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Auguste Comte

First published Wed Oct 1, 2008

Auguste Comte (1798–1857) is the founder of positivism, a philosophical and political movement which enjoyed a very wide diffusion in the second half of the nineteenth century. It sank into an almost complete oblivion during the twentieth, when it was eclipsed by neopositivism. However, Comte's decision to develop successively a philosophy of mathematics, a philosophy of physics, a philosophy of chemistry and a philosophy of biology, makes him the first philosopher of science in the modern sense, and his constant attention to the social dimension of science resonates in many respects with current points of view. His political philosophy, on the other hand, is even less known, because it differs substantially from the classical political philosophy we have inherited.

Comte's most important works are (1) the Course on Positive Philosophy (1830-1842, six volumes, translated and condensed by Harriet Martineau as The Positive Philosophy of Auguste Comte); (2) the System of Positive Polity, or Treatise on Sociology, Instituting the Religion of Humanity, (1851-1854, four volumes); and (3) the Early Writings (1820-1829), where one can see the influence of Saint-Simon, for whom Comte served as secretary from 1817 to 1824. The Early Writings are still the best introduction to Comte's thought. In the Course, Comte said, science was transformed into philosophy; in the System, philosophy was transformed into religion. The second transformation met with strong opposition; as a result, it has become customary to distinguish, with Mill, between a “good Comte” (the author of the Course) and a “bad Comte” (the author of the System). Today's common conception of positivism corresponds mainly to what can be found in the Course.

1. Introduction

It difficult today to appreciate the interest Comte's thought enjoyed a century ago, for it has received almost no notice during the last five decades. Before the First World War, Comte's movement was active nearly everywhere in the world (Plé 1996; Simon 1963). The best known case is that of Latin America: Brazil, which owes the motto on its flag ‘Ordem e Progresso’ (Order and Progress) to Comte (Trindade 2003) and Mexico (Hale 1989) are two prominent examples. The positivists, i.e., the followers of Comte, were equally active in England (Wright 1986), the United States (Cashdollars 1989; Harp 1994) and India (Forbes 1975). And in the case of Turkey, its modern secular character can be traced to Comte's influence on the Young Turks.

None of this activity survived the First World War. The new balance of power created by the Russian Revolution left no room for positive polity, and Comtean positivism was taken over by neo-positivism in philosophy of science. The term ‘post-positivism’, used in the second half of the 20th century, demonstrates the complete disappearance of what one might call, in retrospect, “paleo-positivism”. As a matter of fact, post-positivism is a kind of “post-neo-positivism”, since the well-known criticisms launched by Kuhn and Feyerabend were directed at Carnap's neopositivism, not Comte's positivism, about which they seem to have known very little. This shows that their use of “positivism” forgets totally Comte, who is nevertheless the man who coined the term. Moreover, in a number of cases, the post-positivists simply rediscovered points that were well established in paleo-positivism (such as the need to take into account the context of justification and the social dimension of science) but subsequently forgotten.

This unexpected agreement between the paleo- and post-positivists shows that there is some enduring substance to Comte's original thinking and partially explains why Comtean studies have seen a strong revival of late (Bourdeau 2007). Philosophers and sociologists have begun to draw attention to the interesting views defended over a century and a half ago by the founder of positivism. It thus seems that the eclipse of the original positivism is nearing its end.

One quickly notices the gap between the meaning that ‘positivism’ had for Comte in the 19th century and the meaning that it has come to have in our times. Thus, contrary to what is usually thought, Comte's positivism is not a philosophy of science but a political philosophy. Or, if one prefers, Comte's positivism is a remarkable philosophy that doesn't separate philosophy of science from political philosophy. The title of what Comte always regarded as his seminal work (written in 1822 when he was only 24 years old) leaves no doubt as to the bond between science and politics: it is Plan for the Scientific Work Necessary to Reorganize Society, also called First System of Positive Polity. Its goal is the reorganization of society. Science gets involved only after politics, when Comte suggests calling in scientists to achieve that goal. So, while science plays a central role in positive polity, positivism is anything but a blind admiration for science. From 1847, positivism is placed under the ‘continuous dominance of the heart’ (la préponderance continue du coeur), and the motto ‘Order and Progress’ becomes ‘Love as principle, order as basis, progress as end’ (L'amour pour principe, l'ordre pour base et le progrès pour but). This turn, unexpected for many of his contemporaries, was in fact well motivated and is characteristic of the very dynamics of Comte's thought.

The ‘complete positivism’ of what Comte himself called his ‘second career’ has on the whole been judged severely. Very quickly, the most famous admirers of the early Course of Positive Philosophy (1830–1842), such as Mill and Littré, disavowed the author of the later System of Positive Polity (1851–1854), thereby giving substance to the idea that there is a good and a bad Comte. Nevertheless, if his early writings call for a revision of the standard interpretation of positivism, this is even more the case for the works of his ‘second career’.

From these introductory remarks, some of the main threads of what follows can already be seen. First, whatever the exact worth of the two groups of writings that surround it may be, the Course of Positive Philosophy (hereafter Course) remains Comte's major contribution. Second, an interpretation of the whole of Comte's work is confronted with two problems. The first problem concerns the unity of Comte's thought: do the first and the second career form a continuum, or is there a break? The second problem concerns Comte's relationship to Saint-Simon (see below 3.2.): is the founder of positivism merely one Saint-Simonian among others, as Durkheim maintained, or should one, as Gouhier (1933) proposed, follow Comte himself, who on this matter spoke of a ‘disastrous contact’ that had, at best, merely hindered his ‘spontaneous development’ (1830 (56), v. 2, 466)?[1].

