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The Biological Notion of Individual

First published Thu Aug 9, 2007

Individuals are a prominent part of the biological world. Although biologists and philosophers of biology draw freely on the concept of an individual in articulating both widely accepted and more controversial claims, there has been little explicit work devoted to the biological notion of an individual itself. How should we think about biological individuals? What are the roles that biological individuals play in processes such as natural selection (are genes and groups also units of selection?), speciation (are species individuals?), and organismic development (do genomes code for organisms)? Much of our discussion here will focus on organisms as a central kind of biological individual, and that discussion will raise broader questions about the nature of the biological world, for example, about its complexity, its organization, and its relation to human thought.

1. Introduction

Every individual human being is a part of the living world, a world that contains many other kinds of individual entities, from microscopic single-celled organisms to the readily observable plants and animals that we are familiar with in our everyday life. Although individual organisms do not exhaust the realm of biology, which also studies parts of organisms (such as cells and their components) as well as larger units made up of organisms (such as populations and species), organisms are at least a prominent and important part of the biological world and are paradigmatic biological individuals. This article explores the biological notion of an individual with this in mind, raising questions about the nature of organisms, about what other biological entities (including cells and species) might properly be considered biological individuals, and about the causal and explanatory roles that biological individuals play in thought about the living world.

Despite the centrality of individuals to both our thinking about the biological world and to the causal processes—such as natural selection, infection, development, and ecological succession—that involve them, there has been little explicit discussion in either the philosophy of biology or the biological sciences themselves of biological individuals per se. This is somewhat surprising, given the attention that has been given to a number of specific claims about biological individuals: that species are individuals (rather than natural kinds), that individuality is not a biological primitive but is itself the product of evolution by natural selection, and that certain bodily systems, the immune system being the best known example, are treated as individuals (Tauber 1994; cf. also Lewens 2004 on organisms and artifacts).

Given the open territory here, one might think that the best way to proceed is along two dimensions: to delineate biological from non-biological entities, and to delineate individuals from non-individuals. That would surely elucidate just what “biological individuals” refers to, and so serve as a compass by which we can navigate our way through some conceptual space. But that is not how I propose to proceed. Instead, I want to start with some reflection on our paradigm biological individuals, organisms, using that as a way to show what a biological individual is and the kind of conceptual work that notion does in the biological sciences. With that behind us, we can then turn to consider what other entities have been thought of as biological individuals, and the broader roles that the notion of a biological individual plays across the biological sciences.

Although I shall focus on organisms as a paradigm of biological individuals, there is something from the first of the approaches above that I want to appropriate, and that concerns how the perhaps overly metaphysical-sounding term “individual” should be understood. In talking of “biological individuals” I take myself to refer to some subset of the entities invoked in talking about the biological world, a subset we might gesture at by also talking of biological things or entities, and that are to be distinguished from biological properties, processes or events. By “individual”, “thing” or “entity” in this context I mean something that has three-dimensional spatial boundaries, that endures for some period of time, that is composed of physical matter, and that bears properties and participates in processes and events. On even this minimal understanding of individuals, one can see that an organism is a biological individual, and that neither photosynthesis nor extinction are individuals; rather, they are (respectively) a biological process and a biological event. Since I find it useful to conceptualize individuals in any given domain (physics, biology, psychology, economics) as causal agents—in fact, I think this is entailed by their having the features I have just listed—I will often talk interchangeably of biological individuals and biological agents in what follows. While some biological agents, such as ourselves, have psychological and other special kinds of properties (e.g., those that are cultural), it should be clear that the vast majority of biological agents do not. It is an interesting question as to why the use of cognitive metaphors in describing their agency is widespread if not ubiquitous, though one that we will merely touch on in discussing genetic agency below (see R.A. Wilson 2005: chh.4-6 for more general discussion).

2. What is an Organism?

There is a sense in which we all know what an organism is. If I present you with a book, a rock, a cloud, and a gerbil, and ask you to tell me which of these entities is an organism, you do not need any special skills or training to get the right answer. In this same sense we all know what a person is, or a family or an animal. But philosophers, interested in probing a little beyond the obvious, ask questions like: What is it that makes something an organism?, What kind of thing is an organism?, and Is there always a fact of the matter about whether any given thing is (or is not) an organism? Since the answers to such questions are far from obvious, there is also a sense in which answering the question “What is an organism?” requires moving beyond the unreflective experience that suffices for everyday life, including everyday scientific life.

By way of taking up the last of the three philosophical questions posed above, consider a few real life examples of biological entities whose status as organisms is far from obvious. In the early 1990s, a team of biologists reported in the journal Nature that they had found high levels of genetic identity in samples of a species of fungus (Armillaris bulbosa) taken over a large geographic region in Michigan's Upper Peninsula. They used this data to make a case for viewing these samples as constituting parts of one gigantic fungus, with an estimated biomass of more than ten tons and an estimated age in excess of 1500 years, concluding that “members of the fungal kingdom should now be recognized as among the oldest and largest organisms on earth” (Smith, Bruhn, and Anderson 1992: 431). We might wonder about whether this final conclusion is warranted. In fact, a number of other scientists have questioned this conclusion, and argued that it is mistaken. Resolving the issue of whether this “humungous fungus” is an organism (and why) lies in the background of both commonsense and scientific inquisitiveness about whether the original claims of the research team are justified and true. Minimally, one needs to know more empirical information about the example—is the fungus a continuous biological structure?, does it have a determinate growth pattern?, is it able to reproduce?—in order to develop an informed opinion on the issue. Such information is relevant in part because it reveals something about our concept (or concepts) of an organism.

