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Externalism About Mental Content

First published Mon Oct 21, 2002; substantive revision Thu Jul 24, 2008

Many of our mental states such as beliefs and desires are intentional mental states, or mental states with content. Externalism with regard to mental content says that in order to have certain types of intentional mental states (e.g. beliefs), it is necessary to be related to the environment in the right way. Internalism (or individualism) denies this, and it affirms that having those intentional mental states depends solely on our intrinsic properties. This debate has important consequences with regard to philosophical and empirical theories of the mind, and the role of social institutions and the physical environment in constituting the mind. It also raises other interesting questions concerning such matters as the explanatory relevance of content and the possibility of a priori self-knowledge.


In its most general formulation, externalism with regard to a property K is a thesis about how K is individuated. It says that whether a creature has K or not depends in part on facts about how the creature is related to its external environment. In other words, it is metaphysically possible that there are two intrinsically indistinguishable creatures, only one of which has property K, as a result of them being situated in different environment. To give a trivial example, externalism is true of mosquito bites since having them requires having been bitten by a mosquito. A mark on the skin created by careful micro-surgery is not a mosquito bite, even if it is intrinsically indistinguishable from a real one.

Individualism or internalism with respect to a property K says that whether a creature has K or not supervenes on its intrinsic properties only. It follows that facts about the environment play no role in determining whether or not the creature has property K. Notice that internalism does not deny that the environment can causally affect whether something has K. For example, external factors such as exposure to radiation can cause cancer in an individual, but having cancer is still an internal physical state.

This article reviews the externalism vs. internalism debate about mental content. An intentional mental state is a mental state of a particular psychological type with some particular mental content. For example, believing that it is raining and hoping that it is raining are intentional mental states with the same content but of distinct psychological types. Whereas believing that it is raining and believing that it is sunny are states with distinct contents but of the same psychological type.

For the purpose of discussion, knowledge will not count as a psychological type. Externalism is clearly true of knowledge of the environment, since one can know that it is raining outside only if it is indeed raining outside. But this kind of externalism is not too interesting. Externalism is true here only in part because knowledge requires veridical contents. What is controversial is whether externalism extends to mental states belonging to psychological types which do not have such a requirement, e.g. intentions, beliefs and desires. This is what the externalism debate on mental content is about. If having a mental state of psychological type T and content C supervenes purely on the intrinsic properties of a subject, then internalism is true of that mental state, and its mental content is said to be “narrow”. Otherwise, externalism is true of that mental state and its content is said to be “wide” or “broad”.

Among intentional mental states, a distinction is sometimes drawn between those that are de dicto (of the dictum or proposition) and those that are de re (of the thing). De re mental states, usually ascribed in English with an of or about locution (e.g. ‘Smith believes of (about) the water in his glass that it is thirst-quenching.’) are, like states of knowing, fairly straightforwardly externalist, since believing of x that it has some property apparently requires x’s existence, and x will often be some object or kind in the creature’s external environment. Externalism about de dicto intentional mental states, those ascribed in English with ‘that-clauses,’ (e.g. ‘Smith believes that the water in his glass is thirst-quenching.’) is the controversial variety. (See the entry on propositional attitude reports and its supplement on the de re/de dicto distinction.)

There is an interesting question concerning how to understand the crucial distinction between a creature’s external properties and those that are intrinsic or internal. Many contributors to the debate over externalism take internal properties to be physical properties of a creature that do not depend for their instantiation on any property instantiated outside the boundary of the creature’s body and brain, and this is how the distinction will be understood here. However, a difficulty with this understanding of the distinction, pointed out by Farkas (2003), is that it appears to rule out the possibility of antiphysicalist internalists. This is ironic, given that Descartes is often held up as a paradigmatic example of an internalist about mental content. Williamson (2000) suggests that internalism can also be understood as the doctrine that mental content supervenes on environmentally-independent phenomenal states, and Farkas (2003) makes a similar proposal.

2. The Classic Arguments for Externalism

The most well-known arguments for externalism typically make use of thought-experiments where physically identical individuals are embedded in different social or physical environment. It is then argued that some beliefs and thoughts are possessed by one individual but not the other. This shows that some mental contents fail to supervene on intrinsic facts, and so externalism is true.

