, therefore it appears that the man is a donkey’, and ‘you understand some man is going to come here, therefore of some man you understand that he is going to come here’.

3.3 Heytesbury's Use of the Theory of Supposition

Heytesbury presupposes the theory of supposition, developed in 12th and 13th centuries, in his discussions. The supposition of a term in a sentence token is, roughly speaking, the reference of that term as determined by its meaning in general and its place within the sentence. ‘Material supposition’ occurs when a term is used for itself , as ‘man’ is in ‘man is a noun.’ ‘Simple supposition’ occurs when a word is used for a universal (for Heytesbury, no doubt a ‘mental word’ or concept), as in ‘man is a species’. ‘Personal supposition’ occurs when the word is used to refer to things falling under its signification, as in ‘a man runs’. Personal supposition is divided into ‘discrete’ and ‘common’ supposition, the former occurring when the term is used to refer to a definite, particular individual , as in ‘that man is running’, and the second when it is used to refer to whatever falls under the signification of the term. Common supposition is divided into ‘determinate supposition’, in which one refers to everything falling under the term's signification disjunctively, as in ‘some man runs’ = ‘this man or that man or the other man . . . runs’, and ‘confused supposition’, in which the term refers to everything falling under its signification, but not disjunctively. Confused supposition includes ‘distributive supposition’, in which one can descend logically from the sentence using the term conjunctively, as in ‘every man runs’ = ‘this man and that man and the other man … runs’, and also ‘merely confused’ or ‘non-distributive’ supposition, in which such a descent cannot be made, as for instance in ‘every tinker is a man’, which is not equivalent to ‘every tinker is this man and that man …’. On the other hand, there is a certain kind of descent possible in the last example, for ‘every tinker is man’ = ‘every tinker is this man or that man or the other man …’. This case is one of merely confused mobile supposition, and where not even this sort of thing can be done, we have merely confused immobile supposition.

These notions about supposition are applied by Heytesbury in conjunction with two other devices. First of all, he recognizes that in addition to categorical terms, which have supposition, there are also often ‘syncategorematic’ terms in a sentence, which influence the supposition of the terms around them, but may have no supposition of their own. The only function of the word ‘every’ in a sentence, for instance, is to distribute the supposition of the term immediately following it, that is, it produces distributive supposition in the term, as in ‘every man is running’. The most interesting syncategorematic words for Heytesbury are generally those which produce confused supposition in the terms which follow them. Since syncategorematic terms only affect terms that follow them, moving a term confused by a syncategorematic word before that word will negate the confusing effect of the word. The second device is the notion that some terms are exponible, which will be explained below.

3.4 Compounded and Divided Sense

In The Compounded and Divided Senses, Heytesbury lays out a 14th-century elaboration of the Aristotelian discussion of the fallacies of composition and division marked by the development of technical devices involving word order within Latin to distinguish the contrasting compounded and divided senses identified in each instance. He uses the distinctions developed here on almost every page of his more advanced works. William begins by considering cases involving modal terms, most often the term ‘possible’. In general, a divided sense occurs if the modal comes in the midst of a proposition, so that the subject precedes it. So we might say “you can be here and in Rome,” meaning that you have a capacity, which can be exercised at different times, to be in one or the other of those places, and this is presumably true. It does not follow that “it can be that you are here and at Rome,” marking the compounded sense by placing the modal term before the entire proposition, for that means that “you are both here and at Rome” can be true at one and the same time, and this, of course, is false (at least for those of us writing in Wisconsin). Similarly, “a white thing can be black” may be true, but “it can be that a white thing is black” cannot. (It should be noted that the divided sense answers quite well to Aristotle's treatment of modalities in the Prior Analytics, whereas the compounded sense corresponds nicely to the treatment of modalities by Theophrastus.) More mysteriously, “you can traverse this distance” is taken to be true even when “it can be that you traverse this distance” is not. Here the problem is that the compounded sense requires that the sentence be made true at one time, in an instant, and one cannot traverse a distance in an instant. It takes time. But Heytesbury thinks that sometimes one can argue from a divided to a compounded sense, as in “You can be a bishop, therefore it can be that you are a bishop.” Problems arise only when the statement in question cannot be made true in an instant. (In general, sometimes one sense follows from the other, and sometimes it doesn't, and Heytesbury tries to come up with rules where he can to decide which is the case.) Many of Williams' sophismata most confusing to the uninitiated depend, as here, on compounded and divided senses applied to times, that is, they present problems in tense logic. In such cases the Latin is often artificial enough so that one must rely quite determinedly on the explicit rules for its interpretation within logic, ignoring linguistic intuition, to follow what is intended.

