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Henri Bergson

First published Tue May 18, 2004; substantive revision Thu Jan 3, 2008

Henri Bergson (1859-1941) was one of the most famous and influential French philosophers of the late 19th century-early 20th century. Although his international fame reached cult-like heights during his lifetime, his influence decreased notably after the second World War. While such French thinkers as Merleau-Ponty, Sartre, and Lévinas explicitly acknowledged his influence on their thought, it is generally agreed that it was Gilles Deleuze's 1966 Bergsonism that marked the reawakening of a wide and growing interest in Bergson's work. Deleuze realized that Bergson's most enduring contribution to philosophical thinking is his concept of multiplicity. Therefore, due to Deleuze's realization, a kind of revitalization of Bergsonism has been going on since around 1990.

1. Life and works

Bergson was born in Paris on October 18, 1859; he was the second of seven children of a Polish Father and English mother; both of his parents were Jewish. Bergson was a notably exceptional pupil throughout his childhood. Like his German contemporary, Edmund Husserl, Bergson's original training was in mathematics. Bergson won the first prize in mathematics for the prestigious “Concours Général,” which led to the publication of his solution to a problem by Pascal in 1877. Bergson nevertheless chose to prepare for the École Normale in the letters and humanities section. His math teacher, disappointed, famously claimed, “you could have been a mathematician; you will be a mere philosopher” (quoted in Soulez & Worms 2002, p. 35).

In 1878, Bergson becomes a French citizen, although he could have chosen English citizenship. He was accepted at the École Normale along with Jean Jaurès and Émile Durkheim. He discovered Herbert Spencer with enthusiasm, and studied under Félix Ravaisson and Jules Lachelier. Bergson graduated from the École Normale in 1881. He was the second best at the highly selective Agrégation de Philosophie, thanks to a lecture entitled “What is the value of contemporary psychology?” He began a teaching post in Angers at the high school (the lycée), and then moved to Clermont-Ferrand. There he taught both at the Lycée and the University for the next five years.

His first scholarly publication was in 1886, in the Revue Philosophique; “On Unconscious Simulation in States of Hypnosis” concerns the results of his observations at sessions of hypnosis. Notice that Freud and Breuer's Studies on Hysteria did not appear until 1896. This foreshadowed Bergson's growing interest in the role of unconscious memories within recognition—an interest that culminates in his being elected president of the London based Society for Psychical Research in 1913. In 1888, Bergson submitted two doctoral theses in Paris: Essai sur les données immédiates de la conscience, published as a book (Time and Free Will) in 1889; and the then required Latin thesis, Quid Aristoteles de loco senserit (Aristotle's Conception of Place). In 1927, in a footnote to Being and Time, Heidegger will cite this second thesis, claimimg that Bergson's view of time remains within the horizon of Greek metaphysics.

Bergson's second book, Matter and Memory, appeared in 1896. This book would lead to Bergson being elected to the Collège de France. In his second attempt, Bergson succeeded at obtaining a post, and teaches at the École Normale for two years starting in 1898 (Soulez et Worms, 2002, pp. 80-81). The Dreyfus Affair was raging, but Bergson (a Jew by birth) refused to take part in the public debate. Bergson published Laughter: an Essay on the Meaning of the Comic in 1900. He was appointed Chair of Ancient Philosophy at the prestigious Collège de France. This marked the beginning of his growing fame. In 1903, Bergson published, in the prestigious Revue de métaphysique et de morale, an article entitled “Introduction to Metaphysics” (later reproduced as the centerpiece of The Creative Mind [La Pensée et le mouvant] in 1934). The first of Bergson's works to be translated in many languages, this article not only became a crucial reading guide for Bergson's philosophy as a whole, but it also marked the beginning of “Bergsonism” and of its influence on Cubism and literature. Through Williams James's enthusiastic reading of this essay, Bergsonism acquired a far-reaching influence on American Pragmatism. Moreover, his imprint on American literature (in particular, Wallace Stevens and Willa Cather, who created a character called “Alexandra Bergson”) is undeniable.

Creative Evolution appeared in 1907. It was the beginning of the “Bergson legend,” as well as of numerous, lively academic and public controversies centering on his philosophy and his role as an intellectual. The beginning of the next decade is the apex of the “Bergsonian cult” (“le Bergson boom”). Creative Evolution was translated into English. Bertrand Russell (who publishes an article entitled “The Philosophy in Bergson” in The Monist in 1912) objects that Bergson wants to turn us into bees with the notion of intuition. Russell also notes that any attempt at classifying Bergson will fail, as his philosophy cuts across all divisions, whether empiricist, realist or idealist (Soulez et Worms 2002, p. 124). Bergson's lectures at the Collège de France were filled to capacity, not only with society ladies and their suitors, but also with a whole generation of philosophy students (Étienne Gilson and Jean Wahl among others) and poets such as T.S. Eliot.

In January 1913, Bergson visits the United States for the first time (Soulez et Worms 2002, p. 134). The week before he delivered his first lecture at Columbia University (entitled “Spirituality and Liberty”), The New York Times published a long article on him. The enthusiasm this article generated may explain the traffic jam that occurred before Bergson's lecture, the first traffic jam in the history of Broadway. In the same year, Bergson gave the Presidential Address, entitled “Phantasms of the Living and Psychical Research,” to the Society for Psychical Research in London, England. The next year Bergson wass elected a member of the Académie Française; he was the first Jewish member in its history. He also presented courses at the Collège de France on Modern Philosophy and Spinoza. His international fame continued to grow through the delivery of the Gifford Lecture at Edinburgh University in Scotland in May and June; the lectures were called “The Problem of Personality.” Finally, in the same year, the Roman Catholic Church, in opposition to evolutionary theory, condemned Bergson's philosophy.