Many of these thought experiments were inspired by the related discussion on semantic externalism, the thesis that the meaning and reference of some of the words we use are not solely determined by the ideas we associate with them or by our internal physical state. In Kripke (1972), it was argued that the reference of proper names and natural kinds is determined in part by external causal and historical factors. In the famous “Twin Earth” thought experiment in Putnam (1975), we are asked to imagine that in 1750, there was a remote planet, Twin Earth, which was exactly like Earth except that instead of water (H2O), it had a different substance twin-water, say a different chemical compound XYZ. The macro properties of XYZ are supposed to be just like water : it looks and tastes like water, and it could be found in the rivers and oceans on Twin Earth, and so on. However, back in 1750 nobody on Earth or Twin Earth could distinguish between water and XYZ. Still, according to Putnam, an individual on Earth in 1750 who used the word “water” would have been referring to H2O and not XYZ. Of course, this person did not know that water is H2O. But according to the externalist, this should not have prevented him from referring to H2O when he used the term “water”. If he had pointed to a sample of XYZ and said “That's water,” he would have said something false. Similarly, when an individual on Twin Earth in 1750 used the word “water”, he would have been referring to XYZ and not H2O.

Although such a thought experiment was designed to establish semantic externalism, it can be extended to mental contents as well (see McGinn(1977)). Thus, consider an individual on Earth who sincerely uttered “water quenches thirst” before 1750. Such an individual would be expressing his belief that water quenches thirst, a belief that is true if and only if H2O quenches thirst. The externalist then asks us to consider a physically identical counterpart of this individual on Twin Earth. Being a resident on Twin Earth, this counterpart had only encountered twin-water, and had never encountered samples of water or heard about water from other people. According to the externalist, our intuition tells us that this individual on Twin Earth does not believe that water quenches thirst. When he uttered “water quenches thirst”, he was instead expressing the belief that twin-water quenches thirst, a belief with different truth-conditions. In short, these two individuals had different beliefs despite being intrinsically identical (ignoring the fact that the human body is about 60% water). It follows that some beliefs do not supervene on intrinsic facts, and therefore externalism is true.

The argument just discussed aims to show that some beliefs involving natural kind concepts depend on the identity of certain physical substances in our environment. Call this version of externalism natural kind externalism. A different version of externalism, social externalism, is defended by Tyler Burge (especially Burge(1979) and Burge(1986)). Burge makes use of similar arguments to show that social institutions also play a role in determining the contents of some beliefs and thoughts, including those that do not involve natural kind concepts.

In one such argument, we are to imagine an English-speaking individual, say Jane, who suspects she has arthritis as a result of having an ailment in her thigh. This individual, not being a doctor, does not know that arthritis is a condition of the joints only, and so when she sincerely utters “I have arthritis in my thigh” she is expressing a false belief. Burge then asks us to consider a counterfactual situation where Jane has the same internal state and history, except that she grew up in a community where the word “arthritis” is used to apply to a different disease, say tharthritis, which includes rheumatoid ailments of not just the joints but also the thighs. According to Burge, in this counterfactual situation, Jane lacks the belief that she has arthritis in her thigh, or any other beliefs about arthritis, as no-one in her linguistic community possesses the concept of arthritis. When she sincerely utters “I have arthritis in my thigh”, she is instead expressing the true belief that she has tharthritis in her thigh. Since the intrinsic facts about the individual are the same, but the beliefs are different, this is taken to show that externalism is correct. Furthermore, because the two situations differ only in the linguistic usage of the community, it is suggested that mental contents depend in part on communal linguistic practice.

3. Responses to the Classic Arguments

The thought experiments above have generated a huge literature. Many authors remain unconvinced that they support externalism. Some, for example, reject the use of thought experiments in determining whether content is wide or narrow. Cummins (1991) argues that empirical research is needed to find out about the nature of belief, not thought experiments. It might turn out that psychologists make use of belief content in their best psychological theories in an internalist manner, contrary to our folk intuitions. Similarly, Chomsky (1995) argues that the intuitions elicited by the above thought-experiments at most constitute data for ethnoscience, but “the study of how people attain cognitive states, interact, and so on, will proceed along its separate course.” He believes that the notion of content in such thought experiments play no useful role in scientific theorizing.

A somewhat different empirical challenge to the externalist thought experiments may be brewing in the new “experimental philosophy” movement. It is possible, as experimental philosophers appear to have shown regarding intuitions about other prominent philosophical thought experiments, that externalist intuitions are a culturally local product. Weinberg et al. (2001) report that the Gettier intuition tends not to be had by East Asian subjects, and Machery et al. (2004) say that a majority of the East Asian subjects they surveyed had intuitions that favor the descriptivist theory of reference supposedly refuted by Kripke (1972). Surely, there will soon be cross-cultural empirical data on externalist intuitions. If it is found that only Westerners, for example, tend to have externalist intuitions, that could form the basis of a new kind of empirical critique of externalism.