The distinction made by word order is an artificial one, of course, and drew undeserved negative comment from Renaissance humanists concerned with good Latinity. Heytesbury is trying to find a way within a natural language to make statements logically unambiguous, so that rules of inference can developed and applied to them syntactically, a reasonable aim, of course, within logic. It did not occur to medieval logicians to create an entirely artificial language for this purpose, as we have done, so they tried to develop a specialized form of Latin for the task. Having said this, we can also observe that Heytesbury's specifications about the meanings associated with word order are often fairly natural in English (his native tongue), and some of them may also have been natural in medieval Latin, a living, spoken tongue, at least as it was spoken in England.

In the 2nd way, one can have a compounded and divided sense when a term producing merely confused supposition in a common term immediately following it is used. For instance, “eternally (after any future instant) there will be some man (compounded sense), therefore some man will be eternally (after any future instant) (divided sense)” does not follow, for the supposition of ‘man’ is confused by the term ‘eternally’ in the antecedent, but stands in determinate supposition in the consequent. (To see the point, assume for the sake of argument that no man is immortal.) Again, consider “body A begins to touch some point of body B.” here ‘begins’ confuses the supposition of ‘point’, producing a compounded sense, so that one cannot infer from this that “some point of body B body A begins to touch,” where ‘point’ now has determinate supposition. This is important if the points of body B form an infinite set with no assignable first member, so that the limit points of body B are assumed not to belong to it. For us this distinction hangs on quantifier scope, so:

x(x is a time after the present → ∃y(y is a man & y exists at x))

will have a compounded sense, and

y(y is a man & ∀x(x is a time after the present → y exists at x))

gives the divided sense.

In the 3rd way the two senses arise because relative pronouns produce a compounded sense joined to their antecedents. So it does not follow that “every animal that can bray is a donkey, therefore every animal can bray,” or “therefore, every animal is a donkey.” A more complicated example: “Immediately after the present instant there will be some instant which immediately after the present instant will be” has a compounded sense, and since the antecedent of “which” has confused supposition (due to the ‘immediately’ phrase preceding it), the sentence is true. “Immediately after the present instant there will be some instant and it immediately after the present instant will be” is false, for now the “it” is not a relative, and does not inherit its antecedent's supposition. Thus it has determinate supposition, and there is no determinate instant that will be immediately after the present instant.

In the 4th way, it turns out that there are some terms that can be taken either categorically or syncategorematically. One particularly troublesome case here for a modern English speaker is the word ‘infinite’, which can be taken to refer to an actual infinite (used categorically) or a merely potential infinite (used syncategorematically). So from the true “infinitely many are finitely many” it does not follow that “finitely many are infinitely many.” In the first statement “infinite” is syncategorematic, rather like “every” or “some”, and so the sentence is taken to mean “one quantity, and another quantity, and so on indefinitely, is finite.” (Heytesbury would not have thought an actually infinite number of cases of finite quantities is possible, since he is a good Aristotelian. But however many cases there are, more could be produced. Perhaps there are only a finite number of cases at any given time, but more can always be produced later.) In the second statement “infinite” is categorical, and so it means that some finite number of quantities are actually infinite quantities.

The 5th way in which the distinction occurs involves the word ‘and’, and, as Heytesbury notes, this is easy to see. So from “Socrates can carry stone A, and Socrates can carry stone B” it does not follow that “Socrates can carry stones A and B,” i.e., at the same time. Here Heytesbury has no device to mark the distinction syntactically. So “Five and three are eight” has a compounded sense, and “five is eight” does not follow, but “Socrates and Plato are at Plataea” has a divided sense, and “Socrates is at Plataea” does follow.