As an approach to Comte's philosophy, the chronological order seems the most appropriate guide. After a quick review of some biographical facts, we will deal first with the Saint-Simonian period and the early writings, and then with the two great works that stand out: the Course of Positive Philosophy (six volumes, 1830–1842), and the System of Positive Polity (four volumes, 1851–1854).

2. Biography

Comte was born in Montpellier on January 20, 1798 (‘le 1er pluviôse de l'an VI’, according to the Revolutionary calendar then in use in France). Having displayed his brilliance in school, he was ranked fourth on the admissions list of the École Polytechnique in Paris in 1814. Two years later, the Bourbons closed that institution, and its students were dismissed. In August 1817, Auguste Comte met Henri de Saint-Simon, who appointed him as his secretary to replace Augustin Thierry. The young Comte was thus initiated into politics and was able to publish a great number of articles, which placed him very much in the public eye. (The most important of these articles were republished by him in 1854 and remain the best introduction to his oeuvre as a whole.) In April 1824, he broke with Saint-Simon. Shortly afterward, in a civil wedding, he married Caroline Massin, who had been living with him for several months. In April 1826, Comte began teaching a Course of Positive Philosophy, whose audience included some of the most famous scientists of the time (Fourier, A. von Humboldt, Poinsot). It was suddenly interrupted because of a ‘cerebral crisis’ due to overwork and conjugal sorrows. Comte was then hospitalized in the clinic of Dr. Esquirol. Upon leaving, he was classified as ‘not cured’. He recovered gradually, thanks to the devotion and patience of his wife.

The resumption of the Course of Positive Philosophy in January 1829, marks the beginning of a second period in Comte's life that lasted 13 years and included the publication of the six volumes of the Course (1830, 1835, 1838, 1839, 1841, 1842). In addition, during this period, more and more of his ties with the academic world were severed. After being named tutor in analysis and mechanics at the École Polytechnique in 1832, in 1833 he sought to create a chair in general history of science at the Collège de France, but to no avail. Two unsuccessful candidacies for the rank of professor at the École Polytechnique led him in 1842 to publish a ‘personal preface’ to the last volume of the Course, which put him at odds with the university world forever. The two years that followed mark a period of transition. In quick succession, Comte published an Elementary Treatise on Analytic Geometry (1843), his only mathematical work, and the Philosophical Treatise on Popular Astronomy (1844), the fruit of a yearly course, begun in 1830, for Parisian workers. The Discourse on the Positive Spirit, also from 1844, which he used as the preface to the treatise on astronomy, marked a sharp change of direction by its emphasis on the moral dimension of the new philosophy: now that the sciences had been systematized, Comte was able to return to his initial interest, political philosophy. Public recognition of the positivist Comte, as opposed to the saint-simonian, twenty years earlier, came with Émile Littré's articles in Le National.

The year 1844 also marked his first encounter with Clotilde de Vaux. What followed was the ‘year like none other’ that launched what Comte himself called his ‘second career’. The main theme of the second career was the ‘continuous dominance of the heart’. An abundant correspondence testifies to Comte's passion, who, in spite of a heavy teaching load, found the time to start working on the System of Positive Polity, which he had announced at the end of the Course. After Clotilde's death, in April 1846, Comte began to idolize her, to such an extent that it became a true cult. A few months later, his correspondence with Mill, begun in December 1841, came to an end. The next year, Comte chose the evolution of Humanity as the new topic for his public course; this was an occasion to lay down the premises of what would become the new Religion of Humanity. He was an enthusiastic supporter of the revolution of 1848: he founded the Positivist Society, modelled after the Club of the Jacobins, and published the General View of Positivism, conceived of as an introduction to the System to come, as well as the Positivist Calendar. In 1849, he founded the Religion of Humanity.

The years 1851–1854 were dominated by the publication of the four-volume System of Positive Polity, which was interrupted for a few months in order for him to write the Catechism of Positive Religion (1852). Relieved of all his duties at the École Polytechnique, Comte now lived off of the ‘voluntary subsidy’ begun by the followers of his in England and now also granted to him from various countries. In December 1851, Comte applauded the coup d'état by Napoleon III, who put an end to the parliamentary ‘anarchy’. Littré refused to follow Comte on this point, as on the question of religion, and broke with him shortly after. Soon disappointed by the Second Empire, Comte shifted his hopes to Czar Nicholas I, to whom he wrote. In 1853, Harriet Martineau published a condensed English translation of the Course of Positive Philosophy.

Disappointed by the unenthusiastic response his work got from the workers, Comte launched an Appeal to Conservatives in 1855. The next year, he published the first volume of a work on the philosophy of mathematics announced in 1842, under the new title of Subjective Synthesis, or Universal System of the Conceptions Adapted to the Normal State of Humanity. Increasingly occupied by his function as High Priest of Humanity, he sent an emissary to the Jesuits in Rome proposing an alliance with the ‘Ignacians’.

Comte died on September 5, 1857, without having had time to draft the texts announced up to 35 years before: a Treatise of Universal Education, which he thought he could publish in 1858, a System of Positive Industry, or Treatise on the Total Action of Humanity on the Planet, planned for 1861, and, finally, for 1867, a Treatise of First Philosophy. He is buried in the Père-Lachaise cemetery, where his Brazilian followers erected a statue of Humanity in 1983.