A second line of criticism disagrees with the intuition that different belief ascriptions are true of the physically identical subjects in the two environments. Unger (1984) suggests that perhaps XYZ is a kind of water, depending on how the details of Putnam's thought experiment are spelt out. Crane (1991) argues that in Burge's example, there is no reason for thinking that Jane has different concepts in the two situations, as her dispositions remain exactly the same. Crane thinks that in both situations, Jane lacks the concept of arthritis, but possesses the concept of tharthritis. So Burge was mistaken in attributing to Jane in the actual world the belief that she has arthritis in her thigh. Instead, in both worlds, Jane has the belief that she has tharthritis in her thigh. The only difference is that when she utters “I have arthritis in my thigh”, her utterance expresses her belief correctly only in the counterfactual world, and not in the actual world. The contents of her beliefs in both cases are exactly the same. Georgalis (1999) takes a similar view, but unlike Crane, he thinks that Jane literally believes that she has arthritis in her thigh in both worlds, and that it is wrong to attribute to her the belief that she has tharthritis. This is also the position taken by Wikforss (2001), though for reasons very different from Georgalis’s. (See also Segal (2000).)

A third line of criticism (Loar (1988), Patterson (1990)) concedes that different belief ascriptions are true of the physically identical subjects, but denies that it implies externalism. It is submitted that there is a distinction between linguistic content and psychological content. The former refers to the contents of the embedded that-clauses in belief attributions, such as the content of “arthritis is painful” in the statement “Jane believes that arthritis is painful.” Psychological content, on the other hand, refers to the contents of intentional mental states that is invoked in psychological explanations of behavior. On this view, the linguistic contents of that-clauses in belief ascriptions do not accurately capture the psychological contents of mental states. One example used to argue for such a position is a variation of Burge's thought experiment inspired by Kripke’s (1979) discussion of different but related issues. Suppose Jane studys French and learns the meaning of the French word “arthrite”, namely a rheumatoid ailment that affects the joints only. However, she fails to realize that “arthrite” and “arthritis” refer to the same illness, as she mistakenly believes that the latter is not restricted to the joints. Suppose further that she describes her ailment in her thigh as “arthritis”, and she also thinks that she has an ailment in her knee joint to which the French term applies. In such a situation, the claim “Jane believes that she has arthritis” seems to be true twice over. But the problem with this attribution is that it fails to distinguish between the two distinct beliefs that Jane has about her ailments. When a French doctor offers Jane a cure for arthritis, she would gladly accept it but continue to look for a cure for the ailment in her thigh she calls “arthritis”. On this line of thought, this shows that Jane has two beliefs with distinct psychological contents that ordinary belief attributions fail to capture. What the externalist thought experiments show is that ordinary belief ascriptions are sensitive to external facts, but it does not follow that psychological contents are therefore wide. (But see Stalnaker (1990) and Frances (1999), both of whom argue that psychological contents so understood might still be wide.)

Another popular response to the classic arguments is again to draw a distinction between two kinds of content. However, this time the distinction is between two kinds of content that intentional mental states possess. It is first of all conceded that beliefs and thoughts have wide contents, as shown by the thought experiments. However, it is suggested that intentional mental states also possess a kind of narrow content that does not depend on the environment. For example, Fodor (1987) agrees that physically identical individuals have different wide contents when embedded in different contexts. However, Fodor suggests that their beliefs still have the same narrow contents, which are functions from contexts to wide contents. Narrow contents and contexts are supposed to explain how identical individuals acquire wide contents, and they are supposed to play a central role in psychological explanation. (See the entry on narrow content, and further discussion below.)

Finally, some authors (e.g. Horowitz (2002, 2005)) deny that there is any sense in which one’s external environment determines the de dicto contents of one’s mental states. In fact, Horowitz alleges that the various assumptions required by the arguments for externalism are inconsistent (though see Brueckner (2005) for a reply).

Among those who accept externalism, one important issue concerns the implicit philosophical assumptions that ground the intuitions behind the thought experiments. There are two main approaches here. The causal-information theoretic approach explains content in terms of counterfactual or informational dependencies that hold between internal states and the environment in normal or ideal situations (Dretske (1981), Stalnaker (1993)). The teleological approach, on the other hand, says that the contents of internal states are fixed by their design or evolutionary function (Millikan (1984), Papineau(1993)). If these theories of content are correct, they explain why intentional mental states have wide contents and provide a theoretical basis for externalism. (See the entries on mental representation, and teleological theories of mental content.)