The 6th way depends on the disjunction ‘or’. Consider a distributive “or”: “Plato or Socrates runs.” From this it follows that “Plato runs or Socrates runs.” Now consider the same pattern of argument with “or” in a compounded sense: “every proposition or its contradictory is true.” Clearly this does not follow. “You differ from a donkey, therefore you differ from a man or from a donkey” follows, and Heytesbury proposes the rule that if ‘or’ occurs after a term that produces distributed or confused supposition, then an argument from an inferior (narrower) term to its superior (wider) term with the same supposition is valid. In the example, ‘differ from’ contains an implicit negation, and so distributes the supposition of donkey. (“You differ from a donkey” = “You are not a donkey” = “you are not this donkey and you are not that donkey …”) Now a disjunctive term is superior to (wider than) any part of itself, so “donkey or man” is superior to “donkey”. So the inference in question does follow.

The 7th covers a number of cases involving the phrase ‘it will be the case that,’ or ‘it was the case that’ followed by a present tense. For instance, it does not follow that, “it will be the case that you are every man in this house, therefore you will be every man in this house.” The reason is that “you will be every man in this house” covers all future time (divided sense) and indicates that no one else will ever be in the house, while “it will be the case that …” (compounded sense) indicates only that there will be a time at which the statement following it is true. Again, “it will be case that Socrates is as big as Plato” (compounded sense) indicates that there will be a determinate moment at which the two will be of the same size, whereas “Socrates will be as big as Plato” (divided sense) indicates that Socrates will at some time be as big as Plato is now, though Plato may have grown even larger by then. The child might ask, “will I ever be as old as you are, Daddy?” The answer, hopefully, is that he will, but this can only be true in the divided sense, of course.

3.5 Heytesbury's treatment of continuous magnitudes

3.5.1 Beginning and Ceasing

The last three sections of the Regulae deal with issues involving the continuum, and nowadays might even be regarded as mathematical in content. In the 4th chapter Heytesbury deals with the words ‘begins’ and ‘ceases’ in a way that uncovers certain paradoxical properties of the temporal continuum. He works out the puzzles here by treating these words as ‘exponibles’. Their ‘exposition’ amount to a specification of the underlying logical structure of the sentence. (Despite the fact that the exposition of the term is sometimes referred to, the entire sentence in which the term occurs always turns out to have a misleading grammatical form.) So ‘Socrates begins to be white’ is exposited as ‘Socrates was not white immediately before now, and now is white’, or as ‘Socrates is not white now, and is white immediately after now’.

The first thing to note here is that the time continuum gives Heytesbury two possible readings of ‘Socrates begins to be white’. A single, disjunctive exposition is not offered. Why not? Perhaps it is because William remains true to Aristotelian logic, and does not recognize ‘hypotheticals’, i.e. sentences compounded of other sentences using sentential connectives, as well-formed statements. A well-formed sentence must be categorical, and so have a single subject and a single predicate, however complex these two terms may become through the use of exponible and syncategorematic terms in them. Or, it may be that even though he does recognize hypotheticals as sentences (as opposed to, say, to inference schemata and fragments of inference schemata), he still is convinced that the sentence at issue must be truly a categorical one, though perhaps in a way it is ambiguous (Heytesbury would not have been uncomfortable with making it unambiguous in a way no ordinary speaker would have anticipated, for this is akin to working with real definitions to specify what is meant, which would have been considered legitimate, even if most people would know only the nominal definition.) One might take his project, and that of later medieval logic in general, to be a matter of specifying how the introduction of complexity into the individual terms in a categorical statement affects the sense of the whole statement, so that one can deal logically with the complex terms that must be introduced to apply Aristotelian logic to more interesting stretches of discourse.

The second thing to note about the exposition of ‘Socrates begins to be white’ is that the phrase ‘immediately after’ or ‘immediately before’ occurs in both readings of it. This phrase is further exposited, so that ‘Socrates is white immediately after now’ comes to ‘for every moment after now, there is some moment before that moment and after now, at which Socrates is white’:

x[x is a moment after now → ∃y((y is before x and after now) & (Socrates is white at y))].

