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Ikhwan al-Safa

First published Tue Apr 22, 2008

The Ikhwân al-Safâ’ or “Brethren of Purity”, as their name is commonly translated, are the authors of one of the most complete Medieval encyclopaedias of sciences, antecedent at least two centuries to the best known in the Latin world (by Alexander Neckham, Thomas de Cantimpré, Vincent de Beauvais, Bartholomaeus Anglicus, all dating back to the 13th century). The “encyclopaedia” is a collection of Epistles, the Arabic title of which is Rasâ’il Ikhwân al-Safâ’ wa Khullân al-Wafâ’ (Epistles of the Pure Brethren and the Sincere Friends). It consists of extremely heterogeneous materials, reworked to represent the whole educational training intended for an élite (see later). It is very well known, and a great deal of research into it has been done by Eastern and Western scholars, but the variety of topics addressed and the questions raised as to the identity and ideology of its authors remain unsolved. In an isolated form, and under a false attribution, some of these treatises came to the Latin Middle Ages through the Spanish version by Maslama al-Majrîtî, which is traditionally placed at the beginnings of the 11th century. This chronology has been recently discussed (Carusi 2000, 494-500).

1. Authorship

The authors introduce themselves as a kind of “brotherhood” (ma‘âshara) of sages. Their work is addressed to “beginners”, who may thereby increase their knowledge. The literary scholar Abû Hayyân al-Tawhîdî (922-32/1023), basing his work on the ideas of his master Abû Sulaymân al-Mantiqî (c. 912/c. 985), and the mu‘tazili theologian ‘Abd al-Jabbâr al-Hamadânî (c. 936/1025) have identified the names of these authors. They are understood to be the qâdî Abu ’l-Hasan ‘Alî b. Hârûn al-Zanjânî and his three friends, Abû Sulaymân Muhammad b. Ma‘shar al-Bustî, called al-Maqdisî, Abû Ahmad al-Nahrajûrî and al-‘Awfî. All of these men came from Basra and were linked to the Chancellery secretary Zayd b. Rifâ‘a (cf. Stern, 1946; Stern, 1964).

2. Naming and Dating

With regard to the common denomination of “Ikhwân al-Safâ’”, the old hypothesis by I. Goldziher deserves mention: according to which the name could have been borrowed from the famous collection of fables of indo-persian origin Kalîla wa Dimna to indicate a group of loyal friends. Stern (1964, 421), however, considers the name as a way of hinting at Ismâ‘îliyya. The most convincing hypothesis seems to be that which links the name to the content and goals of the encyclopaedia – the salvation of soul through attainment of knowledge and purification of heart (Diwald, 1975, 16-22).

As to the date, in the 19th century F. Dieterici proposed 961 to 986, basing his estimate on the work of the seventeenth century lexicographer Hâjjî Khalîfa and on the presence in the treatises of verses by the famous poet al-Mutanabbî (d. 965). Massignon (1913, 324) used a verse by the poet Ibn al-Rûmî (d. 896) to establish these years as the earliest possible date, and took the latest possible date to be that indicated by the definition of sine given by the Ikhwân (he referred to the Bombay edition, vol. I, p. 46). The “expected event” frequently mentioned in the encyclopaedia would then be the Fatimid conquest of Egypt, which can be traced back to those years. On the basis of astronomical data, Casanova (1915) moved the dates about a century forward, assigning the work to the years 1047-51. Marquet reconfirmed Dieterici's earlier hypothesis, placing the compilation of the work between 961 and 980 (al-Tawhîdî's testimony is dated 981), but he also brought the date forward to 909. Consequently, the “expected event” might have been the proclamation of the Fatimid caliph ‘Ubaydallâh al-Mahdî in Ifriqiyya, which happened in that year.

The traces of classical thought in the encyclopaedia, as well as their literary form, give an indication that the work was assembled in the course of the century and a half from 840 to about 980. Such a collective enterprise can be considered as the result of a “stratified” compilation. The supposed reworking of the whole by members of the Brotherhood might also have shifted some Epistles from their original to their present place. Even the headings of the four sections of the encyclopaedia are misleading. The way in which the treatises follow one another is often inconsistent. The authors must have planned a special use of the enormous amount of foreign philosophical and scientific knowledge that is explained in the treatises and to develop it in relation to the doctrinal conflicts and political changes that were occurring in their own times. In this sense the presentation of the encyclopaedia as a “popular” work (recently, Rudolph, 2004, 39) should be rejected.

3. Ideological commitment

Because their aim is clearly salvation, it has often been supposed that the Rasâ’il were inspired by the Shî‘ites, or perhaps even the Ismâ‘îlis, both of whom claim the ideological commitment of the encyclopaedia. In 1150, the Sunni orthodoxy in the person of the caliph al-Mustanjid judged the work heretical and sent the existing versions to be burnt. Yet in spite of this, the encyclopaedia survived and was translated into Persian and Turkish (Corbin, 1964, 193-194).