Of course, in the middle of this decade, war broke out, and Bergson entered his political career, which took him first to Spain in 1917 (Soulez et Worms 2002, p.150). But more importantly, the French government sent him to the United-States as a diplomatic emissary to meet President Wilson (Soulez et Worms 2002, p. 154; see also Soulez 1989). After his first visit to the United States in 1913, he had thought that peace would come only from Washington, D.C. (Soulez et Worms 2002, p. 139). After his visit to Washington, Bergson said, “I have just lived unforgettable hours. Humanity appeared to me transfigured. […] France was saved. It was the greatest joy of my life.” At this time, Bergson is also working with Wilson's government to form a “league of nations,” a body that would include representatives of all nations and that would aim at establishing and maintaining peace. The League of Nations remained in existence until 1946, when it was replaced by the United Nations.  Increasingly Bergson became more famous for his political actions than for his philosophy.

1919 saw the publication of Bergson's Mind Energy, a collection of essays concerned with metaphysical and psychological problems. During the same year he retired from his teaching duties. However, in 1922, Bergson was appointed president of the International Commission for Intellectual Cooperation — the precursor to UNESCO. There, Bergson participated in a debate with Einstein, which, according to Merleau-Ponty, seems to testify to a “crisis of reason.”  Bergson publishes his reflections on Einstein as Duration and Simultaneity (see Mélanges, 1972). Despite Bergson's claim that the mathematics in Duration and Simultaneity is insufficient, this book is important because in it Bergson re-orients Riemann's idea of mutliplicity, which had been the basis of Einstein's theory (Deleuze, 1991, pp. 39-40, and, also see below, "The Concept of Multiplicity").

During the second half of the Twenties, Bergson suffered from severe arthritis, which eventually forced him to retire from public life. In 1928, he was awarded the Nobel Prize for literature. Finally, in 1932, he surprised everyone with the publication of his last major book, The Two Sources of Morality and Religion, which gave rise to renewed debates and misunderstandings about his philosophy and his religious orientation. The final collection of his essays, The Creative Mind, appeared in 1934.

Bergson died on January 3, 1941 at the age of 81. World War II had of course already begun, and Germany, occupying France, had established the Vichy government. There is a rumor that he had converted to Catholocism near the end of his life, but there is no document to support this rumor. In any case, the Vichy Government offered Bergson exemptions from anti-Semitic regulations, but he refused. It is also rumored that he contracted the cold that killed him while waiting in line to register as a Jew. Unfortunately, Bergson had written a will during the 1930's which instructed that all of his papers be destroyed. His wife apparently obeyed this order, throwing all of her husband's papers into the fireplace. There is a rumor that she destroyed a half-written manuscript. The result of this destruction is that the Bergson Archives in Paris (stored at Librairie Jacques Doucet on the Place de Panthéon in Paris) contain only Bergson's personal library. So, the situation is very different for Bergson than for many other important French and German philosophers of the Twentieth Century who have massive archives (Husserl, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty). The lack of archival material is one reason why Bergson went out of favor during the second half of the Twentieth Century. We shall return to this problem of Bergson's temporary disappearance from the philosophical scene.

2. The Concept of multiplicity

The concept of multiplicity has two fates in the Twentieth Century: Bergsonism and phenomenology (Deleuze, 1991, pp. 115-118). In phenomenology, the multiplicity of phenomena is always related to a unified consciousness. In contrast, in Bergsonism, “the immediate data of consciousness” (les données immédiates de la conscience) are a multiplicity. Here, two prepositions, “to” and “of,” indicate perhaps the most basic difference between Bergsonism and phenomenology. Of course, this phrase is the title of Bergson's first work, Essai sur les données immédiates de la conscience. The standard English title of this work is Time and Free Will: An Essay on the Immediate Data of Consciousness. It is the text that Sartre claimed attracted him to philosophy.

Time and Free Will has to be seen as an attack on Kant, for whom freedom belongs to a realm outside of space and time. Bergson thinks that Kant has confused space and time in a mixture, with the result that we must conceive human action as determined by natural causality. Bergson offers a twofold response. On the one hand, in order to define consciousness and therefore freedom, Bergson proposes to differentiate between time and space, “to un-mix” them, we might say. On the other hand, through the differentiation, he defines the immediate data of consciousness as being temporal, in other words, as the duration (la durée). In the duration, there is no juxtaposition of events; therefore there is no mechanistic causality. It is in the duration that we can speak of the experience of freedom.