Heytesbury thinks that something can, in principle, be white immediately after now for as short a time after now as one wishes. The exposition of the ‘immediately’ phrases gives Heytesbury the opportunity to present sophismata hanging on the scope of the implicit quantifiers (which he himself views as a matter of divided and compounded senses). In particular, Heytesbury does not think

(i) Some instant will be immediately after the present instant.
y(y is a moment after now & ∀x(x is a moment after now → y is before x))

can ever be admitted, nor does he think it follows from the true proposition that

(ii) Immediately after the present instant some instant will be.
x(x is a moment after now → ∃y(y is moment after now & y is before x)),

for the first has a divided sense (the existential quantifier is the main quantifier in our notation), so that one or another definite instant has the property indicated, and the second a compounded sense (the existential quantifier falls under the scope of the universal quantifier in our notation), so that it talks about the collection of instants with merely confused supposition, in such a way that a logical descent to the statement that some definite individual instant has the property is not permitted. The property belongs to the whole set of instants after now. Put in terms of supposition, the syncategorematic phrase ‘immediately after the present moment’ renders the supposition of the term that follows it merely confused.

Heytesbury proposes a number of sophisms involving ‘begins’ and ‘ceases’ with mathematical content. Assume an object that Socrates now has fully in view, divided into proportional parts, so that the first part is the right half, the second the right half of the remaining portion, the third the right half of what remains after the first two parts are deducted, and so on ad infinitum. Now assume that the object begins to be occluded by a second object, approaching from the left. So now Socrates sees every proportional part of it, but immediately after now he will not see every proportional part. Heytesbury grants here that

(iii) now there begins to-be-occluded-from-Socrates's-sight (= O) some proportional-part-of-the-object (= P),
¬∃w(Ow) & ∀x(x is a moment after now → ∃wy((y is before x and after now) & (Ow at y)))

but denies that

(iv) some proportional part of the object now begins to be occluded from Socrates sight.
¬∃w(Ow) & ∃wx(x is a moment after now → ∃y((y is before x and after now) & (Ow at y)))

The reason is that ‘begins’ immobilizes the terms that follow it.

Again, suppose that Socrates is one foot long, and Plato two feet long, and that Plato and Socrates are both increasing in length at a uniform rate, so that at the final moment of an hour's growth they would both be three feet long, except that they cease to exist at the very instant in which this would occur. It is argued that Socrates will be of such a size as Plato will be, and is not now of such a size as Plato will be, and so it would seem that he begins to be of such a size as Plato will be. But he does not begin to be of such a size as Plato will be, nor will he ever begin to be of such a size as Plato will be. In this rather involved case Heytesbury points out that ‘Socrates will be of such a size as Plato will be’, though true in the case at hand, does not imply that there is any instant in which Socrates and Plato are of the same size. Whatever size Plato will come to be, Socrates will come to be of the same size, but not at the same instant, but rather a later instant. So there is no instant at which Plato and Socrates are of the same size, and immediately before which they were not (nor is there any instant at which they are not of the same size, and immediately after will be), and so Plato and Socrates do not begin to be the same size at any time.

3.5.2 Maxima and Minima of Capacities

In the fifth chapter of the Regulae, on maxima and minima, Heytesbury considers the limits of capacities. He assumes here that every active capacity is measured against the resistance (the passive capacity) which it can overcome. Thus an active capacity to lift weights will be measured by the weight (a resistance) that it enables one to lift. Now we will naturally assign as one's capacity to lift weights the greatest weight one can lift, the limit of one's capacity. In some cases, there will be no greatest passive capacity by which the active capacity can be measured, but then (as long as the active capacity has some limit) there will be a least passive capacity that the active capacity cannot overcome. Thus any given active capacity will divide the range of passive capacities on which it is measured into two sets, every element of one of which is greater than every element of the other, and the limit of the capacity will be that unique capacity which is at the boundary between the two sets, either the greatest in the first set, or the least in the second. The situation is parallel to that with beginning and ceasing, where it turned out that two different expositions were needed for “A begins to be F,” one assuming a first instant at which A is F, the other a last instant at which A is not. Heytesbury tries to lay down some rules as to which of these options to choose in any particular case, and he does the same with capacities, trying to specify when a capacity's limit is the greatest capacity it can act upon (or the least by which it can be acted upon), and when it is the least it cannot act upon (or the greatest by which it cannot be acted upon).