Attempts to define the Ikhwân's ideological commitment have been made, but there has been no consensus on the matter. The Ikhwân's view of ‘Alî as the Prophet's legitimate legate (walî) persuaded some scholars to link them to the Shî‘a, though scattered references in negative terms to the “hidden” imâm appear contrary to twelver Shî‘ism. Other elements have been alleged as proofs of the Ikhwân's Isma‘ili inspiration, such as the hierarchical structure of universe, references to septenary cycles, distinction between elect and masses, the use of Isma‘ili symbols (e.g., the bee as symbol of the imâm, etc.). Corbin (1964, 190; 1950) openly and radically affirmed that the Ikhwân belonged to Ismâ‘îlism. He was followed by Marquet (1968, 1071) who stressed their attacks on Mu‘tazili and Ash‘arite ideas. Stern (1964, 416-417) and Diwald (1975, 26ff.) remarked that the Epistles exercised their influence on the Ismâ‘îlis only from the twelfth century. The concepts and historical ideas that are at least close to those of the Shî‘a – such as deprecation of the slaughter of Karbalâ’, the allegorical interpretation of the Qur’ân and prophecy, or the aversion to political governments and the hope that they will fall when the present septenary cycle comes to an end – show according to Stern (1964, 421) and later Bausani (1978, 14-16) that the authors were representative of an Isma‘ili tendency, but not of the official da‘wa (propaganda). Marquet 1973, on the other hand, recognizes in the encyclopaedia the official Isma‘ili organization at the time. He remarks that the propaganda appeals here to philosophers, mystics, and rulers. However, non-Isma‘ili ideas can also be found in the work, for example the invitation to celibacy proper of Sufism and the mention of feasts linked to Sabean rituals in addition to those established by Muslim law. The authors have also been placed in an earlier age, under the Qarmat influence (Marquet 1977; Qarmats were the opponents of the Fatimid caliph ‘Ubaydallâh al-Mahdî), or confined to a Mu‘tazilite approach. In general, the evidence supporting such theories derives mostly from doctrines or parts of doctrines hinted at in the encyclopaedia. The enormous variety of its contents and, often, their inconsistency seem to have hindered scholars from reaching unanimous conclusions on the authors' religious (or rather ideological) commitment and, consequently, on their goals.

4. The extant corpus

The encyclopaedia consists of 52 treatises divided into four sections on the introductory (al-riyâdiyya), natural, psycho-rational and metaphysical-theological sciences.

Two additional Epistles, entitled “Comprehensive Epistle” (al-Risâla al-Jâmi‘a) and “Supercomprehensive Epistle” (Risâla Jâmi‘a al-Jâmi‘a) are thought to complete the corpus and explain its esoteric (hidden) meanings. Two versions of the Jâmi‘a are extant. One is ascribed to al-Majrîtî, the Spanish scientist and astronomer who is alleged to have transmitted the Epistles to Spain. The other is ascribed to Ahmad ibn ‘Abd Allâh ibn Muhammad ibn Ismâ‘îl ibn Ja‘far al-Sâdiq, the second of the three “veiled” (mastûr) imâms who were intermediate between Muhammad ibn Ismâ‘îl and ‘Ubaydallâh, the founder of the Fatimid dynasty. The Risâla Jâmi‘a al-Jâmi‘a is also (Tamir s.d., 18) ascribed to Ahmad, which strengthens the link of the corpus with the Isma‘ili tradition. Epistle 52 On magic is the last in the corpus, missing in some editions and considered by some scholars (Bausani, 1978, 12) as spurious, and of little value, so the Risâla al-Jâmi‘a would be the true fifty-second one.

Each Epistle starts by stating its particular goal. All of them contain a core of technical teachings and a conclusion regarding the haqîqa, the inner meaning of the contents. The texts contain frequent invocations to the learning “brethren” – that is, the elect who are studying the sciences – that enhance their didactical and exhortative style; these invocations mean that the students will be awakened “from the sleep of matter and the negligence of ignorance” if they apply themselves assiduously to study “with the assistance (ta’yyid) of a spirit coming by God”.

The Epistles vary in length and their style is plain. There are, however, numerous ambiguities, due to language and vocabulary, often of Persian origin, and to mistakes in the transmission of the text. Bausani (1978, 11) thinks the authors were of Persian origin. In general, however, the doctrines are fully and clearly exposed, with repetitions where necessary to the didactic function of the treatises.

Diwald (1975, 12-15) has even wondered whether there were in fact several authors of the encyclopedia because of the use at times of the first person singular. The basic question, of course, is whether the authors unify the doctrines of more numerous groups, as suggested by the different contexts and even their inconsistencies.

The Ikhwanian encyclopaedia is typical of the changes in Greek science and philosophy during the tenth century as a result of the increasing Shî‘a influence. In the ninth century and at the beginnings of the tenth century, the prominent philosopher Abû Yûsuf Ya‘qûb b. Ishâq al-Kindî (d. ca. 870) had already developed single philosophical doctrines (e.g. in cosmology or psychology). Though elaborating them in an original way, he had not tried to combine such doctrines with the basics of Muslim faith. Theological considerations remain parallel with philosophical issues. The physician Muhammad ibn Zakariyyâ’ al-Râzî (d. ca. 925), mainly interested to natural philosophy, had even questioned the legitimacy of prophecy.