For Bergson, we must understand the duration as a qualitative multiplicity — as opposed to a quantitative multiplicity. In Time and Free Will, we find several examples of a quantitative multiplicity; the example of a flock of sheep is perhaps the easiest to grasp (Time and Free Will, pp. 76-77). When we look at a flock of sheep, what we notice is that they all look alike. Thus a quantitative multiplicity is always homogeneous. But also, we notice that we can enumerate the sheep, despite their homogeneity. We are able to enumerate them because each sheep is spatially separated from or juxtaposed to the others; in other words, each occupies a discernable spatial location. Therefore, quantitative multiplicities are homogeneous and spatial. Moreover, because a quantitative multiplicity is homogeneous, we can represent it with a symbol, for instance, a sum:  “25.”  In contrast, qualitative multiplicities are heterogeneous and temporal; this is a difficult idea, since we would normally think that if there is heterogeneity, there is juxtaposition. But, in the duration, heterogeneity does not imply juxtaposition (or it implies juxtaposition only retrospectively). Again, Bergson gives us many examples; but perhaps the easiest example to grasp is the feeling of sympathy, a moral feeling (Time and Free Will, pp. 18-19). Sympathy is not only the easiest to grasp, it is also significant, as we shall see. Our experience of sympathy begins, according to Bergson, with our putting ourselves in the place of others, feeling their pain. But, if this were all, the feeling would inspire in us abhorrence of others, and we would want to avoid them, not help them. Bergson concedes that the feeling of horror may be at the root of sympathy. But then, we realize that if we do not help this poor wretch, it is going to turn out that, when we need help, no one will come to our aide. There is a “need” to help the suffering. For Bergson, these two phases are “inferior forms of pity.”  In contrast, true pity involves not so much fearing pain as desiring it. It is as if “nature” has committed a great injustice and what we want is to be seen as not complicit with it. As Bergson says, “The essence of pity is thus a need for self-abasement, an aspiration downward” into pain. But, this painful aspiration develops into a sense of being superior. We realize that we can do without certain sensuous goods; we are superior to them since we have managed to dissociate ourselves from them. In the end, one feels humility, humble since we are now stripped of these sensuous goods. Now, Bergson calls this feeling “a qualitative progress.” It consists in a “transition from repugnance to fear, from fear to sympathy, and from sympathy itself to humility.”  The genius of Bergson's description is that there is a heterogeneity of feelings here, and yet no one would be able to juxtapose them or say that one negates the other. There is no negation in the duration. We shall return to this important point concerning negation when discussing “Creative evolution.”  In any case, the feelings are continuous with one another; they interpenetrate one another, and there is even an opposition between inferior needs and superior needs. A qualitative multiplicity is therefore heterogeneous (or singularized), continuous (or interpenetrating), oppositional (or dualistic) at the extremes, and progressive (or temporal, an irreversible flow, which is not given all at once). Because a qualitative multiplicity is heterogeneous and yet interpenetrating, it cannot be adequately represented by a symbol; indeed, for Bergson, a qualitative multiplicity is inexpressible. Bergson also calls the last characteristic of temporal progress mobility. For Bergson — and perhaps this is his greatest insight — freedom is mobility. Because Bergson connects duration with mobility, in the second half of the Twentieth Century (in Deleuze and Foucault, in particular), the Bergsonian concept of qualitative multiplicity will be dissociated from time and associated with space (Deleuze 1986).

In his “Introduction to Metaphysics,” Bergson gives us three images to help us think about the duration and therefore qualitative multiplicities (The Creative Mind, pp. 164-65). The first is that of two spools, with a tape running between them, one spool unwinding the tape, the other winding it up. (During his discussion of Bergson, Heidegger focuses on this image in his 1928 The Metaphysical Foundations of Logic.) Duration resembles this image, according to Bergson, because, as we grow older, our future grows smaller and our past larger. The benefit of this image is that it presents a continuity of experiences without juxtaposition. Yet, there is a drawback: because a tape moves between the two spools, the image presents the duration as being homogeneous, as if one could fold the tape back over its other parts, as if the tape were super-posable, implying that two moments in consciousness might be identical. Yet, as Bergson says, “no two moments are identical in a conscious being” (The Creative Mind, p. 164). Duration, for Bergson, is continuity of progress and heterogeneity; moreover, thanks to this image, we can also see that duration implies a conservation of the past. Indeed, for Bergson and this is the center of his truly novel idea of memory, memory conserves the past and this conservation does not imply that one experiences the same (re-cognition), but difference. One moment is added onto the old ones, and thus, when the next moment occurs, it is added onto all the other old ones plus the one that came immediately before. In comparison, therefore to the past collection of moments, it cannot be the same as the one immediately before, because the past is “larger” for the current moment than it was for the previous moment. Although Bergson does not say this, one might say that Tuesday is different from Monday because Monday only includes itself and Sunday, while Tuesday includes itself, Monday, and Sunday. This first image, therefore, implies that duration is memory: the prolongation of the past into the present. We shall return to the question of memory below.

The second image of qualitative multiplicity is the color spectrum. We saw in the first image of the spools that there is constant difference or heterogeneity. The color spectrum helps us understand this, since a color spectrum has a multiplicity of different shades or nuances of color. Here we have heterogeneity, but there is a drawback to this image as well. We lose the characteristic of continuity or unity since the spectrum has colors juxtaposed. As Bergson says, “pure duration excludes all idea of juxtaposition, reciprocal exteriority and extension” (The Creative Mind, p. 164).

Bergson's third image is an elastic band being stretched. Bergson tells us first to contract the band to a mathematical point, which represents “the now” of our experience. Then, draw it out to make a line growing progressively longer. He warns us not to focus on the line but on the action which traces it. If we can focus on the action of tracing, then we can see that the movement — which is duration — is not only continuous and differentiating or heterogeneous, but also indivisible. We can always insert breaks into the spatial line that represents the motion, but the motion itself is indivisible. For Bergson, there is always a priority of movement over the things that move; the thing that moves is an abstraction from the movement. Now, the elastic band being stretched is a more exact image of duration. But, the image of the elastic is still, according to Bergson, incomplete. Why ? Because, for him, no image can represent duration. An image is immobile, while duration is “pure mobility” (The Creative Mind, p. 165). Later, in Creative Evolution, Bergson will criticize the new art of cinema for presenting immobile images of movement. As Deleuze will show in his cinema books, however, Bergson does not recognize the novelty of this artform. Cinema does provide moving images. In any case, in “Introduction to Metaphysics,” Bergson compares all three images: “the unrolling of our duration [the spool] in certain aspects resembles the unity of a movement which progresses [the elastic], in others, a multiplicity of states spreading out [the color-spectrum].” Now we can see that duration really consists in two characteristics:  unity and multiplicity. This double characteristic brings us to Bergson's method of intuition.