Take a second example. Living coral reefs, despite rapidly becoming a thing of the past due to the climate changes associated with global warming, are spectacular and beautiful parts of the living world. They consist of two chief components, being accretions of calcite deposits produced by small animals, polyps, that grow on the very calcium-based foundation that they lay down. (Coral polyps belong to the same Linnaean class as sea anemones, and to the same Linnaean phylum as jellyfish.) Coral polyps are indisputably organisms, and coral reefs are typically described both as living things that can grow and die, and as organisms. But such processes depend on photosynthesis, and coral polyps themselves rely on single-celled algae, zooanthellae, for the glucose providing the energy necessary for photosynthesis, which in turn drives the process of calcification. Moreover, it is the zooanthellae that supply the pigments that give living corals their spectacular colours, and their absence or diminished presence that signals a problem for the long-term survival of a coral reef. What the zooanthellae gain in return by infecting the polyps is a feeding den, one that is crucial for their continued survival.

If we can view a coral reef as an organism that has two components, polyps and the calcite deposits they both produce and live on, the former of which itself is an organism, then perhaps there is no special difficulty in adding in the zooanthellae as a further living component of the coral reef, one that lives not on the polyps but literally inside them. Moreover, neither the polyps nor the zooanthellae can exist in their natural environments without the other, having formed a deep, symbiotic relationship over evolutionary time. In light of all of these facts, one might view the coral reef (with its three principal components) as a better example of an organism than either of its two living components, having a kind of integrity and autonomy as a biological entity that each of these components lacks (cf. also Combes 2001). Again, knowing what to say about this example turns on what is packed into our conception of an organism, as does whether we might plausibly invert our concept of a biological individual so that relatively large things most of whose mass is non-living could be organisms while their “component organisms”, such as polyps and zooanthellae, are at best second-class citizens in the world of organisms.

Such examples could be readily multiplied. The range of biological agents that we might well regard as organisms is impressively diverse: from mitochondria that almost certainly descended from free-living organisms (but does their cell-bound existence preclude their being organisms now?) to insect colonies that have been called “superorganisms”; from autocatalytic chemical systems and viruses that share at least many of the properties that organisms have through to the entire planet (the Gaia hypothesis of Lovelock 1979).

One response to this diversity, and to puzzlement over whether a given example is or is not an organism is pluralistic in that rather than provide one answer to the question “What is an organism?” it looks to delineate two or more answers, each picking out a particular kind of organism. For example, the philosopher Jack Wilson defends something like this view in his Biological Individuality: The Identity and Persistence of Living Entities (Cambridge, 1999), arguing that there are at least three different kinds of things that get lumped together under the label “living kinds”: genetic, functional, and developmental living things (see also J. Wilson 2000). Similarly, faced with puzzlement about how many individuals there are in cases of vegetative or clonal “growth”, such as one finds in many plants, the biologist John Harper (1977) distinguished between ramets as individuals that originate through clonal growth, and genets as entities that begin as a seed or fertilized egg. Each of the trees in an Aspen grove that forms clonally is a ramet, and collectively they form a single genet.

Such pluralistic approaches to biological individuals in general or to organisms in particular can be useful and informative in creating a conceptual space that matches the complexity of the biological reality they attempt to describe. Rather than attempting to shoehorn that reality into a commonsense category that derives from our everyday experience—that of an organism—this kind of pluralistic revision to the questions we ask accommodates those categories to scientific discovery and reflection. In so doing, it acknowledges that the phenomena of interest, organisms, have more complexity than meets the eye, and views monistic answers to the question “What is an organism?” as imposing a conceptual straightjacket. Yet there is an alternative way to effect such accommodation that stops short of this kind of pluralism and leaves open the possibility of a monistic answer to the question “What is an organism?”. This is what has been called (R.A. Wilson 2005: chh.3-4) the tripartite view of organisms, building on Richard Boyd's (1999a, 1999b) homeostatic property cluster (HPC) view of natural kinds, a view introduced originally as a view of species as a natural kind. The idea behind the tripartite view's reliance on the HPC view of natural kinds is to acknowledge the enormous diversity amongst organisms, not by endorsing the claim that the concept of an organism lumps together distinct kinds of things, but by showing how that diversity is part and parcel of a reformed way of thinking about natural kinds.

3. Homeostatic Property Cluster Kinds and the Tripartite View of Organisms

Pluralism is one response to the diversity that we find when we look at the biological world in answering the question “What is an organism?”. Yet this kind of diversity is also found when we consider not just organisms but particular kinds of organisms as well, whether they be species or some other rank in the Linnaean hierarchy, from subspecific ranks through to families, classes, and phyla. This points to something distinctive about biological individuals, such as organisms, marking them off from instances of natural kinds in the physical sciences, and that warrants looking for an alternative to pluralism about the concept of an organism.

The geophysicist Walter Elsasser drew the sort of contrast between physical and biological kinds that I have in mind here in his book Atom and Organism, published in 1966 (see also Elsasser 1975, 1998). Roughly put, the idea is that if you've seen one electron (or quark or boson) you've seen them all, in that although there are differences between instances of any two individuals (in accord with Leibniz's Law), these are differences that don't matter when we are looking at kinds in the physical sciences. What physicists and chemists do is to abstract away from such differences, treating any instance like any other. By contrast, this is not true in the biological sciences, where differences between instances of many natural kinds are important and are not simply abstracted away from in forming generalizations about the kind. If you've seen one tiger (or vertebrate or coral reef) you haven't seen them all, for there are differences between instances of any of these biological kinds that remain significant (indeed, in some cases, central) for the articulation of biological knowledge. A way to express this is to say that biological kinds are intrinsically heterogeneous in a way that physical kinds are not.