At the time of the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ and of al-Fârâbî (d. 950), ancient knowledge was considered as an organic whole – not only a sum of theoretical elaborations, but as a real encyclopaedia of sciences. It should provide at every level, from the most elementary to the most complex, the necessary premises for the acquisition of ultimate knowledge – the knowledge of God. Then, authentically Muslim thought – religious in the strict sense – begins with the substitution of the schemes of Greek philosophy for those of the Sacred Text. This is what I. Netton (1989) defined as “the progressive estrangement from the Qur’anic Creator Paradigm”. Ancient knowledge is the basis on which the patrimony of faith is built: sciences are significant not merely in themselves so much as a partial reflection of the single and unique divine Being.

The sense of truly “Muslim” science is largely a product of the ideological commitment of the authors. The Ikhwân al-Safâ’ see the ultimate goal of each religious experience as separating the soul from the ties of matter and purifying it to achieve happiness in the hereafter. As purification can be reached by following prophetic revelation with the help of reason, the ancient sciences – the study of which was considered by orthodox theologians to be vehicle of heresy and even atheism – are fully legitimized. For the authors of the encyclopaedia, the sciences explain the deep reality of universe and so allow rational understanding of the contents of Revelation and of religious Law. From the standpoint of Muslim religion, the encyclopaedia represents a possible solution to the problem of reconciling reason and faith, philosophy and religion.

The blending of scientific and religious issues is evident from the beginning. Sciences should be the main topic in the first and the second sections and, partially, in the third, and theology in the rest of the corpus. In spite of the fact that ancient texts are always quoted with great accuracy from a philological point of view, the Ikhwân deeply rework the Greek sources in line with their goals that are completely different from those of the ancients. Thus religion should not be underestimated in order to attain the best comprehension of its various contents and real aims.

5. The classical heritage

Let us approach the first feature of the encyclopaedia, that is, its reworking the of foreign “scientific” contents. Various cultural elements come together in the Epistles: Babylonian, Indian and Iranian astrology, Indian and Persian narrative, biblical quotations and cabbalistic influences, references to the New Testament and Christian gnosis (A good survey of these contents can be found in Netton, 1991, 53ff., 89ff.). Most attention, however, seems to be paid to the Greeks, from the so-called “pre-socratics” to Plato, Aristotle, Plotinus and the Stoics. The encyclopaedia can thus be considered a compendium of foreign sciences, deserving attention even by those who are only interested to ascertain the extent of what the Arabs knew of ancient doctrines at that time.

Comparisons between the Ikhwân's quotations and the extant Arabic versions of classical works often show that they might have used the same translations at our disposal now. When such comparisons are not possible, the ancient excerpta usually correspond to the extant original texts. We should conclude, then, that in quoting, reporting –and, perhaps, translating – ancient sources the Ikhwân display the same philological and philosophical expertise associated with the scholars to whom we owe the flourishing of the translation movement in Baghdâd. In some cases, they have even preserved the only Arabic fragments of Greek authors known to us, as exemplified by the well-known case of the story of Giges from Plato's Republic in Epistle 52. (The story of Giges is analyzed in Baffioni 2001, 168-170, 175-178). Platonic references in the encyclopaedia are also scarce. The majority of them are found in the fourth section and concern the trial and death of Socrates. There is also a hint at the doctrine of reminiscence, that is seldom mentioned in Muslim sources; cf. for the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ Epistle 42, III, 424, 15). The Ikhwân are also informed about the Platonic view on pleasures and about Plato's conception of the soul as consisting of three distinct parts: the rational soul, which resides in the head; the irascible soul, which resides in the heart and is the seat of courage; and the appetitive soul, the seat of desire, which resides in the abdomen (III, 68, 4-6). The Platonic references are religiously rather than philosophically oriented. That can perhaps be explained by the influence of the Hellenistic curricula scientiarum (courses of study) designed for philosophers. These began by a reflection on the Stoic bios theoretikòs (the philosophical attitude towards life), continued with Aristotelian works representing the “scientific” side of knowledge, and ended with Platonic writings, representing the “theological” knowledge (D’Ancona Costa 1996, 30-31). The religious approach to ancient heritage leads the Ikhwân to consider philosophy as an “imitation of God according to human capacity”. This definition immediately clarifies Hellenism as the authors' first theoretical and historical reference. Their source is here Plato or, rather, his Hellenistic reading (Kraus 1986, 99, note 4).

Although the Ikhwân appear mostly Aristotelian (for instance, for their presentation of the terrestrial world or the theory of knowledge rooted in sensation), the wealth of the available sources led the “Pure Brethren” to support their doctrines by a variety of theoretical models, often melted together.

The first topic addressed in the first section are the so-called “quadrivium” (a Latin term meaning “the four ways”) sciences (arithmetic, geometry, astronomy and music): Epistle 1 deals with arithmetic, Epistle 2 with geometry, Epistle 3 with astronomy and Epistle 5 with music. Arithmetic, geometry and music are later approached together in Epistle 6 On proportions. Between these two treatises another one is added, Epistle 4 On geography: ‘ilm al-hay’a (literally “cosmography”) was evidently considered part of astronomy.

References for the various sciences are, generally identifiable: Euclid, Nicomachus and sometimes even Archimedes for mathematical tenets (Epistles 1, 2 and 6); Ptolemy supports astronomy and geography (Epistles 3 and 4); the Pythagoreans and again Nicomachus are the sources for musical theory (Epistles 5 and 6). The Greeks already saw arithmetic and geometry as the necessary, though not unique, means of attaining philosophical knowledge.