3. The method of intuition

As we already noted, Bergson's thought must be seen as an attempt to overcome Kant. In Bergson's eyes, Kant's philosophy is scandalous, since it eliminates the possibility of absolute knowledge and mires metaphysics in antinomies. Bergson's own method of intuition is supposed to restore the possibility of absolute knowledge – here one should see a kinship between Bergsonian intuition and what Kant calls intellectual intuition – and metaphysics. To do this, intuition in Bergson's sense must place us above the divisions of the different schools of philosophy like rationalism and empiricism or idealism and realism. Philosophy, for Bergson, does not consist in choosing between concepts and in taking sides (The Creative Mind, p. 175-76). These antinomies of concepts and positions, according to him, result from the normal or habitual way our intelligence works. Here we find Bergson's connection to American pragmatism. The normal way our intelligence works is guided by needs and thus the knowledge it gathers is not disinterested; it is relative knowledge. And how it gathers knowledge is through what Bergson calls “analysis,” that is, the dividing of things according to perspectives taken. Comprehensive analytic knowledge then consists in reconstruction or re-composition of a thing by means of synthesizing the perspectives. This synthesis, while helping us satisfy needs, never gives us the thing itself; it only gives us a general concept of things. Thus, intuition reverses the normal working of intelligence, which is interested and analytic (synthesis being only a development of analysis). In the fourth chapter to Matter and Memory, Bergson calls this reversal of habitual intelligence “the turn of experience” where experience becomes concerned with utility, where it becomes human experience (Matter and Memory, pp.184-85). This placement of oneself up above the turn is not easy; above all else, Bergson appreciates effort.

Intuition therefore is a kind of experience, and indeed Bergson himself calls his thought “the true empiricism” (The Creative Mind, p. 175). What sort of experience? In the opening pages of “Introduction to Metaphysics,” he calls intuition sympathy (The Creative Mind, p. 159). As we have seen from our discussion of multiplicity in Time and Free Will, sympathy consists in putting ourselves in the place of others. Bergsonian intuition then consists in entering into the thing, rather than going around it from the outside. This “entering into,” for Bergson, gives us absolute knowledge. In a moment, we are going to have to qualify this “absoluteness.” In any case, for Bergson, intuition is entering into ourselves – he says we seize ourselves from within – but this self-sympathy develops heterogeneously into others. In other words, when one sympathizes with oneself, one installs oneself within duration and then feels a “certain well defined tension, whose very determinateness seems like a choice between an infinity of possible durations” (The Creative Mind, p. 185). In order to help us understand intuition, which is always an intuition of duration, let us return to the color spectrum image. Bergson says that we should suppose that perhaps there is no other color than orange. Yet, if we could enter into orange, that is, if we could sympathize with it, we would “sense ourselves caught,” as Bergson says, “between red and yellow.” This means that if we make an effort when we perceive orange, we sense a variety of shades. If we make more of an effort, we sense that the darkest shade of orange is a different color, red, while the lightest is also a different color, yellow. Thus, we would have a sense, beneath orange, of the whole color spectrum. So, likewise, I may introspect and sympathize with my own duration; my duration may be the only one. But, if I make an effort, I sense in my duration a variety of shades. In other words, the intuition of duration puts me in contact with a whole continuity of durations, which I could, with effort, try to follow upwardly or downwardly, upward to spirit or downward to inert matter (The Creative Mind, p. 187). Thus Bergsonian intuition is always an intuition of what is other. Here we see that Bergson has not only tried to break with Kant, but also with Parmenides's philosophy of the same.

Before, we leave this discussion, it is important to realize that intuition, understood as my self-sympathy, like the one color orange, is what Bergson calls a “component part” (The Creative Mind, pp. 170-72). Just as the color orange is a real part of the color spectrum — the mathematical equation which defines the light waves of orange, on the contrary, being not a component part, for Bergson, but a “partial expression” – my own duration is a real part of the duration itself. From this part, I can, as Bergson would say, “dilate” or “enlarge” and move into other durations. But this starting point in a part implies – and Bergson himself never seems to realize this– that intuition never gives us absolute knowledge of the whole of the duration, all the component parts of the duration. The whole is never given in an intuition; only a contracted part is given. Nevertheless, this experience is an integral one, in the sense of integrating an infinity of durations. And thus, even though we cannot know all durations, every single one that comes into existence must be related, as a part, to the others. The duration is that to which everything is related and in this sense it is absolute.

Because intuition in Bergson is “integral experience” (The Creative Mind, p. 200), it is made up of an indefinite series of acts, which correspond to the degrees of duration. This series of acts is why Bergson calls intuition a method. The first act is a kind of leap, and the idea of a leap is opposed to the idea of a re-constitution after analysis. One should make the effort to reverse the habitual mode of intelligence and set oneself up immediately in the duration. But then, second, one should make the effort to dilate one's duration into a continuous heterogeneity. Third, one should make the effort to differentiate (as with the color orange) the extremes of this heterogeneity. With the second and third steps, one can see a similarity to Plato's idea of dialectic understood as collection and division. The method resembles that of the good butcher who knows how to cut at the articulations or the good tailor who knows how to sew pieces of cloth together into clothes that fit. On the basis of the division into extremes or into a duality, one can then confront our everyday “mixtures” of the two extremes. Within the mixture, one makes a division or “cut” into differences in kind: into matter and spirit, for instance. Then one shows how the duality is actually a monism, how the two extremes are “sewn” together, through memory, in the continuous heterogeneity of duration. Indeed, for Bergson, intuition is memory; it is not perception.

4. Perception and memory

Since its publication in 1896, Matter and Memory has attracted considerable attention (see, for example, Deleuze 1956). In the Preface that he wrote in 1910, Bergson says that Matter and Memory “is frankly dualistic,” since it “affirms both the reality of matter and the reality of spirit (Matter and Memory, p. 9). However, he is quick to warn us that the aim of the book is really “to overcome the theoretical difficulties which have always beset dualism” (ibid.). In the history of philosophy, these theoretical difficulties have generally arisen from a view of external perception, which always seems to result in an opposition between representation and matter. Thus, Bergson's theory of “pure perception,” laid out in the first chapter of Matter and Memory aims to show that — beyond both realism and idealism — our knowledge of things, in its pure state, takes place within the things it represents.