4. The Scope of Externalism

The evaluation of the classic arguments is still a matter of active debate. But even if we accept Putnam's and Burge's thought experiments, they show at most that some mental states have wide contents. These are the states to which teleological or causal-informational theories of content apply. But this is not enough to show that all beliefs and thoughts have wide contents.

Burge (1986) believes that his arguments apply to any thought that involves observational and theoretical notions, natural and non-natural kind notions, or indeed “any notion that applies to public types of objects, properties, or events that are typically known by empirical means.” However, it has been suggested that Burge's arguments apply only to deferential concepts that involve conceptions of other speakers or a socially shared language (see Loar (1990)). This raises the question of whether there are non-deferential concepts to which externalism does not apply. For example, it might be argued that some very basic logical notions are indeed non-deferential. Consider a mono-lingual English speaker who believes that something exists, or who believes that what will be, will be. Unlike the previous examples, it is difficult to imagine a world in which her physical duplicate does not have the same beliefs, even if the duplicate's linguistic community uses words like “exist”, “something”, “will be”, etc. with somewhat different meanings. If this is correct, then the classical arguments fail to show that all mental contents are wide.

The thesis that all mental contents are wide is defended by Davidson (1987) in his “swampman” thought experiment. Davidson asks us to imagine him being reduced to ashes by lightning in a swamp, while at the same time an exact physical replica of him is produced by pure coincidence. This is unlikely to be sure, but arguably nomologically possible. According to Davidson, the swampman that is produced would have no intentional mental states whatsoever, even though it would behave just like him and would appear to other people as having thoughts of its own. Davidson does not explain why this claim should be accepted. But he claims, “what a person's words mean depends in the most basic cases on the kinds of objects and events that have caused the person to hold the words to be applicable; similarly for what the person's thoughts are about.” Presumably, we should refrain from attributing thoughts to the swampman because it lacks internal states with the right kind of causal history. But it is not clear why this causal requirement applies to all thoughts. Some philosophers take the position that the contents of some of our thoughts are determined by their conceptual or computational role, which might not depend on the environment. If such theories are correct, swampman might possess some thoughts despite its causal origin, and so some contents might be narrow after all. (See the entry on causal theories of mental content.)

In other work, and compatibly with his swampman example, Davidson defends what Bridges (2006) describes as “transcendental externalism,” a view according to which the very possibility of thought depends on a creature being involved in a complex causal relationship—“triangulation”—involving a second creature and a shared environment. Unlike the standard forms of content externalism discussed so far, Davidson’s transcendental externalism does not maintain that causal interaction with specific external objects or natural kinds is necessary for specific intentional mental states, but the view is still strongly externalistic in that both social and external physical environments are held to be metaphysically necessary for thought.

A different route to a kind of transcendental externalism can be found in the so-called “skeptical argument” attributed to Wittgenstein in Kripke (1982). Roughly, the argument is that our usage of any linguistic expression must be finite in that the term has only been applied to a finite range of cases. But the meaning of a term prescribes its correct application in infinitely many other novel situations that we have not encountered before. A skeptic can therefore come up with different theories of what we mean by the term, theories that accord with our past usage, but whose prescriptions in the novel situations diverge from one another. According to Kripke's Wittgenstein, all physical facts about our limited linguistic dispositions or cognitive capacities are finite in character. They are not sufficient to determine which of the skeptic's theory gives the correct meaning of the term we use. This goes to show that there are no intrinsic facts that determine the meaning we associate with the term. If this argument is valid, the same is true of the contents of our thoughts and concepts. According to Kripke, this skeptical argument shows that we cannot “speak of a single individual, considered by himself and in isolation, as ever meaning anything.” Instead, it is argued that meaning and content can only be justifiably ascribed to an individual when considered as a member of some linguistic community.

Exactly how the skeptical argument is supposed to go and whether the argument is sound is controversial (See the review in Boghossian (1989b)). Some believe that the argument is too strong in that it seems to establish meaning eliminativism rather than externalism. Another criticism (e.g. McGinn (1984), Soames (1998)) is that the argument makes the assumption that semantic facts about meaning and content are reducible to non-semantic ones, an assumption which many philosophers reject. For these and other reasons the skeptical argument is not widely accepted.