One way in which the intrinsic heterogeneity of biological kinds is manifested is in the centrality of “population thinking” in evolutionary biology. Natural selection often acts on variation within a population of individuals, and when that variation is exhausted, e.g., when a given trait goes to fixation, that particular form of natural selection also ceases. As Elliott Sober has argued (1980), in the physical sciences and in pre-Darwinian biology, variation was understood as deviation from a natural or normal state, whereas in the post-Darwinian era and especially through the Evolutionary Synthesis variation came to be viewed as itself crucial to the underlying causal mechanisms at the heart of biological statis and change. If the general contrast that Elsasser points to obtains, then this will be just one example of the way in which the intrinsic heterogeneity of biological kinds manifests itself, and one would expect to find other such manifestations elsewhere in the biological sciences. In ecology, intrinsic heterogeneity is manifest in mechanisms of competition and cooperation between species. In developmental cell biology, it is manifest in the diversification of cell types in accord with cellular environment and the timing of their movement and cell division.

If it is correct to view the diversity of organisms against the background of the phenomenon of intrinsic heterogeneity in the biological sciences more generally, then pluralism may seem more like a concession of last resort than as a position of choice. For a pluralistic view doesn't seem all that plausible as a response to the intrinsic heterogeneity of biological kinds in general. What seems required is some further thinking about the nature of the natural kinds that biological individuals belong to, and it is such thought that lies behind the tripartite view of organisms.

At the core of the tripartite view is the claim that organisms are living things (or agents), and that this is a (if not the) central natural kind in the biological sciences. This natural kind is defined by a cluster of properties, such as

The fundamental claim of the HPC view is that at least a large range of natural kind terms are defined by such property clusters, no one or particular n-tuple of which need be possessed by any individual belonging to the natural kind, but some n-tuple of the cluster possessed by all such individuals. The properties in these clusters are homeostatic in that there exist external constraints and internal mechanisms that cause their systematic clustering, rather than that clustering being a happenstance outcome or a chance effect. Biological natural kinds are in no way special, except that they more often manifest the kind of intrinsic heterogeneity within a kind that is especially well captured by the HPC view than do, say, geological, economic, chemical, or physical kinds.

There are three respects in which the HPC view of natural kinds is a cluster view, each of which is important for understanding how it applies to the case of living things. First, it claims that natural kinds are defined by clusters of properties, rather than single properties, such as having a particular chemical composition or other internal structure. This acknowledges a kind of complexity to the structure of entities that fall under the biological kind “living thing”. While it allows that there may be some properties that all living things share (e.g., metabolism has been posited as such a property), it resists the idea that even such properties are profitably thought of as “essential properties”. Second, it implies that no one of these properties is strictly necessary for an individual to belong to a given kind; rather, any of a number of clusters of these properties is necessary for membership in the kind. This recognizes the intrinsic heterogeneity of entities subsumed under “living thing”, allowing for individual living things that don't reproduce (e.g., sterile organisms), or that stop growing, or that malfunction so as to lose their capacity for self-repair. And third, it conceptualizes a cluster of properties not simply as properties that are coinstantiated by some individual entity but as properties whose coinstantiation is underwritten by causal mechanisms and constraints. This implies that the causal structure of the world plays a central role in determining what is and what is not a natural kind, and in turn makes whether something is a living thing a function of how the world is, rather than our conventions and categories for thinking about the world. It is in virtue of this feature of the HPC view that it has been viewed as part of a realist view of science, and so distinguished from Wittgensteinian family resemblance accounts of concepts (to which it does, however, bear a family resemblance).

Suppose that organisms are living agents, and that we accept the HPC view of this biological kind. While this tells us something significant about what organisms are, it would be a mistake simply to identify organisms with living agents (so understood). To do so would be to assume that all organisms are living agents, and that only organisms are living agents. Both of these assumptions are subject to putative counter-examples.

Consider the first of these, that all organisms are living agents. Apart from the obvious point that organisms can cease to be living, i.e., when they die, there may also be kinds of organism, such as the superorganisms that insect colonies are sometimes thought to form, that are not themselves kinds of living things. Both of these counter-examples invite obvious responses: that organisms are at least living things during some part of their existence, and that if we are to take talk of superorganisms as being more than metaphorical or in some other way non-literal, then superorganisms must themselves be some kind of living thing. Both of these responses suggest that while it would be a mistake simply to identify organisms with living things, it would likewise be a mistake to reject the idea that the natural kind living thing has a special tie to the concept of an organism.

Turn now to the second assumption, that only organisms are living things. Putative counter-examples to this claim involve entities that form parts of organisms, including cells and the organelles that they contain (such as mitochondria and ribosomes), bodily organs (such as the heart or kidney), and bodily systems (such as the digestive system or the circulatory system). Closest to our commonsense thought is the second of these, where we readily speak of an organ that is available to be transplanted from a dead person to living recipient as living or alive, and of such organs as having the kinds of properties, such as being healthy or having a metabolism, that we associate with living things. Cells are conceptualized in much the same way, with certain diseases leading to the death of particular cells, or treatments of those diseases as succeeding just when they preserve the life of those cells. If we accept this talk at face value, together with the HPC view of natural kinds that I have sketched (or something like it), then the HPC view of living things must also apply to intra-organismic things such as cells and organs. Such entities do have the structural, functional, and locational properties specified in the HPC definition given above, and I take this to offer some support for thinking that they are examples of living things. But they are not themselves organisms.