3. The Formative Years: The Collaboration with Saint-Simon and the Early Writings

The early writings remain the required starting point for everyone who wishes to understand the goal that Comte incessantly pursued. It is not without reason that on the first page of the System Comte applied to himself Alfred de Vigny's words: ‘What is a great life? A thought of youth, executed by mature age.’ His formative years were dominated by his relationship with Saint-Simon. When meeting him in 1817, Comte, like his fellow students at the École Polytechnique, had just been dismissed by Louis XVIII and was therefore looking for a job. He even thought of emigrating to the United States to teach at a school that Jefferson was planning to open and which was to be modeled on the École Polytechnique. The École Polytechnique, whose faculty included the likes of Arago, Laplace, Cauchy, and Poisson, had been for Comte what the Evangelisches Stift in Tübingen had been for Hegel. There, he got an education in science that was second to none in all of Europe; it left a permanent imprint on him. But he was equally a typical representative of the generation of Tocqueville and Guizot that saw itself confronted with the question of how to stop the Revolution after the collapse of the Empire. ‘How,’ as Comte would put it in 1848, ‘does one reorganize human life, irrespectively of God and king’? (1851, v. 1, 127; E., v. 1, 100) It is from this perspective that his profound hostility towards classical political philosophy —philosophy that we continue to respect today— has to be understood. With its insistence on freedom of conscience and on the sovereignty of the people (souveraineté populaire), the revolutionary doctrine had no other function than to destroy the Ancien Régime (founded on papal authority and monarchy by divine right). But in that task it had now succeeded. The moment had come for reconstruction, and it was hard to see how these weapons could be of use in such work.

Under these circumstances, it is not surprising that the young Comte turned to Saint-Simon. The latter, taking advantage of the relative freedom of the press granted by Louis XVIII, published more and more pamphlets and magazines, and therefore needed a collaborator. Comte took over three ideas from the complex thought of Saint-Simon:

  1. The contrast between organic and critical periods in history, of which the Revolution had just provided an example.
  2. The idea of industrial society. In 1817, under the influence, notably, of B. Constant and J.-B. Say, Saint-Simon had turned himself into an apostle of industry. As an attentive observer of the industrial revolution that was going on before his eyes, he understood that it would completely change all existing social relations. Heretofore, we had lived in military societies: man acted on man, and power belonged to the warrior class. Henceforth, trade would replace war, and man would mainly concern himself with acting on nature. Comte drew the quite mistaken conclusion that the era of wars was over (Aron 1957).
  3. The idea of spiritual power. This is Comte's most obvious debt to Saint-Simon. The theme was present from the first work by Saint-Simon (Letters from an Inhabitant of Geneva to his Contemporaries, 1803) to the last (The New Christianity, 1825). It resulted from an observation and a conviction. Saint-Simon observed the role of science in modern society: he suggested, for example, that public funds be made available to finance scientific research. He was also convinced of the religious nature of social cohesion and, therefore, of the need for a priestly class in charge of maintaining it. This belief led him to the idea of a science of social organization, linking these two components: religion would become an application of science, permitting enlightened men to govern the ignorant. So, instead of trying to destroy every form of religious life, one should entrust to the learned the spiritual power left weakened by the decline of traditional religions. It is also within this framework that the text he wrote in 1814 on the reorganization of European society has to be understood: handling international relations are one of the main attributes of spiritual power, as shown by the medieval papacy.

Comte quickly assimilated what Saint-Simon had to offer him. But Comte aspired to free himself of a tutelage that weighed ever heavier on him, as he found the unmethodical and fickle mind of the self-taught, philanthropic aristocrat barely tolerable. The break occurred in 1824, occasioned by a shorter work of Comte that would prove to be fundamental. Aware of already possessing the main ideas of his own philosophy, Comte accused his teacher of trying to appropriate his work and furthermore, he pointed out that he had not contented himself with giving a systematic form to borrowed concepts. The Philosophical Considerations on the Sciences and the Scientists (1825) contains the first and classical formulations of the two cornerstones of positivism: the law of the three stages, and the classification of the sciences. The Considerations on Spiritual Power that followed some months later presents dogmatism as the normal state of the human mind. It is not difficult to find behind that statement, which may seem outrageous to us, the anti-Cartesianism that Comte shares with Peirce and that brings their philosophies closer to one another. As the mind spontaneously stays with what seems true to it, the irritation of doubt ceases when belief is fixed; what is in need of justification, one might say, is not the belief but the doubt. Thus the concept of positive faith is brought out, that is to say, the necessity of a social theory of belief and its correlate, the logical theory of authority.

In the year 1826 two major events take place. First, Comte's program was reshaped. The first System of 1822 was unfinished, and writing the remaining part was one of Comte's priorities. But in 1826 he postponed that project for an indeterminate period. To provide a more solid base for the social science and its resulting positive polity, he decided first to go through the whole of positive knowledge again and to begin a course on positive philosophy. It should be kept in mind that the Course does not belong to Comte's initial program and that it originally was meant as a parenthesis, or prelude, that was supposed to take a few years at most. The second major event of 1826, the famous ‘cerebral crisis’ which occurred immediately after the opening lecture of the course forced Comte to stop his public lessons; but it also had longstanding effects. Thus it is customary to say that Comte received public acknowledgement only belatedly: in 1842, with the first letter from Mill, and in 1844, with the articles of Littré in Le National. But that amounts to forgetting that in 1826 Comte was a well-known personality in the intellectual circles of Paris. Guizot and Lamennais held him in high esteem. The Course's attendance list included prestigious names such as A. von Humboldt, Arago, Broussais or Fourier. Mill, who had visited Saint-Simon in 1820–21, was deeply impressed by the first System, which one of Comte's pupils had introduced him to in 1829 (Mill 1963, v. 12, 34). Finally, even though Comte had broken with Saint-Simon, the general public saw him as one of the master's most authoritative spokesmen. This earned him the somewhat peculiar animosity of the Saint-Simonians: they, with few exceptions, had the distinctive characteristic of never having personally known the one they called ‘the father’, whereas Comte had been on intimate terms with him. However, the cerebral crisis made Comte unable to take advantage of the high regard he enjoyed: he disappeared from the public scene until 1844.

