Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Teleological Theories of Mental Content

First published Fri Jun 18, 2004

Teleological theories of mental content try to explain the contents of mental representations by appealing to a teleological notion of function. Take, for example, the thought that blossoms are forming. On a representational theory of thought, this thought involves a representation of blossoms forming, and a theory of content aims among other things to tell us why this representation has that content; it aims to say why it is a thought about blossoms forming rather than about the sun shining or pigs flying or nothing at all. In general, a theory of content tries to say why a mental representation counts as representing what it represents.

According to teleological theories of content, what a representation represents depends on the functions of the systems that use or (it depends on the version) produce the representation. The relevant notion of function is said to be the one that is used in biology and neurobiology in attributing functions to components of organisms (as in "the function of the pineal gland is releasing melatonin" and "the function of brain area MT is processing information about motion"). Proponents of teleological theories of content generally understand this notion to be the notion of what something was selected for, either by ordinary natural selection or by some other natural process of selection.

1. Broad Aims

Many (perhaps all) mental states are about things or are directed on to things in the way that my belief that spring is coming is about spring coming or in the way that my desire for chocolate is directed on to chocolate. The nineteenth century philosopher, Franz Brentano, spoke of such mental states as involving presentations of the objects of our thoughts. The idea was that we couldn't desire chocolate unless chocolate was in some way presented to our minds. Nowadays, we would say that chocolate must be represented in our minds if it is chocolate that we desire. Teleological theories of content, like other theories of mental content, attempt to solve what is often referred to as Brentano's problem: the problem of explaining how mental states can be about things or be directed on to things in this way.

One version of the problem, often attributed to Brentano but perhaps more correctly attributed to Roderick Chisholm (1957), concerns thoughts about non-existent objects. Chisholm argued that the aboutness (or intentionality) of mental states can not be a physical relation between a mental state and what it is about (its object) because in a physical relation each of the relata must exist whereas the objects of mental states might not exist. If Andrew kisses Kate both Andrew and Kate must exist, and if the sun shines on my garden both the sun and my garden must exist too. In contrast, Billy can love Santa and Jane can search for unicorns even if Santa does not exist and there are no unicorns.

Chisholm concluded that it is hard to see how intentionality can be a physical phenomenon, but those who offer teleological theories almost always adopt a physicalist framework to try to explain how intentionality is possible. They aim at what is often called a "naturalistic theory": "naturalistic" because the aim is to give a theory that is consistent with the claim that the fundamental furniture of the universe is nothing but what the natural sciences describe. Within that framework, it is a working hypothesis that intentionality is not ontologically fundamental, so most teleological theories try to show that intentionality is part of the natural world by showing how it can be understood in terms of other natural things. In effect, those who propose teleological theories of mental content try to say why a mental representation, R, represents what it represents, C, by filling in the blank in, "R has the content C because (in virtue of) … … … … … ", without making ineliminable use of intentional terms.

A theory of mental content will need to explain our capacity to represent non-existent things. Another thing it will need to explain is the normative nature of mental representation. Content is said to be normative because it legitimates certain evaluations. We evaluate beliefs as true or false, memories as accurate or inaccurate, perceptions as veridical or illusory, and so on. We also evaluate desires as satisfied or not satisfied and motor instructions as correctly or incorrectly executed. Content that is normative in this way is sometimes described as truth-evaluable. Representational states count as true or false (etc.) by virtue of those aspects of the world that their contents concern. For example, the truth of my belief that today is sunny depends on today's being sunny, but it also depends on its being a belief that today is sunny. If its content were different (e.g., if it were instead the belief that today is rainy) it might be false instead. The normative nature of content also poses a problem for naturalistic theories, but those who propose teleological theories of mental content think that this problem is tractable.

Much attention is paid to the possibility of misrepresentation. This is because the distinction between correct and incorrect representation is often regarded as a central normative distinction and because a capacity to misrepresent is often thought to be essential for representing: no possibility of misrepresentation, no representing. As a rule, some things fall inside and some things fall outside of a representation's content, so there will be some contexts where, were it applied, it would be applied incorrectly. Consider a mental representation of cats. If it's to have the content cats, so that all and only cats are in its extension, it must be that, were it used to label a non-cat (e.g., a dog) it would count as misrepresenting it. However, there may be exceptions to the general rule that all representations can misrepresent (e.g., a representation that has the content, something or nothing).