But, in order to show this, Bergson starts with a hypothesis that all we sense are images. Now we can see the basis of Bergson's use of images in his method of intuition. He is re-stating the problem of perception in terms of images because it seems to be an intermediate position between realism and idealism (Matter and Memory, p. 26). Bergson is employing the concept of image to dispell the false belief — central to realism and materialism — that matter is a thing that possesses a hidden power able to produce representations in us. Bergson, however, not only criticizes materialism, but also idealism insofar as it attempts to reduce matter to the representation we have of it. For Bergson, image differs from representation, but it does not in nature from representation since Bergson's criticism of materialism consists in showing that matter does not differ in nature from representation. For Bergson, the image is less than a thing but more than a representation. The “more” and the “less” indicates that representation differs from the image by degree. It also indicates that perception is continuous with images of matter. Through the hypothesis of the image, Bergson is re-attaching perception to the real.

In perception — Bergson demonstrates this point through his theory of pure perception — the image of a material thing becomes a representation. A representation is always in the image virtually. We shall return to this concept of virtuality below. In any case, in perception, there is a transition from the image as being in itself to its being for me. But, perception adds nothing new to the image; in fact, it subtracts from it. Representation is a diminution of the image; the transition from image to pure perception is “discernment in the etymological sense of the word,” a “slicing up” or a “selection” (Matter and Memory, p. 38). According to Bergson, selection occurs because of necessities or utility based in our bodies. In other words, conscious representation results from the suppression of what has no interest for bodily functions and the conservation only of what does interest bodily functions. The conscious perception of a living being therefore exhibits a “necessary poverty” ( Matter and Memory, p. 38).

If we can circle back for a moment, although Bergson shows that we perceive things in the things, the necessary poverty of perception means that it cannot define intuition. Turning back from the habitual use of intelligence for needs, intuition, as we can see now, places us above or below representations. Intuition is fundamentally un-representative. In this regard, the following passage from the third chapter of Matter and Memory becomes very important:

If you abolish my consciousness … matter resolves itself into numberless vibrations, all linked together in uninterrupted continuity, all bound up with each other, and traveling in every direction like shivers. In short, try first to connect together the discontinuous objects of daily experience; then, resolve the motionless continuity of these qualities into vibrations, which are moving in place; finally, attach yourself to these movements, by freeing yourself from the divisible space that underlies them in order to consider only their mobility – this undivided act that your consciousness grasps in the movement that you yourself execute. You will obtain a vision of matter that is perhaps fatiguing for your imagination, but pure and stripped of what the requirements of life make you add to it in external perception. Reestablish now my consciousness, and with it, the requirements of life: farther and farther, and by crossing over each time enormous periods of the internal history of things, quasi-instantaneous views are going to be taken, views this time pictorial, of which the most vivid colors condense an infinity of repetitions and elementary changes. In just the same way the thousands of successive positions of a runner are contracted into one sole symbolic attitude, which our eye perceives, which art reproduces, and which becomes for everyone the image of a man who runs (Matter and Memory, pp.208-209).

Like the descriptions of intuition, this passage describes how we can resolve the images of matter into mobile vibrations. In this way, we overcome the inadequacy of all images of duration. We would have to call the experience described here not a perception of matter, but a memory of matter because of its richness. As we have already suggested, Bergsonian intuition is memory. So, we turn now to memory.

As we saw in the discussion of method above, Bergson always makes a differentiation within a mixture. Therefore, he sees that our word “memory” mixes together two different kinds of memories. On the one hand, there is habit-memory, which consists in obtaining certain automatic behavior by means of repetition; in other words, it coincides with the acquisition of sensori-motor mechanisms. On the other hand, there is true or “pure” memory; it is the survival of personal memories, a survival that, for Bergson, is unconscious. In other words, we have habit-memory actually aligned with bodily perception. Pure memory is something else, and here we encounter Bergson's famous (or infamous) image of the memory cone.

The image of the inverted cone occurs twice in the third chapter of Matter and Memory (pp. 152 and 162). The image of the cone is constructed with a plane and an inverted cone whose summit is inserted into the plane. The plane, “plane P,” as Bergson calls it, is the “plane of my actual representation of the universe.”  The cone “SAB,” of course, is supposed to symbolize memory, specifically, the true memory or regressive memory. At the cone's base, “AB,” we have unconscious memories, the oldest surviving memories, which come forward spontaneously, for example, in dreams. As we descend, we have an indefinite number of different regions of the past ordered by their distance or nearness to the present. The second cone image represents these different regions with horizontal lines trisecting the cone. At the summit of the cone, “S,” we have the image of my body which is concentrated into a point, into the present perception. The summit is inserted into the plane and thus the image of my body “participates in the plane” of my actual representation of the universe.