The discussion above concerns the content of cognitive states such as beliefs and thoughts, of which a subject might or might not be conscious. In perhaps the most interesting and controversial proposal concerning the reach of externalism, it has recently been argued that externalism is also true of all conscious mental states. Conscious mental states are mental states with phenomenal characters, states for which there is something it is like to have them. According to some authors, such as Tye (1995, 2000), Dretske (1995), Lycan (1987, 1996), and Thau (2002), all conscious mental states have wide contents. Furthermore, though this is a logically separable thesis known as representationalism or intentionalism, the phenomenal characters of these conscious states are supposed by these and other authors to supervene on their contents. For example, Tye (1996) suggests that the content of a perceptual state is the state of affairs that the state causally correlates with under optimal conditions. On such a view, if two intrinsically identical individuals are embedded in appropriately different environments, their perceptual states will correlate with different external conditions and so acquire distinct wide contents. Given representationalism, the perceptual experiences of these individuals will then be phenomenally different, despite their sameness of intrinsic properties. However, some (e.g. Block (1990, 1995), Deutsch (2005)) believe that phenomenal character does not supervene on mental content. Others ( e.g. Carruthers (2000), Rey (1998), Chalmers (2005)) argue that experiences have narrow content, and that phenomenal character reduces to narrow and not wide content. Representationalists assert that phenomenal character depends on content. However, Horgan and Tienson (2002) claim that content and character are mutually dependent. They then use this mutual dependence to argue that, since, as they also believe, phenomenal character is narrow, there are severe liabilities with a wholly externalist account of the mind. See the entry on consciousness and intentionality and consciousness: representational theories of for further discussion.

5. Externalism and Mind-Body Theories

Externalism has important consequences for a number of different mind-body theories. Burge(1979) believes that externalism refutes individualistic theories of intentional mental states. These are theories that define or explain what it is for a person to have an intentional mental state purely in terms of intrinsic facts about that person without reference to the environment. Examples of such theories include the identity theory, and functionalism in its traditional guise. Though externalism may be incompatible with these internalist forms of physicalism, this should not be taken to imply that externalism is itself an antiphysicalist doctrine, for one might hold that although mental contents do not supervene on narrow physical properties, they do supervene on wide physical properties. There is no obvious reason for physicalism about the mind to require a creature’s mental properties to supervene on its narrow physical properties. (For discussion of the requirements on physicalism, see the entry on physicalism.)

McGinn (1989) and Burge (1986,1993) both argue that externalism refutes the token-identity theory (and hence type-identity theory as well). Token-identity says that each particular mental state token is identical to a physical brain state token. McGinn and Burge rely on a modal argument : the brain states of a subject would remain the same if the environment were to be different, as long as her intrinsic properties did not change. But her intentional mental states could have been different. So by Leibniz's law, mental states are distinct from brain states. However, Davidson (1989) rejects this argument. He points out that it is plausible to take a particular sunburn as identical to a certain state of the body, even if the very same bodily state could have been caused by something other than exposure to sunlight, and so would not have been a sunburn. The modal argument is also criticized in Gibbons (1993), who claims that a belief state token can remain identical to a brain state token, even if its content had been different, as long as we reject the assumption that mental state tokens have their contents essentially. A similar position, though argued in much greater detail, is taken by Frances (2007). (See also MacDonald (1990) and Rowlands (1992).)

As for functionalism, one way to deal with externalism is to adopt a divide-and-conquer strategy. One might try to explain what it is to be a particular kind of mental state (e.g. belief) individualistically, while adopting an externalist theory of content. For example, a functionalist might adopt the position that an internal state is a belief state in virtue of having the right kind of internal functional role. The content of such an internal state, however, can depend on its relationship with the external environment. (See Chapter 3 of Fodor (1987))

An alternative strategy for functionalism is to extend the theory so that it becomes compatible with externalism. Functionalism says that a mental state is defined by its functional role, which includes the relations that the state bears to inputs, outputs and other mental states. In typical formulations of functionalism, the inputs and outputs are usually taken to be objects or states that stop at the body boundary, and do not belong to the external environment. Block (1990), Harman (1987) and Kitcher (1991) have suggested a “long arm” functionalism that drops this requirement in order to accommodate externalism.

6. Externalism and Self-knowledge

Externalism is also connected with issues surrounding our introspective knowledge of our own mental states. Such knowledge appears to be a priori, or at least privileged, in that it is acquired without relying on empirical evidence or observations. On the face of it, externalism threatens the existence of such privileged knowledge. If the contents of our thoughts are determined in part by our relations to the environment, then one might think that external observations are needed in order to know what we think. But self-knowledge does not come about through empirical investigations. So either contrary to appearance we do not really know the contents of our own thoughts, or if we do, externalism is false.