The possibility of misrepresentation also connects with Chisholm's concern with non-existent objects because a basic capacity to misrepresent amounts to a basic capacity to represent non-existent objects. To see this, imagine a simple detection device that goes into a certain state, RED, in response to something's being red. If RED has the content red and instances of RED can misrepresent, then RED can be instanced or tokened when nothing red is present. So a token RED could represent a non-existent instantiation of red. There is more to explaining our capacity to represent non-existent objects than explaining how misrepresentation is possible (more on this in the last section), but explaining how misrepresentation is possible is a start.

Misrepresentation makes it clear that representing is often a three-place relation. Suppose, for example, that I see some crumpled newspaper blown by the wind as a cat slinking down the street. There are at least three things involved. First, there is the representation itself, which is a neurological state or event (here represented by the corresponding English terms, all in capitals, CAT SLINKING). Second, there is the thing that the representation is aimed at representing, in this case the newspaper. Robert Cummins (1996) calls this the target of the representation. And third, there is the content of the representation. Since I represent the newspaper as a cat slinking, the content of the representation in this case is therefore cat slinking. Misrepresentation has occurred in this case because the target of the representation is not in the extension of the representation: the newspaper is not a cat slinking.

We can ask questions about each of these three places in the representation relation. First is the question of representational status: Why does CAT count as a representation? Or, more generally, what is the difference between natural states that are representational states and natural states that are not? Second is the question of target determination: What makes it the case that this token of CAT has the newspaper as its target? Or, more generally, what makes anything the target of any given representation? Third is the question of content determination: What makes it the case that CAT has the content cat? Or, more generally, in virtue of what does any representation have the content that it has? Teleological theories of mental content are primarily concerned with content determination, but a complete solution to Brentano's problem will need to give answers to all three.

The word "content" has come to have some different uses in the philosophical literature. One important distinction is between referential content and something like cognitive role or mode of presentation. The teleological theories that are currently on offer are generally theories of referential content, not theories of cognitive role or mode of presentation. Another distinction sometimes made is between representation of and representation as. Whether or not teleological theories of content are concerned with representation as or of depends on how one understands those locutions. In one sense, referring back to the previous example, my CAT-representation represents the newspaper as a cat, although it is a representation of the newspaper. So used, teleological theories of content are theories of representation as. However, the words "as"/"of" are not always diagnostic of the contents/targets distinction. For example, we can also say that I used a representation of a cat to represent the newspaper.

Three remaining points about broad aims might be useful. One concerns what is known among philosophers as "narrow content". By definition, narrow content supervenes on just the current, internal physical properties of the individual whose narrow-content state it is. Thus, two individuals who are physical replicas at a time, t, "from the skin in" must have the same narrow-content states at t. Proponents of teleological theories do not believe that regular normative content (that is, non-revisionary content) is narrow content. This view is shared by many other philosophers who think that the content we intuitively ascribe supervenes (in part) on things that are external to individual thinkers: e.g., on their social and physical environment and/or their history. In general, the proponents of teleological theories of content have shown little interest in the notion of narrow content, since they tend to reject the claim that cognitive science should restrict itself to using narrow notions (something we return to later, toward the end of this entry). Still, it is worth noting that a teleological theory of mental content per se is consistent with the view that cognitive science needs a narrow notion of content. A teleological theory of content tries to explain the nature of psycho-semantic norms (i.e., semantic norms in so far as these apply to mental representations). It is to some extent a separate question whether such norms play an essential role in cognitive science, and whether a narrow notion is needed instead, or in addition.

A second further point about broad aims is that teleological theories of mental content are not generally intended as theories about how we grasp meanings or are conscious of them. To grasp a meaning is plausibly a sophisticated intentional state that involves representations of meanings and not just representations with meanings. To understand how we grasp meanings, we might turn to psychological theories of concept possession and introspective access to conceptual structures. Such theories presuppose that there are representations with content, whereas teleological theories of mental content try to explain the nature of intentionality at its most fundamental; they aim to say what it is to have representations with content.

Third, teleological theories of mental content are usually (although not always) intended as real nature theories. Those who offer real nature theories of intentionality are not trying to describe the criteria that we use in everyday life to identify the beliefs and desires of people. Those who offer teleological theories of mental content usually think that our everyday ability to recognize intentional states, such as beliefs and desires, does not make us experts about the fundamental nature of intentional states, any more than our everyday ability to recognize water makes us experts about the fundamental nature of water. The idea is that we can recognize instances of a kind on the basis of the superficial appearances of things of the kind, while remaining ignorant of their essential nature. So, most teleological theories of mental content do not entail that, if Bill thinks that Mavis knows that today is Tuesday, then Bill must be thinking about teleological functions.