Much of this section is devoted to logic, the “instrument” of sciences according to Aristotle and a view widely shared by Muslims (see Epistles 10-14). These treatises take the place of grammar, logic and rhetoric, that in Middle Ages constituted the “trivium” (in Latin: “the three ways”) sciences and were the basis of a “liberal arts” education. There is no place for poetry or for rhetorical devices in the encyclopaedia. Dialectics increases damaging opposition among the learned. Although the Ikhwân appear interested in spoken language and even in phonetics, they never approach grammar as a science. Rather, they examine the technique of the “universal” form of language – logic. In the well-known 10th century debate on the superiority of grammar or of logic, they might have sided with the Christian logician Abû Bishr Mattâ ibn Yûnus more than with the grammarian Abû Sa‘îd al-Sirafî. “Trivium” was considered preparatory for the “quadrivium”, which was in turn considered preparatory for the study of philosophy and theology. The “trivium” and “quadrivium” sciences are described in the encyclopaedia in an original way as distinct from that of other Muslim writers as well as the Latin west (de Callataÿ 2005, 61-62). Hellenistic influence is remarkable even when the Ikhwân rely on Aristotelian logic. The logical treatises include paraphrases of Porphiry's Isagoges, which the later Greeks considered to be the first book of Organon (Rhetoric and Poetics were taken to be its last books). It is followed by Aristotle's Categories, De interpretatione, Prior and Posterior Analytics.

This choice of texts shows that the Ikhwân conform to the “old” tradition that restricted research to the first Books of the Organon, not to that of their great contemporary al-Fârâbî, who expanded it to the whole logical corpus. This might be due to the religious aims of the encyclopaedia. Religious matters can only be treated by relying on the sound (sahîh) method for knowledge, while procedures aiming at mere persuasion or linked to the attainment of that which is useful (and not true) are not to be employed. Logic is no longer a simple instrument of science as it was for Aristotle, but a true science, perhaps the most important one. The Brethren call it “the scale of sciences” through which the wise men are able to discern “true from false in speeches, right from wrong in opinions, truth from vanity in beliefs and good from evil in acts” (cf., e.g., Epistle 7, I, 268, 14-16).

Epistle 7 On the theoretical arts carefully sketches the Ikhwân's epistemological vision. A sort of “table” of human sciences is given (I, 266, 14-274, 21). There are three kinds of sciences in hierarchical progression: the “propaedeutical” (or preparatory, al-riyâdiyya again), those imposed by religious Law (al-shar‘iyya al-wad‘iyya) and the “philosophical sciences allowing the full comprehension of truth” (al-falsafiyya al-haqîqiyya, higher than the religious sciences). The sciences listed first in the table are labelled “propaedeutical” just as the “trivium” and “quadrivium” sciences of the encyclopaedia, but here the term is used in a totally different sense. It concerns matters of practical utility, such as reading and writing, grammar and poetry (someway close to the “trivium” sciences), but also magic, mechanics, arts, trades, history and so on. Although the Ikhwân state that the sciences of the third group – the “philosophical” in the higher sense of the word – are the object of their Epistles, they do not coincide exactly with the contents of the encyclopaedia, at least, with those of the corpus now available. So, the table can be considered as evidence of the fact that the whole encyclopaedia has been produced during a very long period of time. On the one hand, it might have been retained as a first draft of the future enterprise; on the other, it shows the further elaborations of the corpus over the centuries.

Epistles 7 and 8 explicitly recall the Aristotelian division of the theoretical and practical sciences. Epistle 7 is extensively based on Aristotle (when the Ikhwân introduce the nine “philosophical questions”, they are thinking of the Aristotelian categories, cf. I, 262, 14-266, 7; Epistle 29, III, 35, 6-7; Epistle 40, III, 345, 6-346, 6; Epistle 42, III, 513, 14-16 and 514, 13-516, 5). However, the ultimate goal of the scientific investigation is identified with the path towards hereafter and even connected to asceticism where scientists and prophets follow the same way: Aristotelian science is linked to the Isma‘ili teaching (ta‘lîm, cf. I, 274, 20-275, 4). The “programmatic” aim of Epistle 7 leads us to consider it as the ideal introduction to the whole corpus. On the other hand, the authors' Isma‘ili commitment is proven by the fact that in the complementary treatise On the practical arts the ancient “banausic” (utilitarian) activities are dealt with which were held in high esteem in Ismâ‘îlism (cf. Lewis, 1943; Marquet, 1961; Daftary, 2007, 115).

Although the content of the first section is the most “uniform”, inconsistencies are found already in it. This is especially clear in Epistle 9, which portrays the “ideal wise man” from the standpoint of the encyclopaedia, where moral edification is never separated from theoretical teaching. The approach is more than an echo of the well known Aristotelian division of philosophy: it stems from the view of the Ikhwân that he who searches for true wisdom must be endowed with a true mind as well as a pure heart. Epistle 9 breaks the series of the scientific treatises. Various moral behaviours are considered, with the support of a long series of anecdotes about prophets and wise men. There is also textual evidence that the Ikhwân may in practice have found asceticism (Sufism?) as another way of attaining or “enhancing” purification (cf. Epistles 6, 16 and 24).