4. The Course on Positive Philosophy and the Friendship with Mill

As said in its first lesson, the Course pursues two goals. The first, a specific one, is a foundation for sociology, then called ‘social physics’. The second, a general goal, is the coordination of the whole of positive knowledge. The structure of the work reflects this duality: the first three volumes examine the five fundamental sciences then in existence (mathematics, astronomy, physics, chemistry, biology), and the final three volumes deal with the social sciences. Executing the two parts did not require the same amount of work. In the first case, the sciences had already been formed and it was just a matter of summarizing their main doctrinal and methodological points. In the other case, however, all was still to be done, and Comte was well aware that he was founding a new science.

4.1 The law of the three stages

The structure of the Course explains why the law of the three stages (which is often the only thing known about Comte) is stated twice. Properly speaking, the law belongs to dynamic sociology or theory of social progress, and this is why it serves as an introduction to the long history lessons in the fifth and sixth volumes. But it equally serves as an introduction to the work as a whole, to the extent that its author considers this law the best way to explain what positive philosophy is.

The law states that, in its development, humanity passes through three successive stages: the theological, the metaphysical, and the positive. The first is the necessary starting point for the human mind; the last, its normal state; the second is but a transitory stage that makes possible the passage from the first to the last. In the theological stage, the human mind, in its search for the primary and final causes of phenomena, explains the apparent anomalies in the universe as interventions of supernatural agents. The second stage is only a simple modification of the first: the questions remain the same, but in the answers supernatural agents are replaced by abstract entities. In the positive state, the mind stops looking for causes of phenomena, and limits itself strictly to laws governing them; likewise, absolute notions are replaced by relative ones. Moreover, if one considers material development, the theological stage may also be called military, and the positive stage industrial; the metaphysical stage corresponds to a supremacy of the lawyers and jurists.[2].

This relativism of the third stage is the most characteristic property of positivism. It is often mistakenly identified with scepticism, but our earlier remark about dogmatism prevents us from doing so.

For Comte, science is a “connaissance approchée”: it comes closer and closer to truth, without reaching it. There is no place for absolute truth, but neither are there higher standards for the fixation of belief. Comte is here quite close to Peirce in his famous 1877 paper.

The law of the three stages belongs to those grand philosophies of history elaborated in the 19th century, which now seem quite alien to us (for a different opinion, see Schmaus (1982)). The idea of progress of Humanity appears to us as the expression of an optimism that the events of the 20th century have done much to reduce (Bourdeau 2006). More generally, the notion of a law of history is problematic (even though it did not seem so to Mill (1842, bk. VI, chap. X)). Already Durkheim felt forced to exclude social dynamics from sociology, in order to give it a truly scientific status.

These difficulties, however, are far from fatal to this aspect of Comte's thought. Putting aside the fact that the idea of moral progress is slowly regaining some support, it is possible to interpret the three stages as forms of the mind that co-exist whose relative importance varies in time. This interpretation seems to be offered by Comte himself, who gives several examples of it in his history lessons. The germs of positivity were present from the beginning of the theological stage; with Descartes, the whole of natural philosophy reaches the positive stage, while moral philosophy remains in the metaphysical stage (1830 (58), v. 2, 714–715).

4.2 The classification of the sciences and philosophy of science

The second pillar of positive philosophy, the law of the classification of the sciences, has withstood the test of time much better than the law of the three stages. Of the various classifications that have been proposed, it is Comte's that is still the most popular today. This classification, too, structures the Course, which examines each of the six fundamental sciences—mathematics, astronomy, physics, chemistry, biology, sociology—in turn. It provides a way to do justice to the diversity of the sciences without thereby losing sight of their unity. This classification also makes Comte the founder of the philosophy of science in the modern sense. From Plato to Kant, reflection on science had always occupied a central place in philosophy, but the sciences had to be sufficiently developed for their diversity to manifest itself. It was thanks to his education at the École Polytechnique that Comte, from 1818, began to develop the concept of a philosophy of science. At about the same time Bolzano wrote his Wissenschaftslehre (1834) and Mill his System of Logic (1843), Comte's Course presented in sequence a philosophy of mathematics, of astronomy, of physics, of chemistry, of biology, and of sociology. Comte's classification is meant not to restore a chimerical unity, but to avoid the fragmentation of knowledge. Thanks to it, the sciences are related to one another in an encyclopedic scale that goes from the general to the particular, and from the simple to the complex: moving from mathematics to sociology, generality decreases and complexity increases.

The law of classification of the sciences also has a historical aspect: it gives us the order in which the sciences develop. For example, astronomy requires mathematics, and chemistry requires physics. Each science thus rests upon the one that precedes it. As Comte puts it, the higher depends on the lower, but is not its result. The recognition of an irreducible diversity already contains a disavowal of reductionism (in Comte's wording: ‘materialism’), which the classification allows one to make explicit. The positivist clearly sees that the tendency towards reductionism is fed by the development of scientific knowledge itself, where each science participates in the evolution of the next; but history also teaches us that each science, in order to secure its own subject matter, has to fight invasions by the preceding one. ‘Thus it appears that Materialism is a danger inherent in the mode in which the scientific studies necessary as a preparation for Positivism were pursued. Each science tended to absorb the one next to it, on the grounds of having reached the positive stage earlier and more thoroughly.’ (1851, v. 1, 50; E., v. 1, 39)