2. Teleological Functions

As noted in the previous section, a crucial feature of content is that it legitimates semantic evaluations. While teleological theories of mental content come in a variety of forms, they all share the idea that the norms that underwrite these evaluations are derived, in part at least, from functions. The next section explains how this derivation is thought to occur. This section describes the notion of function that is employed. It is generally thought to be in some sense teleological and normative, but both "teleological" and "normative" need qualifying. Let's take the first term first.

Intuitively, talk of functions in biology does seem to be teleological. Teleological contexts are ones in which there is reference to ends or goals, and relevant talk of functions seems to be teleological in this sense, because, for example, when we say that it is the function of the heart to pump blood, this seems equivalent to saying that hearts are for pumping blood or are there to pump blood.

Crucially, however, the relevant concept of function is not purposive. Purposes are intentional phenomena, so such a concept would not serve in a naturalistic theory of content if it were. There is a closely related concept of an artifact's function that is purposive: for example, when we say that moving the cursor is the function of the mouse, we seem to mean that this is what its designers designed it or intended it to do. And, along similar lines, when biologists say that releasing melatonin is the pineal gland's function, they mean that it is adapted for releasing melatonin. We might even say that it was designed for releasing melatonin (Kitcher 1993). But in this case the design process is not literally purposive, for it is done by natural selection and natural selection is a blind mechanical force (it is the "blind watchmaker", Dawkins, 1986).

Some philosophers, including some proponents of what are usually known as teleological theories of content, would prefer to reserve the term "teleological" for purposive contexts. They prefer to refer to the biological concept of function as "teleonomic" instead. But, on a broad construal of what it means for a concept to be teleological, a concept is teleological if it concerns what something is for, and the notion of what something was selected for counts as teleological in that sense. This is the sense of the term used in this entry.

Intuitively, the relevant concept of function also seems to be normative, for biologists routinely talk about systems functioning normally or properly, as well as about abnormal functioning, malfunctioning, dysfunction, functional impairments, and so on. However, describing the term as "normative" is also controversial. Most would agree that the relevant notion of function is one that permits the possibility of malfunction. That is, most would agree that a token trait can have the function of doing something even if it lacks the disposition to do it: e.g., Joe's pineal gland can have the function of secreting melatonin at nightfall even if it lacks the disposition to do that because it is malfunctioning.

The disagreement is about whether this suffices for the notion to count as normative, and the disagreement turns on a distinction between descriptive and prescriptive norms. Again, the disagreement is more terminological than substantial. Most (if not all) proponents of teleological theories think that functional norms are descriptive and not prescriptive, and the disagreement is over whether it is appropriate to refer to descriptive norms (or "norms", if you prefer) as normative. Some prefer to reserve the term "normative" for prescriptive contexts, so that a statement would count as normative only if it entails an ought-claim without the addition of further premises. Perhaps most proponents of teleological theories of mental content would agree that no ought-claim follows from a simple function ascription, not at least without the addition of further premises (for discussion, see Jacob 2001). Different practices dominate different discourses, but talk of descriptive norms is well established in some contexts: e.g., in talk of statistical norms, and probably in most talk of semantic norms that are naturalizable and in talk of normal functioning in biology. This entry speaks of functional norms on the presumption that these are descriptive rather than prescriptive norms.

Note that if semantic and functional norms were prescriptive, the attempt to naturalize either of them would seem to fly in the face of the thesis that we cannot derive ought-statements from is-statements. However, the allegation that descriptive norms can be naturalized does not run against this Humean thesis, which applies to prescriptive but not descriptive norms.

The relevant notion of function, then, is thought to be teleological, in so far as it is the notion of what something is for, and normative, in so far as it permits the possibility of malfunction. Further, those who offer teleological theories of content favor an etiological theory of functions, according to which an item's function is determined by its history of selection, or by past selection for things of that type. Larry Wright (1973, 1976) offered the first developed defense of an etiological theory, but earlier versions of the idea can also be found in the writings of some biologists (e.g., Ayala 1970). Wright's proposed definition is as follows (Wright 1976, p. 81).

The function of X is Z if and only if,
  1. Z is a consequence (result) of Xs being there,
  2. X is there because it does (results in) Z.