One way to resist this conclusion is to reject the implicit assumption that to know one's own thoughts one must know the environmental conditions that make such thoughts possible. Burge (1988) draws an analogy with perception, pointing out that unless one embraces skepticism, perceptual knowledge does not require knowledge of its enabling condition. However, even if this is sufficient to disarm the argument that externalism is incompatible with privileged self-knowledge, this still falls short of identifying the mechanisms that make such knowledge possible. Burge's proposal is that privileged self-knowledge has a reflexive, self-referential character. In basic cases such as thinking that “I am thinking that p”, one not only has the first-order thought that p but also thinks about it as one's own. Since the object of the second-order judgment is none other than the first-order content it is logically impossible to misjudge the content of the first-order thought, even if this content depends in part on external conditions.

A number of authors remain unconvinced that externalism is compatible with privileged self-knowledge. Arguments for incompatibility are usually of two kinds. One type of argument, introduced in Boghossian (1989a), uses slow switching cases where a subject travels between two different physical environment or linguistic communities, say between Earth and Twin Earth. The subject, however, is unable to discriminate between the two places. According to many externalist theories of content, which concepts are possessed by the subject will depend on factors such as the time he has spent on each of the two planets. When the subject is having an occurrent thought which he expresses by saying “there is water around”, he might be thinking about water if he has been living on Earth, or he might be thinking about twin-water if he has already moved to Twin-Earth and have lived there for a long time. It is then argued that since the subject is unable to distinguish between the two places, he will not be able to know by introspection alone whether he is having water or twin-water thoughts. This is taken to show that externalism is incompatible with privileged self-knowledge. Falvey and Owens (1994) object that, although externalism does entail that, in slow switching cases, an agent might not be able to introspectively distinguish her water thoughts from her twin-water thoughts, this is not a bar to a noncomparitive type of priviledged self-knowledge. A different strategy against the slow-switching argument, pursued by Brown (2004), Sawyer (1999), and Warfield (1992, 1997), is to argue that, although introspective indistinguishability does undermine self-knowledge in the slow switching cases, since such cases are merely hypothetical, they pose no real threat to any actual person’s self-knowledge. However, Ludlow (1995) takes the slow switching cases a step further by suggesting that they are sometimes actual, not just hypothetical. He claims that this happens all the time when we move in and out of linguistic communities, as in the case of a person who travels between the US and England, without knowing that “chickory” has different meaning in British and American English. (But see Warfield (1997) for a reply.)

Another type of incompatibility argument (McKinsey (1991), Brown (1995), Boghossian (1998)) aims to show that externalism leads to some implausible conclusions about what can be known a priori. According to this line of argument, if social or natural kind externalism is correct, having thoughts with wide contents depends on the presence of certain substances or communal practice in the environment. So if we have privileged knowledge of our own thoughts, we can infer a priori that one's external environment contains some natural kind, or there exists apart from oneself a community of speakers. But it is implausible that we can gain empirical knowledge of the external world this way, relying only on introspection and armchair reflection on externalism. So either externalism is false, or we do not have privileged access to the contents of our thoughts. These arguments differ with regard to what it is that can be inferred a priori given that we know we have a certain thought. Boghossian (1998) argues that knowing that one has thoughts about water allows one to infer that one has been in causal contact with water. But according to McLaughlin and Tye (1998), this is true only if one also knows that the concept of water is an atomic concept that succeeds in denoting a natural kind. But since we do not know a priori whether a concept succeeds in referring to anything at all, no information about the external world can be derived solely on the basis of externalism and knowledge of our thoughts. (See also Gallois and O’Leary-Hawthorne (1996).) Davies (1998) and Wright (2000) offer a different reply to this second type of incompatibility argument. Both argue that, while a subject might be a priori justified in believing that she has a certain thought, and also a priori justified in thinking that the having of that thought depends on the presence of certain substances or communal practice in the environment, this a priori justification does not transmit to belief in the existence of those external substances or practices. For criticisms of this reply, see McLaughlin (2003) and Brown (2004).

Some externalists (e.g. Sawyer (1998)) seem willing to bite the bullet and say that, since externalism is true (and we know it) and we have priviledged access to our thoughts, we also have a kind of a priori access to our external environment. Sawyer does not take this to imply that externalism combined with self-knowledge is an antidote to skepticism about the external world, though since Putnam (1982) there has been interest in the extent to which externalist considerations may be used in arguing against skepticism. See the entry on Brains in a vat for more on the topic of externalism and skepticism.