While philosophers of science have always recognized the place of Comte in the history of their discipline, the philosophy of science presented in the Course, and a fortiori the one in the System, have hardly been studied (Laudan 1981). Comte's philosophy of science is based on a systematic difference between method and doctrine. These are, to use Comtean terminology, opposed to one another, as the logical point of view and the scientific point of view. Method is presented as superior to doctrine: scientific doctrines change (that is what “progress” means), but the value of science lies in its methods. At the level of doctrine, mathematics has a status of its own, well indicated in the second lesson, where it is presented last, and as if to make up for something forgotten. As much as it is itself a body of knowledge, it is an instrument of discovery in the other sciences, an ‘organon’ in the Aristotelian sense. Among the remaining sciences, leaving sociology aside for the moment, two occupy a pre-eminent place:

Astronomy and biology are, by their nature, the two principal branches of natural philosophy. They, the complement of each other, include the general system of our fundamental conceptions in their rational harmony. The solar system and Man are the extremes within which our ideas will forever be included. The system first, and then Man, according to the course of our speculative reason: and the reverse in the active process: the laws of the system determining those of Man, and remaining unaffected by them. (1830 (40), v. 1, 717–718; E., v. 1, 384)

The positive method comes in different forms, according to the science where it is applied: in astronomy it is observation, in physics experimentation, in biology comparison. The same point of view is also behind the general theory of hypotheses in the 28th lesson, a centerpiece of the positive philosophy of science.

Finally, classification is the key to a theory of technology. The reason is that there exists a systematic connection between complexity and modifiability: the more complex a phenomenon is, the more modifiable it is. The order of nature is a modifiable order. Human action takes place within the limits fixed by nature and consists in replacing the natural order by an artificial one. Comte's education as an engineer had made him quite aware of the links between science and its applications, which he summarized in an oft-quoted slogan: ‘From science comes prevision, from prevision comes action’. Only death prevented him from writing the System of Positive Industry, or Treatise on the Total Action of Humanity on the Planet, announced as early as 1822.

4.3 Sociology and its double status

Sociology has a double status. It is not just one science among the others, as though there is the science of society just as there is a science of living beings. Rather, sociology is the science that comes after all the others; and as the final science, it must assume the task of coordinating the development of the whole of knowledge. With sociology, positivity takes possession of the last domain that had heretofore escaped it and had been considered forever inaccessible to it. Many people thought that social phenomena are so complex that there can be no science of them. Dilthey's idea of Geisteswissenschaft, for instance, is explicitly directed against positivism and maintains the difference between natural philosophy and moral philosophy. On the contrary, according to Comte, this distinction, introduced by the Greeks, is abolished by the existence of sociology, and the unity that was lost with the birth of metaphysics restored (1830 (58), v. 2, 713–715).

Founding social science therefore constitutes a turn in the history of humanity. Until then, the positive spirit was characterized by the objective method, which works its way from the world to man; but as this goal has now been reached, it becomes possible to invert that direction and go from man to world, to adopt, in other words, the subjective method, which so far had been associated with the anthropomorphism of theology. To legitimize that method, it suffices to substitute sociology for theology, — which is equivalent to substituting the relative for the absolute: whereas God may say to the soul, as in the Imitatio, “I am necessary to you and you are useless to me”, Humanity[3] is the most dependent of all beings. In the first case, to say that God need us is blasphemy: it would be denying his perfection. The second case is in some respects a mere consequence of the classification of sciences, if we agree to consider humanity as the proper object of sociology. Each science depends on the precedent; as the final science, sociology is the most dependent one. Human life depends for instance on astronomical conditions. Humanity depends also on each of us, on what we do and not do; on another sense, of course, each of us depends on humanity, as said by the law of human order: les vivants sont nécessairement et de plus en plus gouvernés par les morts.

To bring out this eminent place of sociology is the principal aim of the General Conclusions of the Course. The 58th lesson raises the question of which science presides over the others on the encyclopedic scale. To guarantee the harmonious development of the various sciences taken together, the dominance of one among them has to be assumed. Until recently, that role had been played by mathematics, but ‘it will not be forgotten that a cradle is not a throne’ (1830 (58), v. 2, 718; E., v. 2, 510) (Bourdeau 2004). One should distinguish the first blossoming of the positive spirit from its systematic development. The human point of view, that is to say, the social point of view, is the only one that is truly universal; now that sociology is born, it is up to it to be in charge of the development of knowledge.

It goes without saying that Comte's idea of sociology was very different from the current one. To ensure the positivity of their discipline, sociologists have been quick to renounce its coordinating function, also known as encyclopedic or architectonic function, which characterizes philosophy. With its place at the top of the scale, the sociology of the Course recapitulates the whole of knowledge, while the sciences that precede it are but one immense introduction to this final science. As a consequence, no one can become a sociologist without having had a solid encyclopedic education, one that has no place for economics or social mathematics, but, on the contrary, emphasizes biology, the first science that deals with organized beings. How far removed this is from today's sociology curriculum!

If sociology merges at places with philosophy, it is also closely related to history. Comte was thus led to take a stand on a question that deeply divides us today: how should the relations among philosophy of science, history of science, and sociology of science be seen? In the Course, history is at once everywhere and nowhere: it is not a discipline, but the method of sociology. Dynamic sociology is ‘a history without names of men, or even of people’ (1830 (52), v. 2, 239). It is easy to understand, then, that positivism has always refused to separate the philosophy of science from the history of science. According to positivism, one does not really know a science until one knows its history; indeed, it was a chair in the general history of science that Comte had asked Guizot to create for him at the Collège de France. Mill's position was not quite the same, for he took the author of the Course to task for neglecting the production of proof, or, to use modern vocabulary, for being more interested in the context of discovery than in the context of justification (Mill 1865). The criticism is only partly legitimate: from the second lesson in the Course, Comte carefully distinguishes between the doctrinal and the historical study of science, opting for the first while leaving the second for the lessons in sociology. Just as for Comte the philosophy of science is not a philosophy of nature but of the mind, he likewise values the history of science less as a subject in its own right than as the ‘most important, yet so far most neglected part’ of the development of Humanity (1830 (2), v. 1, 53). Each science is therefore examined twice in the Course: for its own sake, in the first three volumes; in its relations to the general development of society, in the final three. In this way, Comte succeeds in reconciling the internalist and externalist points of view, usually considered to be incompatible.