The composed and eclectic character of the whole is even more evident in the three other sections. In the second section, the Epistles 15-22 follow the Hellenistic arrangement of Aristotle's works on physics. Epistle 15 echoes the themes addressed in the Physics. In Epistle 16, entitled, “On the heaven and the world”, the Ikhwân are shown to be in line with the Muslim tradition which transformed the ancient De caelo into a new book De caelo et mundo. Epistle 17 deals with De generatione and corruptione. Epistle 18 about meteorological phenomena and Epistle 19 about minerals recall the contents of Meteorology I-III and IV respectively. Meteor. IV, sometimes considered spurious and “the first chemical work in ancient world” according to scholars, was the basis of the theories of “chemical” or “alchemical” transformations in Islamic sciences and of mineralogy. The Ikhwanian treatise deals with mineralogy, geology and gemmology and in the correspondence established between the celestial and sub-lunar worlds, between the stars and minerals, it expresses one of the main tenets of alchemy. Further Aristotelian echoes are found in Epistle 24 On sense and sensation, to which Epistle 35 On intellect and intelligible corresponds in the third section. After topics concerning nature, such as the human body in Epistle 23, conception in Epistle 25, and man as microcosm in Epistle 26, the most important topic for the Ikhwân, the human spiritual dimension is addressed. It is discussed in terms of the relation between soul and body in Epistles 27 e 28, life and death in Epistle 29, and pleasures in Epistle 30. The Aristotelian theory of the immovable mover, which is introduced in Epistle 37 On love, to explain the movement imparted to stars by the heavenly Universal Soul accomplishes its religious meaning. It serves to confirm the love human beings feel for permanence and their hatred for death: God is the most beloved as the everlasting cause of all beings.

On the other hand, natural treatises reflect the availability of the rich range of mineralogical, botanical and agricultural works, but none of the works by Aristotle on minerals or plants were known to the Arabs. The corpus aristotelicum on animals reached them (apart from the De partibus and the De generatione animalium) in an abridged form under the title of kitâb al-hayawân, but Epistle 22 On animals is quite far in its content and goals from the Aristotelian corpus. In fact, it places the whole matter within the well-known metaphysical dispute on the superiority of man on animals.

The authors' view of embryology (Epistle 25) is also a collection from different sources. On the one hand, the Ikhwân were not physicians, though they display extensive knowledge of anatomy and share the Aristotelian thesis of the origin of the embryo from the sperm and menstrual blood, while they did not accept the ancient Hippocratic theory as developed by Galen, of a female sperm coexisting with that of the male in the formation of the human being. On the other hand, they emphasize an astronomical/astrological approach to embryology that was not in Greek sources. It is considered to be a new idea introduced by Islamic scientists, from whom it passed into the Latin world. Greek sources for Epistle 37 on love also vary.

The real deviation from Aristotelianism is Epistle 20 On nature. In that it shows how nature as taught by Aristotle was received and theorized by the authors, this treatise could serve as the perfect introduction to the section on natural sciences. However, its main part regards angelology. It also introduces a Neoplatonically inspired conception of Nature, suggestive of Isma‘ili philosophical positions, as Abû Ya‘qûb al-Sijistânî's representation of Nature as “agent power” and “principle of movement”.

Though the Ikhwân never mention Plotinus explicitly, the third section opens with two treatises that deal with rational beings as understood by the Pythagoreans (Epistle 32) and the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ (Epistle 33). These treatises demonstrate beyond doubt that these authors considered themselves true Muslim Pythagoreans. Pythagoras is said to be “a monotheist from Harrân”. The Pythagorean idea of the one as the principle of numbers, and not as a number itself explains that God is the origin of beings, and not a being like others. If God is like the one, the Active Intellect is compared to number 2, the Universal Soul to number 3 and Nature (or Matter) to number 4 (cf. e.g. Epistle 40, III, 347, 5). The encyclopaedia resumes Pythagorean mathematical and musical theories and adopts a numerological approach on the basis of the Pythagorean tenet that “existing beings correspond to the nature of number”. The whole reality is considered under a numerological perspective. Every aspect of nature – and even of religion – follows a numeric pattern. This should demonstrate that the cosmos – also introduced as a “macranthropos” (man as the pattern of the external world as a whole) in Epistle 34 – is organized according to recurrent and well-determined quantitative models, being at the same time completely dependent on God, the principle of everything just as one is the root of each number.

Among the other philosophical schools and doctrines quoted in the encyclopaedia an important role is played by hermetism (the religion of the philosophical elite in Ancient Egypt, founded by Hermes Trismegistus), as in Epistle 3 On astronomy and, more broadly, in Epistle 52 (Marquet 1973, 1988). Ancient theories on the movements of the stars will finally evolve in Epistle 36 On cycles and revolutions into that which, following Cumont, G. de Callataÿ (1996, 36-37) has defined as a “fatalisme astral”.

6. The religious component

Just like philosophy, as a way towards salvation, is an imitation of God and implies that the disciple is provided not only of an acute mind, but also of a pure heart (through which God will be recognized as the sole and the supreme teacher in knowledge and deeds, as the Holy Book demonstrates, cf., e.g., Qur., II, 31: ‘And He taught Adam the names', mentioned in Epistle 28, III, 18, 14-16 and in Epistle 31, III, 112, 19 and 141, 13-14; cf. also Epistle 23, II, 381, 17), the Ikhwân consider prophetic message (both esoteric and exoteric, hidden and clear) as the second necessary means for human salvation and happiness. This brings us back to the second aspect of the encyclopaedia, its religious commitment.