These points together suggest that organisms are one kind of living thing rather than living things simpliciter, and the HPC definition of living things is informative about just what this reveals about organisms. So organisms are a kind of living agent. Two features mark them off from other living agents, and these two features form the basis for the remainder of the Tripartite View of organisms. First, organisms do not simply reproduce but have life cycles that allow them to form reproductive lineages of a certain kind. Second, organisms have some kind of minimal level of functional autonomy. Both of these features distinguish organisms from other kinds of living things, and they tell us something important about what organisms are.

A life cycle is an intergenerationally replicable series of events or stages through which a living agent passes. These events or stages constitute a cycle because they begin and end with the same event, such as the formation of a fertilized egg in sexually reproducing organisms, or the creation of a fissioned cell in clonally reproducing organisms. “Development” is the global name for the processes that causally mediate between these events or stages, and while the stages themselves often form standard sequences, there can be tremendous variation across phyla in what counts as part of a given organism's life cycle. Some organisms, such as flukes, have life cycles that take them literally through one or more host organisms, and many insects undergo significant metamorphic changes in bodily form through their life cycle.

Intergenerational life cycles are what make it possible for organisms, and I think only organisms, to form reproductive lineages of living things. Since such reproductive lineages are one of the most impressive and causally most impactful features of the biological world, this is an important putative fact about organisms. Although reproduction itself has sometimes been thought of as part of an organism's life cycle, we should think about this more carefully in articulating the role of reproduction in intergenerational life cycles that characterize organisms in general. For as a matter of fact there are many species in which only a small minority of organisms get to actually reproduce, and reproductive skew is a widespread feature of the world of organisms. Yet it seems clear that all of these organisms, however much or little they reproduce, still possess a life cycle. Even the capacity to reproduce does not accurately characterize a universal feature of organismic life cycles, not only because the capacity itself may not be replicated but because there are organisms designed to be non-reproductive. The best-known examples of such individuals are found amongst the so-called “social insects”—species of ants, bees, wasps, along with the phylogenetically distinct termites—that have a caste structure to them. In such species, a few individuals do most if not all of the direct reproductive labor (e.g., queens), and many others are rendered reproductively sterile throughout all or much of their life (e.g., drones). So there are reasons to include neither reproduction nor the capacity to reproduce as part of the generic life cycle of organisms. What is true, however, is that all organisms have life cycles that allow them to form reproductive lineages. They do so through the reproductive activity of members of the lineage to which they belong, even if not every member of that lineage reproduces or even can reproduce.

The final thread to the Tripartite View builds on the intuition that organisms are not simply living things but have a life of their own: they are able to exercise some kind of control over themselves and are subsequently at least partially free from the agency of others and their environments. One way in which we might express this is by saying that organisms serve as a locus of control, a source of their own agency, in a way in which neither non-living things nor obligately-dependent living things do. This is what I mean by the “functional autonomy” that organisms have: they are able to act for themselves, to structure the lives they have rather than have their lives determined by their environments. In some sense, this is what gives organisms a life to lead, rather than simply being things that have the property of being alive.

We can summarize the Tripartite View of organisms as follows. An organism is

  1. a living agent
  2. that belongs to a reproductive lineage, some of whose members have the potential to possess an intergenerational life cycle, and
  3. which has minimal functional autonomy.

Although this sketch of the Tripartite View is necessarily incomplete and has not been subjected to critical discussion here, it has also raised a number of the broader issues in play in thinking about biological individuals. These include: what might be special about the natural kinds to which biological individuals belong; what sorts of properties characterize and can be used to define living agents; and the status of more general positions, such as pluralism and realism. In what follows I shall turn to consider two other putative biological individuals, groups and genes, focusing primarily on just one recent debate that each has been central to: debate over the levels of selection (for groups), and debate over the place of genes in understanding organismic development and evolution.

4. Groups as Individuals: Superorganisms, Trait Groups, Species, Clades

On the standard Darwinian view of natural selection, the mechanism of natural selection operates on individual organisms. Because there is heritable variation within a population of conspecifics with respect to traits that imbue those organisms with differing levels of fitness, natural selection can operate so as to increase the proportion of organisms with traits that promote fitness. Even though many biologists and philosophers of biology have recognized that the substrate-neutrality of the conditions for natural selection imply that, in principle, it can act on a large variety of entities in the biological hierarchy stretching from the very small (e.g., single base pairs) through to the very large (e.g., clades), as a matter of fact there are two such entities that have been the focus of the bulk of discussion in moving beyond the standard Darwinian view: groups “above” and genes “below”.

The term “group” itself refers to collections of individuals of very different scales and kinds, ranging from temporary dyads of individuals (such as two crickets sharing a ride on a leaf, Sober and Wilson 1998), through to organisms that live together with a social division of reproductive labour (such as social insects), and even higher-level taxonomic groups whose members are largely separated in space and time (such as planktotrophic mollusks, Jablonski 1986, 1987). Darwin himself did appeal to group selection between “tribes” in explaining how moral traits involving self-sacrifice could evolve in human societies or “tribes” that differed with respect to such traits, but he offered no substantive discussion of the differences between these kinds of groups and the relevance of each for natural selection. It has only been with the revival of group selection, largely through the work of David Sloan Wilson (1975, 1977, 1980, 1983, 1997a, 1997b), much of it together with Elliott Sober (Wilson and Sober 1989, Sober and Wilson 1994, 1998), that this question has received heightened attention.