The inverted cone image is no exception to Bergson's belief that all images are inadequate to duration. The inverted cone is really supposed to symbolize a dynamic process, mobility. Memories are descending down the cone from the past to the present perception and action. The idea that memories are descending means that true memory in Bergson is progressive. This progressive movement of memory as a whole takes place, according to Bergson, between the extremes of the base of “pure memory,” which is immobile and which Bergson calls “contemplation” (Matter and Memory, p. 163), and the plane where action takes place. Whenever Bergson in any of his works mentions contemplation, he is thinking of Plotinus, on whom he lectured many times. But, in contrast to Plotinus, for Bergson, thinking is not mere contemplation; it is the entire or integral movement of memory between contemplation and action. Thinking, for Bergson, occurs when pure memory moves forward into singular images. This forward movement occurs by means of two movements which the inverted cone symbolizes. On the one hand, the cone is supposed to rotate. Bergson compares the experience of true memory to a telescope, which allows us to understand the rotating movement. What we are supposed to visualize with the cone is a telescope that we are pointing up at the night sky. Thus, when I am trying to remember something, I at first see nothing all. What will help us understand this image is the idea of my character. When I try to remember how my character came about, at first, I might not remember anything; no image might at first come to mind. Pure memory for Bergson precedes images; it is unconscious. But, I try to focus, as if I were rotating the rings that control the lenses in the “telescope”; then some singular images come into view. Rotation is really the key to Bergson's concept of virtuality. Always, we start with something like the Milky Way, a cloud of interpenetration; but then the cloud starts to condense into singular drops, into singular stars. This movement from interpenetration to fragmentation, from unity to multiplicity, (and even from multiplicity to juxtaposition) is always potential or virtual. But the reverse process is also virtual. Therefore the cone has a second movement, “contraction” (Matter and Memory, p. 168). If we remain with the telescope image, we can see that the images of the constellation must be narrowed, brought down the tube so that they will fit into my eye. Here we have a movement from singular images to generalities, on which action can be based. The movement of memory always results in action. But also, for Bergson, this twofold movement of rotation and contraction can be repeated in language. Even though Bergson never devotes much reflection to language – we shall return to this point below– he is well aware that literary creation resembles natural creation. Here we should consult his early essay on laughter. But, with this creative movement, which is memory, we can turn to creative evolution.

5. Creative evolution

For Bergson, the notion of life mixes together two opposite senses, which must be differentiated and then led into a genuine unity. On the one hand, it is clear from Bergson's earlier works that life is the absolute temporal movement informed by duration and retained in memory. But, on the other hand, he has shown that life also consists in the practical necessities imposed on our body and accounting for our habitual mode of knowing in spatial terms. More specifically then, Bergson's project in Creative Evolution is to offer a philosophy capable of accounting both for the continuity of all living beings—as creatures—and for the discontinuity implied in the evolutionary quality of this creation. Bergson starts out by showing that the only way in which the two senses of life may be reconciled (without being collapsed) is to examine real life, the real evolution of the species, that is, the phenomenon of change and its profound causes. His argument consists of four main steps. First, he shows that there must be an original common impulse which explains the creation of all living species; this is his famous vital impulse (élan vital). Second, the diversity resulting from evolution must be accounted for as well. If the original impulse is common to all life, then there must also be a principle of divergence and differentiation that explains evolution; this is Bergson's tendency theory. Third, the two main diverging tendencies that account for evolution can ultimately be identified as instinct on the one hand and intelligence on the other. Human knowledge results from the form and the structure of intelligence. We learned from “The Introduction to Metaphysics” that intelligence consists precisely in an analytic, external, hence essentially practical and spatialized approach to the world. Unlike instinct, human intelligence is therefore unable to attain to the essence of life in its duration. The paradoxical situation of humanity (the only species that wants to know life is also the only one that cannot do so) must therefore be overcome. So, fourth, the effort of intuition what allows us to place ourselves back within the original creative impulse so as to overcome the numerous obstacles that stand in the way of true knowledge (which are instantiated in the history of metaphysics). We are going to look at each of these four steps.

First, we are going to look at the concept of vital impulse. In Creative Evolution, Bergson starts out by criticizing mechanism as it applies to the concepts of life and evolution. The mechanistic approach would preclude the possibility of any real change or creativity, as each development would be potentially contained in the preceding ones. However, Bergson continues, the teleological approach of traditional finalism equally makes genuine creation of the new impossible, since it entails, just as mechanism, that the “whole is given.” Therefore, neither mechanism nor strict finalism can give a satisfying account of the phenomenon of change that characterizes life. Nevertheless, Bergson argues, there is a certain form of finalism that would adequately account for the creation of life while allowing for the diversity resulting from creation. It is the idea of an original vital principle. If there is a telos to life, then, it must be situated at the origin and not at the end (contra traditional finalism), and it must embrace the whole of life in one single indivisible embrace (contra mechanism). But, this hypothesis does not yet account for evolution in the diversity of its products, nor does it explain the principle of the nature of life.

Second, we turn to Bergson's account of the “complexification” of life, that is, the phenomenon of its evolution from the simple original vital impulse into different species, individuals, and organs. The successive series of bifurcations and differentiations that life undergoes organize itself into two great opposite tendencies, namely, instinct and intelligence. Bergson arrives at this fundamental distinction by considering the different modes through which creatures act in and know the external world. Animals are distinguished from plants on the basis of their mobility, necessitated by their need to find food,whereas plants survive and grow through photosynthesis, which does not require locomotion. While the relationship between consciousness and matter instantiated in the instinct of animals is sufficient and well adapted to their survival (from the point of view of the species), humans are not adequately equipped in this respect; hence the necessity of something like intelligence, defined by the ability to make tools. Humanity is essentially homo faber. Once again, from the point of view of real, concrete life that Bergson is here embracing, intelligence is essentially defined by its pragmatic orientation (and not speculation, as a dogmatic intellectualist approach would assume). From this, Bergson deduces not only the cognitive structure and the scientific history of intelligence (which he examines in detail), but also its limitations. This essentially pragmatic, hence analytic and quantitative orientation of intelligence precludes its immediate access to the essentially qualitative nature of life. Notice that the distinction between the two tendencies relies on the original distinction between the qualitative and the quantitative multiplicities. In any case, in order that human intelligence may attain true knowledge of the essence of the vital impulse, it will have to proceed by means of a mode of knowing that lies at the opposite end of intelligence, namely, instinct.