We already saw that the Ikhwân rework the classical heritage in religious terms. They also deal with doctrinal questions linked to religion. Epistle 42 On opinions and religions, the other “programmatic” treatise of the encyclopaedia that opens the fourth section, is a discussion of the basic ideas of the Brotherhood such as the multifaceted epistemological problems, the origin of the world, morals and theodicy and the imamate as well as the various doctrines critically considered by the Ikhwân, such as eternalism and dualism. It also develops the apologetic side of Ikhwanian thought. From Epistle 43 onwards, the Ikhwân build their own system from a religious point of view, often in the fragmentary style typical of Muslim esoteric writings. Epistle 43 considers the way towards God through purification; then the beliefs of the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ and of the so-called “Divines”, the heirs of a prophetic tradition whose origin is ascribed to the ancient wise men (Epistle 44). Epistle 45 expounds the organization of the Brotherhood based on mutual help. Epistle 46 considers the faith, not only of Islam, but also of the former monotheistic religions and of the ancient wise men. Epistle 47 considers prophecy and the imamate. Epistle 48 discusses propaganda. Epistle 49 deals with the so-called “spiritual beings”, that is the angels charged with the motion of the spheres. And Epistle 50 discusses the kinds of political governments. Epistle 51 duly gathers up the threads of the whole, followed by Epistle 52 on magic.

Epistle 40 On causes and effects addresses the crucial problem of the origin of the world. The Ikhwân subvert to religious purposes Aristotle's teleological approach that “nature does not make anything in vain.” Understanding creation, one of the basic Muslim tenets, is recognized as the highest attainment of knowledge. So, the ancients are defended from the charge of eternalism (cf. III, 356, 11-18) and, for the sake of the masses, creation is even explained through the comparison of God with a confectioner. However the Ikhwân – like the Ismâ‘îlis – adopt Neoplatonic views as the best explication of the origin of the world by God. The world, then, emanates from God through the hypostases of Intellect and Soul. Emanationism is the philosophical expression of creation; it also explains the encyclopaedic structure of the treatises. The various levels of reality down to the three kingdoms of the generated beings (animal, vegetable and mineral) originate continuously through intermediaries from the One. For this reason, by acquiring all the sciences from the lowest to the highest it is possible to attain the common source of everything, the ‘science of God’ in the double sense of pertaining to God and concerning God – the ancient metaphysics (metà ta physikà) no longer indicates what comes “after” physics but what is “beyond” it. Thus, rather than a mere foreign source, Neoplatonism (merged with Neopythagorism) can be considered as the Ikhwân's proper philosophy. Philosophy as imitation of God continues as the guiding principle of the Ikhwân's system, together with equal emphasis on divine revelation.

The corpus addresses other main religious issues in Muslim faith: the unity and uniqueness, and the attributes of God, angels, human destiny, good and evil, resurrection. Divine will and power are also considered when trying to explain evil in the world, though, of course, Muslim faith does not allow identifying God as the cause of evil (Epistle 19). Ultimately, the Ikhwân attribute it to human responsibility, or, better, to the responsibility of creatures in general and they do so in quite a Mu‘tazilite perspective. In the hierarchical disposition of universe there are “intermediate” beings to which everything that happens in the world may be related. God, a quite remote “first beloved” is beyond all this, like the kings, whose orders are behind everything built during their reigns. Epistle 39 On the kinds of movement considers the movement of the whole cosmos, from that of the stars down to those (natural and voluntary) of human beings. Its aim is to demonstrate the existence of a God who created the world and who will bring it to an end. In Epistle 27 souls (that are self-subsistent according to the ancient doctrine) unite themselves to human bodies in order to ensure human salvation; hence wise men and prophets are said to be the “physicians of the souls” (III, 13, 7 ff.). The main religious topic is, however, resurrection, thoroughly examined in Epistle 38 where it is also considered as the supreme science (III, 288, 3-5). The theme was already addressed in Epistle 29 (wisdom is recognizable in death in that it allows the vision of God, hence the highest sorrow is damnation). On the same line, Epistle 30 states that the real “Hell” is earth, “Paradise” is heaven. However, the Ikhwân deem as “providential” the ignorance of the beauties of the afterlife, which might urge people to desire death before the natural end of life. In doing so, they are far from the Pythagorean doctrine that considered the soul as a fallen divinity imprisoned within the body as in a “tomb”.

In conclusion, whereas in Ihsâ’ al-‘ulûm (“The Enumeration of the Sciences”), al-Fârâbî deals with Muslim sciences such as theology (kalâm) and law (fiqh), the Ikhwân mainly stress religion. In the Rasâ’il, the usual distinction between philosophy/sciences (the rational or ‘aqliyya knowledge) and theology (the received or naqliyya knowledge), or between reason and faith is not valid as both are combined.