Judging by the number of published papers on the topic, the issue of the compatibility of externalism and self-knowledge is a central concern for philosophers of mind. The literature on the topic is now vast. For more detailed discussion of the incompatibility arguments, see the papers in Ludlow and Martin (1998), Wright, Smith and MacDonald (1998), and Nuccetelli (2007).

7. Externalism and Mental Causation

Another debate that arises out of externalism concerns the legitimacy of wide contents in causal explanations. Most philosophers agree with Davidson (1980) that beliefs and desires play an important role in the causal explanation of actions. However, it has been argued that causal explanations of behavior should appeal only to the local properties of our bodies, properties that describe what is happening here and now within us (Stich (1983)). On the face of it, there is a problem reconciling these two theses with externalism. Externalism says that our mental contents are determined by causal, social or historical factors, factors which extend spatially and temporally beyond the here and now. So the locality requirement seems to imply that wide mental contents cannot be causally explanatory role because of their relational nature.

In reply, externalists (e.g. Wilson (1995)) note that relational properties do enter into causal explanations in many other non-mental domains. For example, we might say that a machine has broken down due to overuse, which is a relational property. One might also argue that the appeal to mental content in causal explanation is on a par with the routine appeal to representational properties in understanding computational systems. The failure of NASA's Mars Climate Orbiter in 1999 was attributed to a design oversight, where an algorithm fails to convert navigational data from English units to metric. Whether this explanation satisfies the locality requirement or not, it does seem to invoke wide representational contents. If it qualifies as a legitimate causal explanation, it is not clear why the same should not apply to explanations that appeal to wide mental contents. Williamson (2000) has argued that wide contents actually have special explanatory value. They provide us with a better understanding of the connection between the mental states of an agent and his actions in the non-immediate future, because our actions typically involve complex interactions with the environment. See also Peacocke (1993), Jackson (1996), Yablo (1997), and the entry on mental causation.

8. Externalism and Cognitive Science

Even if all mental contents of folk psychology turn out to be wide contents, it does not follow that this is also true of the contents of mental states and representations postulated by psychology and cognitive science. Fodor (1987) agrees that the classic thought experiments have indeed shown that many mental states have wide contents, at least according to folk psychology. Nonetheless, he argues that physically identical subjects are psychologically similar in an important way. Their mental states have the same casual powers, and science should capture this common aspect by postulating a shared narrow content which is determined by our intrinsic properties.

However, such arguments for narrow content are controversial, resting on assumptions about causation or scientific methodology which are not widely accepted. Furthermore, there has been no consensus as to the nature of narrow content, or indeed whether narrow content is something that is expressible. Fodor (1994) himself has changed his mind and has decided that narrow content is probably not needed in cognitive science after all. (For further discussion, see Burge (1986), Peacocke (1994), and also the entry on narrow mental content.) In the absence of a convincing general argument for narrow content in cognitive science, or a general argument against wide content, it is useful to look at actual cases of scientific theories and see if they invoke wide or narrow contents. Here are a few pertinent examples :

1. It might be thought that representations involved in sensation and perception are particularly good candidates for which externalism is true, given their role in providing information about the environment. For example, in discussing the nature of representations that animals employ in navigation, the psychologist Gallistel (1990) takes a representation in the brain as representing the environment when “there is a functioning isomorphism between an aspect of the environment and a brain process that adapts the animal's behavior to it.” Clearly, any content assigned according to such a principle would be wide. One might look at other theories in cognitive science and see whether they postulate wide contents or not. Burge (1986) has argued that this is indeed the case with Marr's computational theory of vision. For rebuttals and further discussion regarding externalism in theories of visual perception, see Segal (1989), Davies (1991), Butler (1996), Chomsky (2000), and Silverberg (2006).

2. Another interesting issue to explore is the relationship between innate knowledge and externalism. Some developmental psychologists, such as Spelke (1994), have argued that human beings are innately endowed with a number of systems of knowledge relating to such domains as physics, language, psychology, number and geometry (see Elman et. el (1996) for a dissenting view, and Griffiths (2001) for a critique of the notion of innateness in cognitive psychology.). For the internalist, the innate contents of these systems are prime candidates for narrow content, perhaps genetically encoded through the process of evolution. On the other hand, an externalist might argue that the existence of innate contents does not vindicate internalism. For example, an externalist could hold that innate contents are wide contents, because they supervene on a creature's dispositions to enter into causal relations with the environment. See Cowie (1999), Pitt (2000) and Fodor (2001) for further discussion.