Heytesbury is also interested in determining necessary and sufficient conditions for the existence of a limit to a capacity in the first place. He constructs several cases in which no such limit in fact exists, and in the course of the exploration, evolves the following rule (stated here for active capacities). A limit will exist if and only if the active capacity is of a sort to be applicable to a continuous range of passive capacities of the same sort (say, weights), and: (1) Each capacity in the range on which the measured capacity is assumed to act either can or cannot be acted upon by the active capacity being measured (the man's strength can or cannot lift the weight), but not both, (2) There is some capacity in the range on which it is measured which it can act upon and some other which it cannot act upon, (3) if it can act upon a given passive capacity in the range, it can act on any capacity less than that, and if it cannot act upon a given passive capacity in the range, it cannot act on any greater than that. Heytesbury constructs cases violating each of these conditions to show their necessity. These rules are strongly reminiscent of Dedekind's Postulate. Richard Dedekind (Stetigkeit und Irrationale Zahlen, 1872) characterized a continuous linear order as one in the elements of the ordered set are related by a two-place relation, <, such that, if a, b and c are in K, then: (1) if ab, then a < b or b < a, (2) if a < b and b < c then a < c, (3) if a < b then ab, (4) if a < b, then (∃x)(xK and a < x < b) (i.e., K is dense under <), (5) K contains a denumerably infinite subclass R such that between any two elements of K there is an element of R (this guarantees linearity), and finally, (6) if K′ and K″ are non-empty sets in K, such that every element of K is in one or the other, and every element of K′ is < every element of K″, then there is one and only element xK (and so in K′ or K″, but not both) such if yK′ then y < x, if yK″ then x < y. The two sets K′ and K″ form a Dedekind cut. Dedekind's postulate is not satisfied in the Rationals, for the square root of 2, for instance, can be made a boundary between K′ and K″, and (1)-(5) and the assumptions of (6) will be satisfied, without any such xK as (6) describes existing. It is, however, satisfied in Real numbers, and so on a linear continuum such as Heytesbury envisioned. Dedekind used his postulate to construct Real Numbers from Dedekind cuts in Rationals, advancing the project of constructing all numbers from Natural Numbers governed by the Peano postulates. Heytesbury has nothing like that in mind, of course, but he does seem to state the postulate, and his commentators, at least, were aware that it is not satisfied in Rationals.

3.5.3 Kinematics and the Mean Speed Theorem

In the sixth chapter of the Regulae, ‘On the three categories’, i.e on place, quantity and quality, in which alone motion can occur, William works with kinematic problems. Here in particular, but in the previous chapters as well, he is quite clear that he is working secundum imaginationem, that is, he is considering cases which can be described and talked about, but which could never occur, as he thinks, in reality. It is better to take his work and that of the other Calculators to be mathematical than physical. Heytesbury divides local motions into uniform and difform motions, that is motions which involve the same rate of change in the same direction throughout, and those which do not. A rolling wheel moves with a difform motion because different parts of it move with different motions at any given time, while an accelerating object moves with a difform motion for a different reason—it is difform over time. He is concerned, for one thing, to describe the speed of an entire motion when it is not uniform from time to time, or over the entire moving body. By convention, he decides to assign as the velocity of a body the velocity of the fastest moving part, and then constructs a case in which, despite the fact that every part of an object moves continually faster over the period of an hour, the object itself continually slows. What he imagines here is that a wheel spins faster and faster, but as it spins the outer rim is continually worn away (rather like the wheel with which one sharpens a knife), and is worn away rapidly enough so that the fastest moving part of the wheel, which is the outer edge, of course, is always moving slower than the outer edge a moment before was. He next constructs an object which moves constantly at a uniform speed even though every point in the object slows down—a line with the endpoint missing is used, and the rate of slowing converges on zero as one approaches the end of the line, so that the speed of the line as a whole has to be assigned as the lowest speed a point on the line does not move at, there being no greatest speed at which a point on the line does move at.