One fundamental distinction here is between groups that can themselves be viewed as organisms—superorganisms—and groups that possess few of the characteristics that organisms have but nonetheless might be thought to function as organisms do vis-à-vis natural selection—what David Sloan Wilson calls trait groups. Paradigm examples of superorganisms are colonies of so-called social insects, i.e., Hymenoptera such as ants, wasps, and bees, together with the taxonomically distinct termites. Indeed, the term “superorganism” was introduced by the entomologist William Morton Wheeler in his 1920 essay “Termitodoxa, or Biology and Society”, although he had talked of ant colonies as organisms as early as his 1911 essay “The Ant-Colony as an Organism”. Even though evolutionary considerations were often in the background in appeals to the concept of a superorganism, the concept had a metaphorical life of its own in characterizing the structural intricacy of certain social structures of a small number of species. By contrast, Wilson introduced the term “trait group” in 1975 specifically to name a kind of group that he thought was pervasive in nature, and that could be a unit of selection just as individual organisms were. Thus, trait group selection came to represent a form of “new group selection”, to be contrasted with forms of group selection that were likely much more limited in their efficacy and prevalence.

The intuitive idea behind a trait group is that there can be evolutionarily relevant structure within demes, such that organisms that belong to one part of the deme may well be subject to causal influences that do not extend to the deme as a whole. A population of such “structured demes” would then function as a metapopulation, with natural selection operating between the trait groups that make up that metapopulation. Sober and Wilson have defined a trait group as “a set of individuals that influence each other's fitness with respect to a certain trait but not the fitness of those outside the group” (1998: 92), building on Wilson's earlier talk (e.g., 1980: 20-24) of trait groups as exerting a ‘sphere of influence’. Note that on this view of what a group is, how long a group persists is irrelevant to its status as a group, as is whether the group is spatiotemporally continuous or aggregated. What is crucial, rather, is that groups contain members who interact in some evolutionarily significant way, such as caterpillars feeding on the same leaf might. It is also strictly irrelevant whether the members of such groups are conspecifics, and this is one reason why Wilson has used the notion of a trait group to discuss the evolutionary dynamics of multispecies communities (e.g., D.S. Wilson 1980: chapters 5-6). While we might describe such groups as “evolutionary individuals” or as “individual units of selection”, it should be clear that trait groups in general are not organisms. (In terms of the Tripartite View of organisms, this is not least of all because they are not living things.)

Some (especially Sterelny 1996) have used the distinction between superorganisms and trait groups to argue that group selection is a much less significant force in directing evolution than proponents of group selection have thought. Superorganismic group selection is real but found only in special cases, while examples that might be described as instances of group selection are better described as cases of genic or individual selection relativized to a particular environment, where part of that environment is composed of other individual organisms. In effect, this is to argue that Wilson and Sober have failed to identify a new form of group selection, trait group selection, since at best they have offered a way to redescribe how natural selection operates on individuals and genes. Together with Sterelny's skepticism about the notion of a trait group, this amounts to denying the significance of trait groups for natural selection.

Sterelny's view that trait group selection can be redescribed without positing groups as the units of selection is an instance of a position that has been called model pluralism about the level of selection (R.A. Wilson 2003, 2005: ch.10), since it claims that there is a plurality in the models that evolutionary biologists might adopt. This view has gained much support in the literature in recent years, being defended in influential papers by Dugatkin and Reeve (1994) and more recently by Kerr and Godfrey-Smith (2002). While pluralistic in name, the effect of model pluralism has often been to reinforce the status of individual and genic selection at the expense of group selection. For example, Dugatkin and Reeve call model pluralism “broad-sense individualism”, characterizing this as the view that “most evolution arises from selfish reproductive competition among individuals within a breeding population” (1994: 107), while the entomologists Andrew Bourke and Nigel Franks summarize their discussion of this topic by saying that “colony-level, group, individual, and kin selection are all aspects of gene selection” (1995: 67). As with Dawkins's appeal to shifts in perspective between two views of a Necker cube as a way to explain the relationship between the selfish gene view and traditional, individual-centred, Darwinian views of natural selection, here pluralism-in-the-abstract often amounts to a kind of fundamentalism-in-the-particular-case.

Paleobiologists and paleontologists have also explored higher-level selection with a focus on species and clade selection (see Grantham 1995 for a review). Clades are monophyletic groups of organisms or species, groups defined by an ancestor and all of and only its descendants. Steven Stanley and Stephen Jay Gould have been two of the most prominent defenders of the idea that there are large-scale patterns of evolutionary change that are due to species of clade selection, and both have done so in part by explicitly developing an extended analogy between individual organisms and species (e.g., Stanley 1979: 189, Gould 2002: 703-744). Amongst putative examples of clade selection are the evolution of planktotrophic mollusks in the late Cretaceous (being selected for greater geographic dispersal and so longetivity, Jablonski 1986, 1987), the evolution of larger body size in males (selected via population density and geographic range, Brown and Maurer 1987, 1989), and the evolution of flowering plants (selected via vector-mediated pollen dispersal, Stanley 1981: 90-91).

One of the chief threads to the continuing debate over species and clade selection parallels that over trait group selection and model pluralism. Are species or clades themselves really the agents of selection, the units that are being selected, or do they simply tag along for the ride, with selection operating exclusively on genes and organisms? Elisabeth Vrba, for example, has distinguished between species sorting and species selection, arguing that while a sorting of species may be the product of evolution by natural selection, this outcome is typically brought about not by species selection but by individual selection. While this is in part an empirical issue, it is also intimately tied up with conceptual questions concerning just what must be true for there to be a case of species or clade selection, and how we view the relationship between the levels of selection—genes, organisms, and groups—that have traditionally been distinguished.