On the formal side, the religious commitment appears in the frequent Qur’anic quotations in support of ancient doctrines, sometimes through interpretations that are not in line with the theological ones. Above all, the Ikhwân appropriate the Muslim ideal of attaining happiness in this world and the hereafter and indicate in the treatises how to reach it. In physical terms it is by caring for the body, which when healthy and balanced is the condition of the purification of the soul. In metaphysical terms, the purified soul is said to be capable of knowledge, so of being saved – even though, like the Ismâ‘îlis, the Ikhwân deny salvation as attainable through solely philosophy.

Prophethood is an undeniable part of the theoretical experience featured by the Ikhwân. Their political vision is linked to this and implies that attainment of happiness is considered in political terms, too, where it results in examination of what has to be accomplished to be worthy of entering the entourage of the imâm. In Epistle 40 the science of the esoteric interpretation of the Qur’ân (explaining its hidden meaning) is emphasized as the highest divine gift (in doing this the Ikhwân give an interpretation of Qur., III, 7 which precedes that, much more well-known, given by Averroes two centuries later, cf. III, 344, 10-345, 5).

The second pivot of the Ikhwân's philosophy in addition to creation is their discussion of the imamate. It has its first origin in Epistle 31 On the diversity of languages. Here the Ikhwân show that religious creeds change as a result of language transformations. More particularly, differences and contrasts within the umma due to changes in the Arabic language are linked to the debate regarding the identity of the Messenger's deputy, which is the main cause of schism in Islam “until their time”, the Ikhwân say (cf. Epistle 31, III, 153, 8-10 and 165, 8-12). While everybody agrees on the tasks of the imâm, there is a disagreement as to his identity. This is because imamate is of two kinds: prophetic and regal. Usually the tasks of the ruler are neatly distinguished from those of the prophet, because governance is a mundane business and prophecy is related to the life to come (III, 497, 5-6). On occasion these qualities are combined in a single person, who is then the delegated prophet and also the ruler (III, 495, 18-19). While the Prophet Muhammad was both prophet and ruler of the Muslim umma, so ensuring its best defence, his possible successors did not always match him in nobility. Subsequently, prophecy and governance are sometimes found in two different persons, one of whom is the prophet delegated to that community and the other the person who has been given power over them. They support one another (III, 495, 19-21). The real problem seems, then, to be the dignity of the person appointed as the caliph, which alone is the condition of a legitimate prophetical succession. The Ikhwân's specific idea on the identity of such a person is not clear. In addition, there is apparently no distinction between the prophet, the imâm or the ruler with regard to the required qualities, as Epistle 47 On the essence of divine Law demonstrates. The sole “doctrinal” solution offered in the encyclopaedia seems that a ruler with ascetic tendencies can legitimately take the place of the imâm.

The political ideas of the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ have not been extensively analyzed by scholars, except when they have been considered as a political movement. (The Ikhwân's interest in political issues is mainly emphasized by Eastern scholars who in general incline towards the hypothesis of their being [“filo]-Isma‘ili”. Cf. Hijab, 1982; Tamir, 1983, 89-108). In fact, the “Pure Brethren” are contrasted with the “philosophers”, who were understood to have taken an alienist position with regard to the political expectations of the society in which they lived, as a consequence of their evaluation of Plato's Republic (cf. e.g. Kraemer, 1987 and more recently Stroumsa, 2003). However, the Ikhwân do not fail to approach policy from a theoretical standpoint and the philosophical doctrines developed in their Epistles can be understood to be a functional element of their political vision. In the encyclopaedia, a madîna al-fâdila (perfect city) is featured – less known but no less worthy than that proposed by al-Fârâbî. This time the Ikhwân do not hide themselves behind the ancient Platonic heritage: they openly adapt a Greek idea to a Muslim situation.

Were the Ikhwân Ismâ‘îlis? This of course opens the way to the second side of the argument – the Isma‘ili commitment of the Ikhwân.

The saying “dîn and mulk are twins” in reference to the prophet and the king empowered to perform the functions of the imâm in the sense preached by the Ikhwân perfectly fits the Fatimid rulers. If this hypothesis is tenable, the debated “traditions” mentioned in Epistle 31 with reference to the misunderstandings due to the diversity of languages might be understood as the Fatimid versions of the divine Law. If the Ikhwanian “Lawgiver” is identified with the historical incarnation of the Isma‘ili faith, that is, with the Fatimid caliph, and if the “perfect city” is the one ruled by these caliphs, then the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ are his du‘â’. Epistle 48, with the mention of the term da‘wa in the title, might further support the hypothesis of a project of concrete militancy by the Ikhwân.

The Ikhwân appear as the learned people who have the task of promoting propaganda (da‘wa). Sometimes they even seem to appropriate the qualities of the king-imâm; in Epistle 47 they introduce themselves as the best guides for the defence of Islam in terms of al-hukamâ’ wa al-falâsifa wa al-fudalâ’ (“wise men, philosophers and excellent people”) and of the anbiyâ’, khulafâ’ al-anbiyâ’ wa al-a’imma al-mahdiyûn (“prophets, successors of the prophets and well-guided imams”, IV, 126, 5-17). That the Ikhwân aim to be the guides of the elect community is further confirmed by a passage in Epistle 9. The ascetics are described as those “who know the shortcomings [of the world], who crave for the hereafter and are convinced of it, firmly rooted in its science, that is the sincere Friends of God, [His] faithful servants, the cream of all [His] creatures, whom the Creator – may [He] be exalted – called ‘persons of understanding, persons of view, persons of mind’” (I, 357, 5-9). These qualities correspond to those of the Ikhwân engaged, as the leaders of their community, in their philosophy of salvation; but they also fit the prophets and the imâms perfectly. From this point of view the reading of the Holy Book our authors have in mind – rather than a Shi‘i or Isma‘ili perspective – might be the ta’wîl performed in their own encyclopaedia, where God's Word is continually quoted and commented. And they refer to the spiritual city as “our spiritual city”, which coincides with Paradise.