Throughout Creative Evolution, Bergson's crucial point is that life must be equated with creation, as creativity alone can adequately account for both the continuity of life and the discontinuity of the products of evolution. But now the question is: if humans only possess analytic intelligence, then how are we ever to know the essence of life? Bergson's answer — his third step — is that, because at the periphery of intelligence a fringe of instinct survives, we are able fundamentally to rejoin the essence of life. For, as the tendency and the multiplicity theories made clear, instinct and intelligence are not simply self-contained and mutually exclusive states. They must be called tendencies precisely because they are both rooted in, hence inseparable from, the duration that informs all life, all change, all becoming. There is, therefore, a little bit of instinct surviving within each intelligent being, making it immediately — if only partially — coincide with the original vital impulse. This partial coincidence, as we described above, is what founds intuition.

Finally, we can return to the question of intuition. Thanks to intuition, humanity can turn intelligence against itself so as to seize life itself. By a very different route than the one we saw before, Bergson shows, once again, that our habitual way of knowing, based in needs, is the only obstacle to knowledge of the absolute. Here he argues that this obstacle consists in the idea of disorder. All theories of knowledge have in one way or another attempted to explain meaning and consistency by assuming the contingency of order. The traditional question, “why is there order rather than disorder?” necessarily assumes that the human mind is able to create order mysteriously out of chaos. But, for Bergson, the real question is: “order is certainly contingent, but in relation to what” (Creative Evolution, p. 232)? His answer consists in showing that it is not a matter of order versus disorder, but rather of one order in relation to another. According to Bergson, it is the same reasoning that underlies the ideas of chance (as opposed to necessity), and of nothingness (as opposed to existence). In a word, the real is essentially positive. The real obeys a certain kind of organization, namely, that of the qualitative multiplicity. Structured around its needs and interests, our intelligence fails to recognize this ultimate reality.

However, a fringe of intuition remains, dormant most of the time yet capable of awakening when certain vital interests are at stake. The role of the philosopher is to seize those rare and discontinuous intuitions in order to support them, then dilate them and connect them to one another. In this process, philosophy realizes that intuition coincides with spirit, and eventually with life itself. Intuition and intelligence thus each correspond to tendencies within the human psyche, which, as whole, thereby coincides immediately — if only partially — with the vital impulse. It is only by leaping into intuition that the ultimate unity of mental life appears, for, just as Bergson showed against Zeno, that mobility cannot be reconstructed out of immobility. Here he explains that while one can go from intuition to intelligence by way of diminution, the analytic nature of intelligence precludes the opposite process. Thus Bergson concludes, “philosophy introduces us into spiritual life. And at the same time, it shows us the relation of the life of spirit to the life of the body” (Creative Evolution, p. 268). In a word, it is life in its creativity which unifies the simplicity of spirit with the diversity of matter. And it is a certain kind of philosophy, insofar as it is able to place itself back within the creative impulse, which is capable of realizing the necessary “complementarity” of the diverse, partial views instantiated in the different branches of scientific knowledge and metaphysical thought — so as to reestablish the absoluteness of knowledge, defined by its coincidence with absolute becoming.

6. The two sources of morality and religion

Bergson himself says that his final book, The Two Sources of Morality and Religion, develops ideas from Creative Evolution. It attempts to show that there are two sources from which two kinds of morality and religion evolve. As always with Bergson, Kant is at issue, in this case his moral philosophy. And as usual, Bergson starts by differentiating within a mixture. Under the word “morality” or under the phrase “moral obligation,” there is a mixture of two kinds of morality.

There is the closed morality, whose religion is static, and there is the open morality, whose religion is dynamic. Closed morality and static religion are concerned with social cohesion. Nature has made certain species evolve in such a way that the individuals in these species cannot exist on their own. They are fragile and require the support of a community. One quickly thinks of bees, and Bergson, of course, refers to them. We can see again that there are bodily needs which must be satisfied. The force of these needs is the source of the closed morality. Because of these needs, there is a rigidity to the rules of closed moralities. Kant's moral philosophy has its source in such needs. The survival of the community requires that there be strict obedience: the categorical imperative. Yet, although Kant's categorical imperative is supposed to be universal, it is not, according to Bergson. It is limited and particular. Closed morality really concerns the survival of a society, my society. Therefore, it always excludes other societies. Indeed, for Bergson, closed morality is always concerned with war. And static religion, the religion of closed morality, is based on what Bergson calls the “fabulation function.” The fabulation function is a particular function of the imagination that creates “voluntary hallucinations.” The fabulation function takes our sense that there is a presence watching over us and invents images of gods. These images then insure strict obedience to the closed morality. In short, they insure social cohesion.

But, there is another kind of morality and religion, according to Bergson. The open morality and dynamic religion are concerned with creativity and progress. They are not concerned with social cohesion, and thus Bergson calls this morality “open” because it includes everyone. The open morality is genuinely universal and it aims at peace. The source of the open morality is what Bergson calls “creative emotions.” The difference between creative emotions and normal emotions consists in this: in normal emotions, we first have a representation which causes the feeling (I see my friend and then I feel happy); in creative emotion, we first have the emotion which then creates representations. So, Bergson gives us the example of the joy of a musician who, on the basis of emotion, a symphony, and who then produces representations of the music in the score. We can see here that Bergson has also finally explained how the leap of an intuition happens. The creative emotion makes one unstable and throws one out of the habitual mode of intelligence, which is directed at needs. Indeed, in The Two Sources, Bergson compares creative emotions to unstable mental states as those found in the mad. But what he really has in mind is mystical experience. For Bergson, however, mystical experience is not simply a disequilibrium. Genuine mystical experience must result in action; it cannot remain simple contemplation of God. This association of creative emotions with mystical experience means that, for Bergson, dynamic religion is mystical. Indeed, dynamic religion, because it is always creative, cannot be associated with any particular organized set of doctrines. A religion with organized – and rigid — doctrines is always static.