4.4 Comte and Mill

The Course's first readers are to be found in Great Britain; the reform projects of the English Radicals had many points in common with the positivist concerns. A reading of the first volumes made enough of an impression on Mill to induce him to write to their author. The correspondence that followed, which lasted from 1841 to 1846, is of considerable philosophical interest. In his first letter, Mill presents himself almost as a follower of Comte and recalls how, some ten years before, it had been the reading of Comte's 1822 work that had liberated him from the influence of Bentham. But the tone of the letters, while remaining friendly, soon changes. Mill does not hesitate to voice objections to the exclusion of psychology from the classification of the sciences and to Comte's conception of biology. In particular, Mill had strong reservations about Gall's phrenology, while Comte endorsed it, and proposed to replace it by ethology. Their disagreements crystallize around ‘la question féminine’,that is the status of women in society, where it is possible to see how epistemological and political considerations are linked (Guillin 2007).

Even though each new edition of Mill's System of Logic saw fewer references to the Course than the previous one (in the first edition there had been more than a hundred), the influence of Comte on Mill ran deep, to an extent that today is greatly underestimated (Raeder 2002). Mill's Autobiography is quite explicit on this point, as Comte figures much more prominently in it than Tocqueville, with whom Mill had been in contact for a longer time. Conversely, Mill contributed much to the spreading of positivism. His book on Comte (Mill 1865) enjoyed a considerable success, and he himself was often considered a positivist.

5. The System of Positive Polity and the Complete Positivism

Soon after finishing the Course, Comte returned to his initial project and began outlining the System of Positive Polity. The Discourse on the Positive Spirit, which had served as the preface to the Philosophical Treatise on Popular Astronomy (1844), had already emphasized the social purpose of positivism and its aptitude to replace theology in politics and morality. But his encounter with Clotilde de Vaux would turn his life upside down and give Comte's second career an unexpected twist.

5.1 The mind as a servant of the heart

After Clotilde's death in 1846, positivism was transformed into “complete positivism”, which is ‘continuous dominance of the heart’ (la prépondérance continue du Coeur). ‘We tire of thinking and even of acting; we never tire of loving’, as the dedication to the System put it. Positivism transformed science into philosophy; complete positivism now transforms philosophy into religion. The question wether such a move is consistent with Comte's former ideas and more generaly with positivism was asked very early. Mill and Littré answered negatively and complete positivism was never very popular.

The transformation of philosophy into religion does not yield a religion of science because, having overcome modern prejudices, Comte now unhesitatingly ranks art above science. Now that the break-up with the academic world was complete, the positivists placed their hopes on an alliance with women and proletarians. Comte (who after Clotilde's death obsessively, even cultishly, devoted himself to her) reserved a decisive role in the positive era for women. However, this aspect of his work is difficult to accept for a contemporary reader, in particular because it involves the utopian idea of the virgin mother, which means parthenogenesis for human beings. As for the proletarians, he saw them as spontaneous positivists, just as the positivists were systematic proletarians!

The mind, then, is not destined to rule but to serve, not, however, as the slave of the heart, but as its servant (Bourdeau 2000). Science thus retains an essential function. The dominance of the heart is founded biologically in the ‘positive classification of the eighteen internal functions of the brain, or systematic view of the soul’ (1851, v. 1, 726; E., v. 1, 594–95). The cerebral table distinguishes ten affective forces, five intellectual functions, and three practical qualities; these correspond to the heart, mind, and character, respectively. The functions being ordered according to increasing energy and decreasing dignity, the dominance of the heart can be considered a datum from positive biology. This classification is indispensable for an understanding of the System. It should be mentioned in passing that it shows that the exclusion of psychology does not at all have the meaning usually given to it: Comte had never refused to study man's higher functions, be they intellectual or moral, but for him this belongs to biology (the classification is sometimes also referred to as the ‘cerebral table’), and so does not require the creation of a new science (1830 (45)). Historically, the conception of the System began with this table, of which different versions were elaborated in succession from 1846. Conceptually, it is the first application of the subjective method, understood as feedback from sociology to the sciences that precede it, starting with the nearest. In this way, the sociologist helps the biologist define the cerebral functions, a task in which, most often, the biologist simply takes up again the divisions of folk psychology. Later, in what has become known as the ‘letters on illness’, Comte likewise proposes a sociological definition of the brain, as the organ through which dead people act on living ones.

5.2 The religion of Humanity

The System's subtitle is Treatise on Sociology Instituting the Religion of Humanity. While the different forms of deism preserve the idea of God and dissolve religion into a vague religiosity, Comte proposes exactly the contrary: a religion with neither God nor the supernatural. His project had little success; he even accomplished a tour de force by uniting both believers and non-believers against him. The many ridiculous details of Comte's religion made the task of his opponents even easier. But this aspect of Comte's thought deserves better than the discredit into which it has fallen (Wernick 2000; de Lubac 1945).