Although I have concentrated on groups and the levels at which natural selection operates in this section, it would be an oversight in this context to remain silent about an idea about species that has become widely accepted in the literature: that species themselves are individuals. This species-as-individuals thesis originates in the work of Michael Ghiselin (1974), who quickly converted David Hull (1976, 1978) to the idea (see also Ghiselin 1997). The thesis developed in part as a response to the perceived failure of essentialism about species, and in part as a way to express the idea that species were treated within systematics and evolutionary biology not as natural kinds but as lineages, existing as they do in space and time and with individual organisms as their physical parts. The species-as-individuals thesis was presented and seen as making a radical break with previous views of the ontological status of species in that it claimed that biologists and philosophers alike had misidentified the basic ontological category that species belonged to. But over time, both as its proponents have clarified what the thesis implied (e.g., Hull's talk of “historical individuals”) and as more sophisticated options for defenders of the view that species are natural kinds were developed (e.g., the HPC view of natural kinds, Boyd 1999a, 1999b), this radical edge to the thesis has diminished.

5. Genes as Individuals: Shifting Views of Developmental Agency

Genes themselves have been thought of as biological individuals or agents of particular significance not only in the process of natural selection, but also in the construction of organisms through biological development. One topic that has received much discussion in the past decade or so is how genes have been conceptualized, the kinds of properties they have been viewed as having, and the causal roles they have been described as having in inheritance and development. I will focus on two metaphors that have played an important role here—the much-discussed informational metaphor and what I call the cognitive metaphor—and on the challenge to the resulting view of genes that has been issued by developmental systems theory and evolutionary developmental biology (aka “Evo-Devo”).

The ideas that genes carry information about phenotypic traits, that they encode for proteins, and that they contain a blueprint for organismic development, are all widely accepted in the biological sciences and in broader representations of what genes do. They constitute a central part of the dominant view of genetic agency. Yet it is only recently that they have been recognized as forming part of a cluster of claims that make up an informational metaphor for characterizing genetic agency, with the status of that metaphor a continuing topic of debate. This information metaphor predates the discovery of the structure of DNA by Watson and Crick in 1953, having its roots in the cybernetic tradition led by the physicists Norbert Wiener and Erwin Schrödinger in the 1940s and ‘50s, and subsumes talk of genetic programming, instructions, and recipes. Evelyn Fox Keller (2000) has argued that this blending of computational and coding metaphors was productive for geneticists because it allowed the development of a notion of genetic action in absence of detailed knowledge of the biochemical structures and mechanisms in which such action was ultimately realized. In my own view, the informational metaphor has also contributed to a misleading view of the kinds of individuals or agents that genes are, insofar as it has implied that they are self-contained and autonomous agents in their own right, agents whose intrinsic properties hold the secret to understanding a wide range of phenomena in the biological world.

One way in which the informational metaphor has done so has been through its interactions with what I referred to in the introduction as the cognitive metaphor in biology. This is the metaphorical attribution of cognitive states and traits to biological entities that do not literally possess such states and traits. When we describe a laptop computer as thinking what to do next or as not wanting to be cooperative, we make use of the cognitive metaphor, something that Dan Dennett (1987) refers to as “adopting the intentional stance”. Reliance on such cognitive metaphors is widespread (indeed, ubiquitous) in the biological sciences, ranging from our attributions of knowledge and recognition to cells in the immune system through to the attribution of goals and desires to “Mother Nature” in describing how natural selection operates.

The cognitive metaphor enters into our talk of genes in several ways. First, the metaphor of the selfish gene, introduced and made popular by Richard Dawkins (1982, 1989), conceptualizes genes as having interests (their own replication and preservation), and then engage in means to satisfy those interests (strategies). Having interests and adopting strategies are both properties that only agents with a psychology can literally possess, and so the cognitive metaphor serves to extend this kind of cognitive agency to biological agents, such as genes. Second, explanations of molecular and intra-cellular processing in general have made use of the cognitive metaphor, and accounts of the operation of genes have been no exception. Genes execute instructions, recognize binding sites, and try to maximize their replication in future generations. The interaction between the informational and cognitive metaphors is apparent not only in some of these examples but might be thought to be required insofar as the informational metaphor itself presupposes the cognitive metaphor, as some have in effect argued is the case in cognitive science (Horst 1996).

One reason why the web of informational and cognitive metaphors has been extremely productive within genetics is that it has been fruitfully intertwined with literal descriptions to such an extent that it has become difficult to say just where the boundary is between literal and metaphorical description. Genes are sequences of DNA that serve as templates for the production of amino acids, which in turn constitute the proteins that are the basic building blocks of biological structures and processes. Given this and the correspondence between specific nucleotide triplets and specific amino acids, it is very natural to talk of genes as coding for protein synthesis, and even for organismic traits. While some have been critical of the role of these metaphors in directing our thought about both natural selection and organismic development (Griffiths 2001, Sarkar 1996, Moss 2003), others have sought to defend much of the orthodoxy here (Maynard Smith 2000).