In Epistle 47 the legacy of the Prophet is said to be inherited by “the most intelligent” (al-‘uqalâ’ al-akhyâr) which emphasizes the epistemological function of the Shi‘ite caliph. In this case a temporal ruler, the “ruler imâm”, is no longer necessary because the rational Law is the real guide, “incarnated” in the “rightly guided” imâm and in his reason and knowledge.

Further elements allow a better defining of the Ikhwân's political position. The history of early Islam is approached from a Shi‘i perspective; some important events of the prophet Muhammad's life and mission are recalled; soon attention shifts to two fatal events which led to the defeat of Shî‘ism, the battle of Siffîn and the slaughter of Karbalâ’. In a passage on the struggles for imamate, the “representatives of the Muhammadic (Muhammadiyya) Law and of the Hashimi federation” (cf. Epistle 31, III, 165, 11-12) are opposed. If the latter are the ‘Abbasids (or even the supporters of Abû Hâshim, son of Muhammad ibn al-Hanafiyya), the former should be understood as the direct descendants of the Prophet through Fâtima, whence the Ikhwân's strict ‘Alid militancy should be demonstrated.

Another passage from Epistle 31 (III, 153, 11-156, 9) might urge to suppose that the authors' target was the caliph al-Ma’mûn, in spite of his pro-‘Alid policy (and political support of Mu‘tazilism). The Ikhwân report on a ruler, who encouraged politico-religious controversies among the ‘ulamâ’ (learned) of different persuasions, claiming for himself the right to interpret the Law on the basis of the mu‘tazili doctrine of the created Qur’ân. Juxtaposed to him is ahl bayt al-nubuwwa (the immediate family of the Prophet: Muhammad, his daughter Fâtima, his cousin and son-in-law ‘Alî and their sons, al-Hasan and al-Husayn) as the guarantors of the true tradition concerning prophetic succession. The Ikhwân could then still be identified with the supporters of the strict ‘Alid conception of the imamate, according to which the science of caliphate belongs to the family of the Prophet only.

If this hypothesis is tenable, Epistle 31 contains not only the core of the Ikhwân's political thought, but also of their Isma‘ili commitment. Their presentation of the “perfect city”, in which mutual love is the basis and the goal of the community, does not help us to ascertain whether the Ikhwân have in mind spiritual rule or a true government such as that of the Fatimid caliph, of whom they might be the du‘â’. Scholars tend to consider this “perfect city” as utopian as the Farabian (cf. e.g. Marquet, 1973, 153; Hamdani, 1999, 81). The defeat of evil people is also often foreshadowed in the encyclopedia (cf. e.g. Epistle 31, III, 154, 19-24 and 156, 2-3). In Epistle 4 the Ikhwân present a cyclical conception of ruling dynasties, and state that “the dynasty of the evil reached its apex”, hence only decline and diminution are to be expected in future. (According to A.L. Tibawi (1955, 37, note 4), the Ikhwân forebode here the fall of the ‘Abbasids. Cf. also Tibawi, 1978, 60.) The dynasty of the good begins when the learned agree “on a unique doctrinal school and a single religion”, commit themselves to mutual help, and desire the vision of God and doing God's will as their [sole] reward (I, 181, 14-182, 2).

On the basis of his previous researches, ‘Abbas Hamdani introduced the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ as a “group of intellectuals working as a think-tank for the Fatimid da‘wa and preaching an activist philosophy of change needed in the Muslim world”. Moh. Jalub Farhan, however, describes the Ikhwân as opposed to the Buyid regime, in spite of the fact that it supported science (1999, 30, 31). The Brethren who cooperated in the final version of the encyclopaedia in the tenth century might have been disguised adversaries of the Buyids, who were Shî‘ites, not Ismâ‘îlis.

On the whole, the political vision outlined above is founded on doctrinal elements of Isma‘ili nature. The division between the “elect” and the “masses” destines the former only for investigation of the curriculum studiorum at the basis of the “philosophy of salvation”. A rigid hierarchy of universe links each level of existence, physical and spiritual, to that which precedes and that which follows it where the beings that belong to the various levels cannot go beyond them. (It should be noted that this may question the idea of “evolution” in the Ikhwân that some scholars have ascribed to them; cf. e.g. Vernet Ginés, 1990, 190; Marquet, 1992). The didactic aims of the ruler mirror the aspect of Isma‘ili propaganda known as ta‘lîm (lit.: “teaching”).

The influence of the Epistles on later Isma‘ili literature has been widely recognized (Daftary 2007, 236). Their content has been transmitted and developed by subsequent thinkers of various persuasions. If the Ikhwân al-Safâ’ were Ismâ‘îlis or in someway linked to them, then Ismâ‘îlism influenced a much wider part of Islamic thought and culture than previously recognized.




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