Comte defines religion as ‘the state of complete harmony peculiar to human life […] when all the parts of Life are ordered in their natural relations to each other’ (1851, v. 2, 8; E.,v. 2, 8). Comte also defines religion as a consensus, analogous to what health is for the body. Religion has two functions, according to the point of view from which one considers existence: in its moral function, religion should govern each individual; in its political function, it should unite all individuals. Religion also has three components, corresponding to the threefold division of the cerebral table: doctrine, worship, and moral rule (discipline). Comte's discussion is mainly about the first two. If one considers the first to be related to faith and the second to love, their relation takes two forms: ‘Love comes first and leads us to the faith, so long as the growth is spontaneous; but when it becomes systematic, then the belief is constructed in order to regulate the action of love’ (1852, v. 2, 152; E., v. 2, 83). At first, Comte had followed the traditional order and presented doctrine before worship, but he soon gave priority to worship, and saw this change as a considerable step forward.

In the positivist religion, worship, doctrine and moral rule all have the same object, namely Humanity, which must be loved, known, and served. Already the General Conclusions of the Course compared the concept of Humanity to that of God, affirming the moral superiority of the former. But only in 1847 does Comte make the substitution explicitly; sociological synthesis comes to replace theological synthesis. Membership of Humanity is sociological, not biological. In order to belong to what is defined as the continuous whole of convergent beings — Comte's term for (mainly human) beings who tend to agree — one has to be worthy of it. All ‘producers of dung’ are excluded; conversely, animals that have rendered important services can be included. Strictly speaking, it is to sociology that one should turn for knowledge of the laws of the human order but, as the final science recapitulates all others, it is the whole encyclopedic scale (échelle ; it is the result of the classification of sciences), that constitutes the doctrine of the new religion, which thereby becomes demonstrated and is no longer revealed or inspired.

The principal novelty of Comte's religion therefore resides in worship, which is both private (taking place within the family) and public. The positivists set up a whole system of prayers, hymns, and sacraments (Wright 1986). As these were all largely inspired by Catholic worship, it was said that it was ‘catholicism without Christ’, to which the positivists replied that it was ‘catholicism plus science’. The best known and most original aspects of Comte's religion are found in its public worship, and in the positivist liturgical calendar. As Humanity consists more of dead than living beings, positivism designed a whole system of commemorations, which were to develop the sense of Humanity's historical continuity. Thus, the worship of Humanity takes is the worship of great men. Unlike the French revolutionary calendar, which followed the rhythm of the seasons, the positivist calendar takes its inspiration from history and pays homage to great men from all nations and all times.

The wish to maintain the distinction between temporal and spiritual powers led Comte and his followers to demand the separation of Church and State. It has been noticed less often, however, that the two forms of power stand in differing relations to space. The religious society is by its nature catholic, in the sense of universal, and therefore has no boundaries other than those of the planet; the surface of a State meets different demands, which impose rather strict geographic limits. The contrast between French political history and English political history, which was a common place in Comte's time (see for instance Tocqueville or Guizot; it is already present in Montesquieu and Voltaire) illustrates the point : there is no separation of Church and State in Great Britain, in that sense that the Queen is also the head of the Anglican Church. Nevertheless, its main application is related to the issue: centralization against local powers, which is another aspect of the spatial dimension of politics. Of the two political models constantly confronted in the Course, Comte clearly prefers the French one. Its characteristic alliance of the monarchy with the people against the aristocracy was accompanied by a centralization that the Revolution contented itself with consolidating. One might therefore be led to believe that Comte was a partisan of centralized political (that is: temporal) power, whereas the contrary was in fact the case, as he proposed to divide France into seventeen administrative regions, more or less equivalent to the old provinces (1851, v. 4, 421; Vernon 1984). Centralization applies only to the spiritual power.

5.3 Ethics and sociology

Positivism asserted very early its wish to construct a moral doctrine that owes nothing to the supernatural. If we need a spiritual power, it is because social questions are quite often moral rather than political. The reforms of society must be made in a determined order: one has to change ideas, then morals (les moeurs; the word is difficult to translate: it is something like ways of acting, habits, les us et coutumes), and only then institutions. But with the System, the moral doctrine (ethics) changes status and becomes a science, whose task is to extend sociology in order to take individual phenomena into account, in particular affective ones.

The terms of the problem as well as its solution are given by a saying to be found in the margin of the cerebral table: “Act from affection and think in order to act” (1851, v. 1, 726; E., v. 1, 594). The first part of this “systematic verse” is guaranteed by the dominance of the heart; but, among the ten “affective forces”, the first seven correspond to egoism, the final three to altruism. The whole question is knowing which ones would prevail, those of “personality” or those of “sociability”. While it is important to acknowledge the innateness of the sympathetic instincts, one is forced to admit their native weakness: the supremacy of the egoistic tendencies is so clear that it is itself one of the most striking traits in our nature. The great human problem is to reverse the natural order and to teach ourselves to live for others.

The solution consists in ‘regulating the inside through the outside’ and depends, as a consequence, on a good use of the mind. The only way in which altruism can win, is to ally itself with the mind, to make it its servant and not its slave. The heart, without the light of reason, is blind. Left to itself, affectivity is characterized by its inconsistency and instability. That is why the inside has to be regulated, that is, disciplined. And this task is assigned to the outside, because exterior reality is the best of regulators. Whatever its own defects may be, the order that science discloses in nature is, by its indifference to our desires, a source of discipline. The recognition of an unchanging external order thus becomes ‘the objective base of true human wisdom’, and ‘in the obligation to conform themselves to it’ our affections find ‘a source of fixedness appropriate for controlling their spontaneous capriciousness, and a direct stimulation to the dominance of the sympathetic instincts’ (1851, v. 1, 322; E., v. 1, 257). Science now finds itself vested with a moral function; but that also means that ‘thoughts must be systematized before feelings’ (1851, v. 1, 21; E., v. 1, 17) and that, if moral ascendancy is the primary attribute of the spiritual power, that power would not be able to carry out its duties without the aid of a superior intellect.