One of the chief criticisms of the reliance on the informational metaphor has been that it distorts the role of genes in developmental biology and in our understanding of how evolution operates. This criticism has been articulated most fully by proponents of developmental systems theory, a loose-knit cluster of historians, philosophers, psychologists, and biologists who view themselves as redressing an imbalanced view of organismic development (Oyama, Griffiths, and Gray 2001). On this view, genes are simply one kind of developmental resource for the building of organismic bodies, and to view them as coding for organismic traits or, in toto, as serving as “master molecules” for the construction of whole organisms, is to inflate their actual role in ways that are misleading. The psychologist Susan Oyama's 1985 book The Ontogeny of Information is widely viewed as a founding document for developmental systems theory (DST, see also Oyama 2000b), and there have been healthy interactions between explorations in DST, reinterpretations of the history of biology (Amundson 2005, Keller 2000, 2001), the development of niche construction theory at the interface of ecology and evolutionary theory (Odling-Smee, Laland, and Feldman 2003), and the rise of evolutionary developmental biology in contemporary biology (Maienschein and Laubichler 2006, Neumann-Held and Rehmann-Sutter 2005, Müller and Newman 2003, Robert 2004).

The positive vision that has emerged from such interactions is something like this. Organismic development is not simply the unfolding of a genetic program but an active process in which organisms construct themselves through the recruitment and deployment of a range of developmental resources. These form developmental systems, and it is these systems that are the fundamental units for understanding development. Because development is systematic, developmental causes are typically context-sensitive and contingent on what is “going on” in the system more generally, not just on the intrinsic properties of some particular developmental resource. Development itself is a constructive process in that organismic traits are built from the full range of resources that constitute particular developmental systems, rather than simply being “passed down” through their encodings in particular developmental resources, genes. Developmental resources can be found at various scales beyond that of the gene, ranging from nuclear but non-genetic resources, such as the methyl groups in chromatin marking, through to other cellular resources, such as actin fibres and other cytoskeletal structures, and organismal-level resources, such as the Buchnera bacteria that are transmitted as digestive resources in aphid development.

So DST involves the broadening of the conception of what the causal agents for organismic development are. But since there seems no barrier within DST to viewing developmental resources as forming part of an organism's environment, it also returns us to a question about organisms with which we began: where do individuals begin and end? Consider animal-built structures, such as nests and burrows. These often form a crucial part of the environment for the birth and development of offspring, and their particular properties often have a differential impact on the survival of those offspring. Such environmental resources seem no less a crucial, causal part of what particular organisms need to develop, and they are no less so simply because they are shared by multiple organisms. If that is so, then developmental systems can extend beyond the bodily boundary of the organism whose development they are crucial for. They are not simply an extended phenotype (Dawkins 1982) of some gene or genes, however, for they form an active causal role in the creation of the very thing that possesses such a phenotype, the organism.

6. The Evolution of Biological Individuals

However we understand the concept of an organism (sections 2 and 3) and whatever we think of the status of both groups (section 4) and genes (section 5) as biological individuals, biological individuality is a dynamic phenomenon that has changed over time. What biological individuals there are has changed over the 3.8 billion or so years of life on planet Earth, and the evolution of individuality itself has become a topic of discussion in the last twenty years or so (Dawkins 1982, Buss 1987, Maynard Smith and Szathmáry 1995, Michod 1999). Although there is much diversity in the details of these views, at a general level what they share is the idea that the history of life is the history of the construction of more complicated individuals from simpler individuals, with the transitions between these evolutionary individuals being facilitated by natural selection operating at one or more levels. Underlying these ideas is the assumption that biological individuals are hierarchically organized in that earlier individuals provide the material basis for later individuals. For example, prokaryotes—single-celled organisms without a nucleus—form the material basis for single-celled eukaryotes—organisms that do have a nucleus; single-celled eukaryotes, in turn, serve as the material basis for multicellular eukaryotes.

The evolution of biological individuals from prokaryotes to single-celled eukaryotes around 2 billion years ago, and from those to multicellular eukaryotes in the last 600-800 million years are established facts. In addition, there appear to be no counter-examples to this evolutionary trend, such that one does not find examples of (say) prokaryotes appearing from eukaryotes. Yet speculation and controversy surround almost everything else that has been said about these evolutionary transitions. Consider three such issues on which there is a kind of default position in the literature, but which remain subject to ongoing philosophical and empirical interrogation.

First, it is common to view the evolution of individuality itself as the evolution of complexity. There are, however, questions both about how complexity itself should be measured or conceived and about what kind of empirical evidence we actually have for viewing the complexity of individuals as increasing over evolutionary time (McShea 1991). Do we consider the number of cell types that an organism has (Bonner 1988), the types of hierarchical organization it manifests (Maynard Smith 1988), or some more taxa-specific criterion, such as the information required to specify the diversity of limb-pair types (Cisne 1974)? Fossils constitute a principal source for the criteria that have been proposed here, but not only do different kinds of organisms leave fossils with distinct kinds of features, but some kinds of organisms are more likely to leave fossils than are others.

One natural suggestion is that there may well be different kinds of hierarchies for the evolution of individuality, since kinds of individuals can differ from one another in more than one way. Daniel McShea (2001a, 2001b, McShea and Changizi 2003) has proposed a structural hierarchy that is based on two components, the number of levels of “nestedness” and the degree to which the highest individual in the nesting is individuated or developed. McShea provides an overarching framework in which we can view eukaryotic cells as evolving from differentiated aggregations of prokaryotic cells that have intermediate parts; multicellular eukaryotes as evolving from differentiated aggregations of single-celled eukaryotes; and colonial eukaryotes as evolving from differentiated aggregations of multicellular eukaryotes. By contrast, Maynard Smith and Szathmáry (1995) focus on differences in how genetic information is transmitted across generations, proposing eight major transitions in the history of life, starting with that from replicating molecules to compartmentalized populations of such molecules, and ending with the transition from primate societies to human societies. While Maynard Smith and Szathmáry are interested in individuality and complexity, their eight transitions do not form a continuous, non-overlapping hierarchy, and their discussion is focused primarily on exploring the processes governing each of the particular transitions they propose in terms of changes in replicative control.