3. The study of semantic knowledge is one area where externalism has direct methodological consequences on cognitive science research. Suppose semantic externalism is correct, that the meanings of words as used by a speaker depends in part on his relations to the physical or social environment. It then follows that externalism is correct with regard to semantic knowledge. Yet many philosophers and linguists would insist that the study of a speaker's semantic knowledge is the study of a purely internal psychological state. In Chomsky (1986), a distinction is made between E-language and I-language. The conception of E-language is that of a convention-based natural language, a social object, whereas I-language is a biologically-endowed language faculty internal to the brain. An individualist theory of semantic knowledge will then be part of the theory of I-language, or some related system of a similar status. For further discussion, see Larson and Segal (1995), and Ludlow (1999, 2003), and Pitt (2000).

9. Active Externalism

In all versions of externalism discussed earlier, the mental contents of a subject depend in part on aspects of the environment which are clearly external to the subject's cognitive processes. For example, the twin-water in Putnam's thought-experiment or the relevant linguistic community in Burge's are not part of the subjects' ongoing mental processes. In contrast, active externalism asserts that the environment can play an active role in constituting and driving cognitive processes. Hutchins (1995) argues that the successful completion of a typical commercial flight requires complex interaction between the pilots and the instruments in the cockpit. He claims that an adequate analysis of the task would need to treat the whole distributed system as a cognitive system with memories, representations, and cognitive processes that extend outside the pilots' heads. Clark and Chalmers (1998) is a widely-discussed defense of active externalism. In one argument, they introduce a thought experiment where someone with Alzheimer's disease has to rely on a notebook to retain information and find his way about. Clark and Chalmers argue that because the notebook plays an active role in the cognitive life of the patient, its contents actually constitute some of that person's non-occurrent beliefs, and so these belief contents are “not in the head”. See also Hurley (1998), Wilson (1994), Haugeland (1995) and Noë (2005).

Whether we should regard the notebook as an extended part of that person's belief system is a controversial matter. The issue concerns the conditions under which representational objects or states are regarded as part of a cognitive system. Adams and Aizawa (2001) claim that cognitive processes involve only representations with intrinsic content, and so the notebook should not be regarded as part of the subject's cognitive process, because the notebook contains only symbols with non-intrinsic contents derived from our linguistic intentions. But Clark (forthcoming) argues that this requirement is too strong. Cognition might involve mental imagery using diagrams with derived content, or biological routines that store bitmap images of printed texts. For further discussion of related issues, see the papers collected in Menary (forthcoming).

In considering whether a process constitutes a mental process external to a cognitive subject, an important background question is how the subject is to be individuated. In particular, where lies the physical boundary of the subject? One view is that perception marks the boundary where the world and the body meet. In the case of the Alzheimer's patient, since the patient has to flip through the pages of the notebook and read the entries, this shows that the notebook as the object of perception and action should be regarded as external to the mind. Chalmers himself expresses some sympathy to this response in his preface to Clark(2008).

On the other hand, suppose we agree that the notebook is part of the patient's belief system, and so mental contents can extend beyond the brain. However, it might then be argued that in so doing we are in effect extending the physical boundary of that person beyond his brain. The notebook has now become a spatially scattered part of his extended self. If this is right, then it has not been shown that the patient's mental contents are determined in part by factors external to the subject. It merely shows that one can extend the physical boundary of the subject by augmenting additional hardware. This conclusion differs from those of the earlier arguments for externalism, where mental contents are supposed to depend on factors that are clearly external to the subject.

Enhancing our cognitive abilities with additional hardware might become commonplace with the development of computer technology and increasingly sophisticated brain-computer interfaces. For example, we might implant micro-processors and radio transmitters into our brains in order to access external databases, or to outsource computational-intensive processing. To what extent the additional hardware is or is not part of the extended mind might even depend on normative and legal issues. Imagine a scenario where our memory systems connect to an external computer database. When we wonder whether a proposition P is true, it might trigger a remote search, and the result returns as an occurent belief. In such a scenario, we would all be accessing the same database. So should we say that our minds actually overlap because we share the same cognitive resource? But if the servers are actually owned by a commercial company, legal considerations might mitigate against the idea that the servers are part of us. On the other hand, if a user owns a database server and has exclusive access, we might be more inclined to say that the server is part of his extended mind. So the exact boundary of the mind might turn out to involve normative and legal considerations. This raises the question of whether there is a coherent and unitary psychological conception of what a mind really is.


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cognitive science | consciousness: and intentionality | mental causation | mental content: narrow | mental content: teleological theories of | mental representation | supervenience