The phrase with which we began, “moral obligation,” makes one think of Kantian duty. We have alluded to Kant on several occasions, but, let us conclude by examining Bergson's explicit criticism of Kant's moral philosophy. This criticism will demonstrate the strength of Bergson's moral philosophy and of his thought as a whole. According to Bergson, Kant's theory has made a “psychological error.” In any given society, there are many different, particular obligations. The individual in society may at some time desire to deviate from one particular obligation. When this illicit desire arises, there will be resistance from society but also from his habits. If the individual resists these resistances, a psychological state of tension or contraction occurs. The individual, in other words, experiences the rigidity of the obligation. Now, according to Bergson, when philosophers such as Kant attribute a severe aspect to duty, they have externalized this experience of obligation's inflexibility. In fact, for Bergson, if we ignore the multiplicity of particular obligations in any given society, and if instead we look at what he calls “the whole of obligation” (The Two Sources, p. 25), then we see that obedience to obligation is almost natural. According to Bergson, obligations, that is, customs, arise because of the natural need an individual has for the stability that a society can give. As a result of this natural need, society inculcates habits of obedience in the individual. Habituation means that obedience to the whole of obligation is, in fact, for the individual, effortless.

The psychological error then consists in externalizing an exceptional experience – which Bergson calls “resistance to the resistances” – into a moral theory. Duty becomes severe and inflexible. But there is more to this error. Kant believes that he can resolve obligation into rational elements. In the experience of resistance to the resistances, the individual has an illicit desire. And, since the individual is intelligent, the individual uses intelligence, a rational method, to act on itself. According to Bergson, what is happening here is that the rational method is merely restoring the force of the original tendency to obey the whole of obligation that society has inculcated in the individual. But as Bergson notes, the tendency is one thing; the rational method is another. The success of the rational method, however, gives us the illusion that the force with which an individual obeys any particular obligation comes from reason, that is, from the idea or representation, or better still, from the formula of the obligation.

But, there is another force. The second force is what Bergson calls “the impetus of love” (The Two Sources, p. 96). The impetus of love, like joy but also like sympathy, is a creative emotion. The emotion must be explicated into actions and representations. But, this process of explication can be extended. The representations that the mystic explicates can be further explicated into formulas, for example, the formula of each person being deserving of respect and dignity. These formulas, which are the expression of creation and love, are now able to be mixed with the formulas that aim solely to insure the stability of any given society. Since we are now speaking only of formulas, creation and cohesion, the two forces, are mixed together in reason. As before, whereas the rational method used in the experience of resistance to the resistances comes to explain the force of obedience, here in the mystical experience of the impetus of love the formulas come to explain the force of creation. A reversal has taken place. The very forces that have generated the formulas are instead now being explained by those very formulas. Indeed, this is the problem. How could some representation of intelligence have the power to train the will?  How could an idea categorically demand its own realization?  As Bergson says, “Re-establish the duality [of forces], the difficulties vanish” (The Two Sources, p. 96). The two forces are, however, but two complementary manifestations of life.

7. The revitalization of Bergsonism

There are numerous reasons for Bergson's disappearance from the philosophical scene after World War II. First, at least in France, a new generation of philosophers was arising, in particular, Sartre and Merleau-Ponty. Like any new generation, this one had to differentiate itself from the tradition it was inheriting; in many respects, Bergson's thought dominated this tradition. But more important was the fact that Sartre and Merleau-Ponty became interested in Husserlian phenomenology, and then in Heidegger's thought. The influence of German philosophy on post-World War II French thought is well known. It contributed to the eclipse of Bergson. But, there are some aspects of Bergson's thought itself which contributed to this eclipse. On the one hand, there is Bergson's constant suspicion of language; for Bergson, as we noted in the discussion of intuition, language is equivalent to symbols. And, symbols divide the continuity of the duration, leading us into illusions. Bergson's criticisms of language, moreover, must have struck the generation of French philosophers who came of age in the 1960's as strange. Philosophers such as Derrida had so thoroughly embraced Heidegger that they believed that “language is the house of being.” On the other hand, there is the mysticism of The Two Sources. The striking religious tone of this book did not harmonize well with Husserl's phenomenology, which aimed to be a rigorous science.

Yet, we can speak of a recent revitalization of Bergsonism.  This revitalization is due almost entirely to Deleuze. As we have come to understand Deleuze's own thought better, we can see the overwhelming influence of Bergson. In particular, two aspects of Bergson's thought attracted Deleuze. We have already mentioned one of them: the concept of multiplicity. This concept is at the very heart of Deleuze's thought, and duration is the model for all of Deleuze's “becomings.”  The other aspect that attracted Deleuze, which is indeed connected to the first, is Bergson's criticism of the concept of negation in Creative Evolution. We must recall that the linguistic turn in France during the 1960's was accompanied by an “anti-Hegelianism.” Thus Bergson became a resource in the criticism of the Hegelian dialectic, the negative. Moreover, at the end of his life, Merleau-Ponty was also coming to realize that Bergson's criticism of negation is philosophically important; for Merleau-Ponty, the criticism seemed to function like Husserl's “phenomenological reduction,” and perhaps re-opened what Heidegger would call the question of being. But, overall, we must see that a revitalization of Bergsonism became possible because of Deleuze's inistence that Bergsonism is an alternative to the domination of phenomenological thought, including that of Heidegger. The revitalization of Bergsonism leads to a revitalization of the question of life itself, and not to the retrieval of the question of being.


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Deleuze, Gilles | Heidegger, Martin | Husserl, Edmund | James, William | liberty | life | memory | Merleau-Ponty, Maurice | mysticism | nothingness | phenomenology | Plotinus