Second, it is common to view the trend from prokaryotes to multicellular eukaryotes as resulting from some kind of directional bias, one that makes the trend a tendency supported by underlying mechanisms and constraints. Perhaps the tendency is underwritten by thermodynamic, energetic considerations, by facts about the generative entrenchment of developmental systems, or by evolutionary advantages of increases in size (see McShea 1998 for a review). But in supposing that there is some kind of directional bias, each of these hypotheses might be thought to be committed to the kind of Panglossianism about adaptation that Gould and Lewontin (1978) are famous for critiquing, or (more subtly) to a view of evolutionary change as progressive or inevitable in some way. Gould has used his discussion of the Burgess Shale (Gould 1989) to challenge such views of evolution, arguing that the disparity of the fossils in that shale indicates that living things are significantly less different from one another than they once were. The range of biological individuals we see now on the planet, argues Gould, are largely the result of highly contingent extinction events, and we should be wary of immediately assuming that observed trends or patterns are adaptive (or other) tendencies.

Third, many authors have recognized that whatever trends or tendencies there are in the evolution of individuals, there have also been changes over evolutionary time in the social relations between individuals (e.g., Frank 1998). But how we should integrate sociality into our view of the evolution of biological individuals remains under-theorized, and however limited fossil evidence for individual structures and ecological niches may be, that for the kinds and extent of sociality is significantly more sparse. Much of the work to be done here seems distinctly philosophical in that it concerns how we think about what sociality is. Should we consider the simple aggregation of organisms to be a basic form of sociality? Does sociality essentially involve some form of cooperation, and if not, what is the relationship between “prosocial” sociality and antagonistic forms of sociality (e.g., competition or predation)? Although the “evolution of sociality” has been taken up by animal biologists (especially by primatologists) and evolutionary anthropologists, where it is often viewed game theoretically, this has served to reinforce a view of sociality that seems somewhat narrow, and not clearly applicable to structurally simpler organisms. Perhaps we need to take seriously the idea that sociality is not a relatively recent addition to multicellular life but a more sweeping feature of many if not all biological individuals.

7. Concluding Thoughts

We began by noting both that individuals are a prominent part of the biological world and that there has been little explicit work done by either biologists or philosophers in mapping the conceptual forest composed of various kinds of biological individuals. Any hint of paradox in the conjunction of these facts is relieved by a recognition of the substantive debates that arise in the particular areas on which I have focused in the body of this article: over the nature and status of organisms (sections 2 and 3), over the correct way(s) to view biological groups and their role as units of agents of selection (section 4), over the conception and role of genes as agents of organismal development (section 5), and over the large-scale evolution of individuality itself (section 6). These debates are each sufficiently deep to warrant more discussion than I have been able to afford them here, but rather than pursuing them to their fullest extent I have aimed to use them as relatively concrete illustrations of the ways in which the biological notion of an individual manifests itself in philosophical discussion of the biological sciences.

It follows that one way to engage in further discussion that draws on the biological notion of an individual is simply to participate in the ongoing debates I have flagged here. For example, the status of organisms in the biological sciences has been the subject of a recent symposium at the PSA Biannual Meetings (Ankeny 2000, Laublicher and Wagner 2000, Richardson 2000, Shaffner 2000, J. Wilson 2000), with discussion there of the role of model organisms in biology and of the eliminability or reducibility of talk of organisms in biology, in addition to some of the topics I have discussed here. Group selection and more general discussion of the agents of selection likewise remain lively topics (Lloyd 2005, Lloyd et al. 2005, Okasha 2007, Waters 2005, R.A. Wilson 2007). And predominant conceptions of the evolution of individuality are being challenged by recent work focused on the microbial world (Woese 1998, 2000, O'Malley and Dupre 2007).

One topic for future study with less anchorage in these ongoing debates takes us from the living world in general to the small part of it that human beings occupy, and concerns the nature of human variation and our attempts to understand it. While variation is crucial to the process of natural selection in general, and there are many techniques (both mathematical and biological) for understanding it, a particular set of concepts and ideas has been used in understanding human variation in particular. Historically, we have conceptualized our own variation in terms of there being sorts or kinds of people, whether those be defined in racial, ethnic, geographic, cultural, genetic, phenotypic, economic, or other terms. Such conceptions share some distinctive features: they are often hierarchical, are often associated with positive status or negative stigma, and have often involved an explicit or implicit appeal to both norms and ideals of what it means to be human.

Since our own species is not simply the purview of the biological sciences but of much of medicine, the social sciences, and the humanities as well, more systematic reflection on this aspect of biological individuality will likely draw from, and in turn be relevant to, a wide range of disciplinary approaches to understanding human beings. Philosophers of biology and biologists themselves are especially well placed to make a significant contribution to this issue, as the following questions suggest. For example, what does the widely recognized “death of essentialism” within evolutionary biology imply about the study of human variation (Hull 1986)? In what ways does the study of genetic variation within our species constrain or even dictate how we should think about human variation more generally (Lewontin 1982)? Are there significant continuities between historically influential ways of classifying and categorizing people—in racial terms, or on the scale of feeble-mindedness (as imbeciles, idiots, and morons) and contemporary views of health, human functioning, disability and disease?


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altruism: biological | Aristotle, General Topics: biology | Darwinism | ecology: biodiversity | evolution | gene | genetics: evolutionary | life | natural selection: units and levels of | replication | self: the biological notion of | sociobiology | sortals | species