While developing a science of morals founded on moral doctrine, Durkheim and Lévy-Bruhl were heavily dependent upon this aspect of the System. Like the word ‘sociology’, the word ‘altruism’ was coined by Comte. Being deeply aware of what man and animals have in common, Comte was close to what is known today as ‘evolutionary ethics’: he saw cooperation between men as continuous with phenomena of which biology gives us further examples. The same interest in biology led him to link medicine to moral doctrine and even to religion. In our modern societies, the study of the human being ‘is now irrationally parcelled out amongst three classes of thinkers: the Physicians, who study only the body; the Philosophers, who imagine to study the mind; and the Priests, who specially study the heart’ (1852, v. 2, 437; E., v. 2, 356). To remedy this and to respect the unity of our nature, he proposed giving the new clergy a role in medicine, considering for example that there is no better endorsement of a rule of hygiene than a religious decree. Before dying, he still had the time to outline, in his letters to Audiffrent, the rudiments of a sociological theory of diseases.

6. Conclusion

After his death, Comte's influence depended more on dissident followers than on orthodox positivists such as Pierre Lafitte in France and Richard Congreve and Frederic Harrison in England.

On the whole, the System was not well received. Almost immediately, Mill and Littré put forward the idea that there were a good Comte, the author of the Course, and a bad Comte, the author of the System. However, it is impossible to confine oneself merely to the Course. The early works had made a strong impression on some of the best minds of the time; they remain required reading for everyone wishing to understand positive philosophy, as they are still among the best introductions to the subject. The Course was not part of the initial project, which Comte never lost sight of; the work is best considered as a parenthesis, admittedly open for twenty years, but which Comte had meant to close very quickly. The reason why Comte had always presented the Plan of 1822 as fundamental is that, beginning with the very title, one finds the two themes that he planned to think through in their relation to one another: science and society. The foremost question is a political one: how should society be reorganized? Science, although present from the beginning, plays a secondary role as the means to achieve the chosen goal. All of Comte's work aims at the foundation of a discipline in which the study of society will finally become positive, scientific. His idea of sociology is not quite the one we are used to today; but the current meaning of the term ‘positivism’, according to which it is merely a philosophy of science, is even more misleading as a clue to Comte's thought. Even though the founder of positivism is rightly considered to be one of the great philosophers of science, along with Poincaré and Carnap, his natural place is elsewhere, along with sociologists such as his contemporaries Marx and Tocqueville. Only when the question arises of what distinguishes Comte from the latter does science enter into the picture.

The limits of Comte's philosophy of science are easily seen, but this does not diminish their value, which remains considerable. Yet the same cannot be said of the positive polity. Given that the separation of spiritual power and temporal power rests on the separation between theory and practice, Comte abstained from any direct political action, and, for example, condemned Mill's decision to stand in parliament. But his own project for the reorganization of society presents a similar problem. In his writings, it is difficult to distinguish that which concerns objective social science from a reform program that reflects only a personal stand.

Apart from that difficulty, the weaknesses of the positive polity are numerous. Among them, those that are the most conspicuous (criticism of human rights, praise of dictatorship) are not necessarily the most serious, for objections to the former are easily answered. For example, while Comte criticizes freedom of conscience, he is always highly supportive of freedom of expression. We should also find his deep respect for spontaneity reassuring, considering that it is an important part of our idea of freedom. More serious, perhaps, seem to be the consequences of the rejection of psychology. The moral question, ‘What should I do?’, is no longer asked in the first person, and is transformed into an engineering problem: ‘What should be done to make men more ethical?’ Similarly, the positivists were invited to live openly, whereby the distinction between private and public lives disappears.

However, considering only the weaknesses of the positive polity would not be fair. Even if Comte was often mistaken, his theory of consensus, as well as the seriousness with which he considered the question ‘What religion after the death of God?’ (to give but two examples) are likely to help us resolve certain problems confronting our society. Comte's thought is resolutely oriented toward the future. The order of time, he said, is not past-present-future, but rather past-future-present. The latter, being only ‘a vague and fleeting span which fills the interval between two immensities of duration, and binds them together […], can only be properly conceived with the aid of the two extremes which it unites and separates’ (1851, v. 2, 364; E., v. 2, 296). He who wrote ‘from out of an anticipated grave’ (1857, ix) concluded that positive utopias were useful (De Boni 1997). Various signs lead one to think that, in the near future, we will witness a better reception of this aspect of Comte's philosophy.


Primary Literature

A standard edition of Comte's works does not yet exist and some of the most important ones (the second part of the Course of Positive Philosophy, the whole System of Positive Polity) have been unavailable for many years (in the case of the System, for more than fifty years). The most complete edition, which is an anastatic reprint of previously published volumes (essentially 1830–1842 and 1851–1854), is:

On the other hand, English positivists (Harriet Martineau, Richard Congreve, John H. Bridges, Edward S. Bessly, Frederic Harrisson) translated in the second half of the 19th century the most important works. So, after the original text, we give the reference to these English translations, even if they are not easily accessible.


Works of Mill

While reading Comte, it is useful to have continual reference to Mill, especially:

Secondary literature

Other Internet Resources

Related entries

altruism | authority | consensus | history, philosophy of | metaphysics | Mill, John Stuart | progress | religion: philosophy of | scientific knowledge: social dimensions of


Many thanks to Mark van Atten for the English translation, and to Béatrice Fink and Mary Pickering for revision of the translation and many helpful comments.