After a few more paradoxical cases, even more imaginative, Heytesbury moves on to consider difform motions. The most interesting case, of course, is uniformly difform motion, and Heytesbury shows the mean—speed theorem, i.e., that a uniformly accelerated body will, over a given period of time, traverse a distance equal to the distance it would traverse if it were moved continuously in the same period at its mean velocity (one half the sum of the initial and final velocities) during that period. In the De probationibus the conclusion is drawn that a uniformly accelerated body will, in the second equal time interval, traverse three times the distance it does in the first, though this is only in the consideration of a particular case, and no general proof is offered. Domingo de Soto observed the applicability of the mean-speed theorem to free fall in 1555.

In addition to the Regulae, Heytesbury produced two other collections of Sophismata, evidently intended for lower level students, for many of them are considerably more elementary than those of the Regulae, though the ingenuity of these medieval debaters is often revealed in the way in which an apparently simple sophisma can become interesting with the introduction of the sorts of themes involving continua and kinematics that we have briefly reviewed. The second collection, the Sophismata Asinina endeavors to prove in every case that the respondent is a donkey. The last two sophismata in the first collection are of some interest physically. One argues that if anything is condensed, something else is necessarily rarified, otherwise the universe, which contains no vacuum, will shrink. The other argues similarly that if anything is heated, something else must be cooled. For a discussion of it, see Clagett 1941.

3.5.4 Heytesbury and the Physical Sciences

There has been some discussion of the meaning of the work of Heytesbury and the other Calculators for the development of the physical sciences. Here it must first be noted that Heytesbury did not think of himself as doing natural science. His interest is always logical in the broad sense, for he is always interested in what follows or does not follow from the case at hand, and, as we have noted, he works often secundum imaginationem, with an explicit disinterest whether the case can actually occur, as long as it is not self-contradictory. One might, as I have indicated, take his interests to be mathematical, but, again, he might not have done so. He shows occasional interest in working out calculations, but his mathematics is for the most part pure mathematics, not mathematics applied to physics. He is working at the borderline between mathematics and logic. Nonetheless, the work of Heytesbury and the Calculators may have had some influence on the development of science, and contributed to the Scientific Revolution, in several ways. For one thing, they applied quantitative measures to capacities and qualities in their work, and even if this was in no way observational, and involved no attempt to actually develop workable systems of measurement, they expanded the conceptual repertoire beyond the Aristotelian assumption that nothing could be measured other than space, time and motion. One has to conceive of measuring heat and force before one sets about doing it. So these logicians may have made a critical contribution to the intellectual milieu by assuring, through their exercises in logic, that university graduates became accustomed to the notion of measuring heat, force, and the like. For a second point, the treatment of difform motions by Heytesbury and his colleagues may have been of considerable importance. There is no direct evidence that Galileo knew of or used their results, but it is apparent from the presence of this work in the logic curriculum in Italy that these results were in the air. The notion that a movement might be difform, yet regular and calculable because it was uniformly difform, was simply part of the intellectual equipment of a university graduate. Often one must dream before one can act, and if the Calculators dreamed and did not act, that does not mean their dreams were irrelevant to the acts of others.

It should also be noted that Heytesbury is working within an Aristotelian tradition. His treatment of the continuum observes the Aristotelian (ultimately, Anaxagorean) specifications that a continuum is infinitely divisible potentially, though not actually, and many of the points he makes about this situation are rooted in a discussion in Aristotle. So Aristotle's Physics VI 5 and VIII 8 raise the issue whether there is a first instant at which a change has taken place, or a last minute at which it has not, one issue discussed in Heytesbury's treatment of ‘begins’ and ‘ceases’. There were medieval thinkers (for instance, Henry Harclay and Walter Chatton), who at the beginning of the fourteenth century, tried denying the infinite divisibility of continua, and the Calculators' paradoxes and their resolutions were at least partly in response to the criticisms of the Aristotelian view by these heterodox thinkers. (On this, see Murdoch 1982.)


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insolubles [= insolubilia] | Kilvington, Richard | Mertonian "calculators" | Paul of Venice | sophismata [= sophisms] | terms, properties of: medieval theories of