Wright intended this formula to work for a wide variety of function ascriptions; for artifacts as well as the parts of organisms, and for functions that derive from intentional design as well as from natural selection, so that it would be applicable to Creationist as well as evolutionary biology. For this reason, he intended the "does" of the second requirement to be tenseless. Thus the second requirement is intended to be read as requiring that X be there because it does, did, or will do Z.

The details of this formula are generally regarded as problematic. For one thing, the first requirement precludes malfunction. For another, the tenselessness of the second requirement, along with the fact that it does not explicitly mention selection, leads to difficulties (for details, see Boorse 1976). These problems are addressed in later accounts, which drop the first requirement altogether, and rejecting the constraints of ordinary language philosophy, propose an analysis suited specifically to modern biology (Neander 1983, 1991; Millikan 1984, 1989a).

According to more recent etiological theories, teleological functions of biological items are what items of the type were selected for. Neander (1991, p. 74), for instance, offers the following definition for functions in physiology:

It is a/the proper function of an item (X) of an organism (O) to do that which items of X's type did to contribute to the inclusive fitness of O's ancestors, and which caused the genotype, of which X is the phenotypic expression, to be selected by natural selection.

Wright included his first requirement to deal with vestigial traits, but more recent formulations assume that there are other ways of handling these. Thus the above formula is not intended to imply that X's function is what X's ancestral homologs were originally selected for. It is consistent with this formula that genes and traits in a lineage were once selected for one thing and were then exapted for another, or were no longer selected for anything at all, so that one function can be lost and another gained, or the trait can become vestigial. Note that selection does not cease when traits "go to fixation", since maintenance selection is still required to weed out fresh mutations. However, it is an issue how exaptations and vestigial traits are to be handled, and different proponents of etiological theories of function deal with that issue in different ways (see e.g., Griffiths 1993, who appeals to recent selection, and Neander, 2002, who argues that we can understand the relevant type to be a functional homolog without circularity resulting).

To play a role in a naturalistic account of mental content, the relevant selection process must be a natural process of selection, but it need not be ordinary genetic selection. Some have suggested that neural selection, conditioning and meme selection, could also ground content. However, it is not a trivial task to say what, in general, constitutes a selection process. Millikan (1984, chapter 1) offers an etiological theory that is not specific to physiological functions.

While etiological theories of function dominate the discussion of functions in philosophy of biology, this type of theory is not uncontroversial. Some question whether teleology can be naturalized (e.g., Bedau 1991), and others support other non-etiological and non-teleological accounts of biological function (e.g., Cummins 1975). Readers who would like to read more on this topic could turn to several volumes that have recently appeared: see especially Allen, Bekoff & Lauder 1998; Buller 1999; and Ariew, Cummins and Perlman 2002.

It is usual to note that etiological (teleological) functions are distinct from the causal-role functions involved in what is called "functionalism" in philosophy of mind. Causal-role functions are often defined as a select subset of a trait's actual causal dispositions, and functionalism is often defined as the view that mental states are individuated or classified into types on the basis of such dispositions (see, e.g., Block 1984). If causal-role functions are a subset of dispositions actually possessed, they can not provide for the possibility of malfunction because a trait cannot have the causal-role function to D and at the same time lack the disposition to D. Joe's pineal gland does not have the causal-role function of releasing melatonin at nightfall if it lacks the disposition to release melatonin at nightfall.

That said, the distinction between functionalism and what might be termed "teleological functionalism" is less stark than might be thought. One reason is that early proponents of classical functionalism often spoke of the characteristic or normal causal roles of mental states, and sometimes this was explicitly to allow for pathology: e.g., David Lewis does this in his paper, “Mad Pain and Martian Pain” (Lewis 1980). This suggests that the characteristic functions of classical functionalism might not be best understood as causal-role functions. At least some of the time, an implicitly normative notion was apparently used instead, though the norms went unanalyzed and unremarked and were perhaps assumed to be statistical rather than teleological.

Another reason teleological and classical functionalism are closer than might be thought is that, while teleological functions are often regarded as selected effects (i.e., effects of traits for which the traits were selected), they can also be regarded as selected dispositions (i.e., dispositions of traits for which the traits were selected). Of course, biological traits must have effects to be selected: traits must do something to enhance gene replication to be selected by genetic selection, for instance. But it is not just what, but also when, something is done that is crucial for selection, and one way to capture this fact is to acknowledge that traits are selected for dispositions to produce certain effects in response to certain causes. Teleological functions, like the functions of classical functionalism, can thus be seen as dispositions: not a select subset of currently possessed dispositions, but selected dispositions.

3. Teleosemantic Theories

The term "teleosemantics" is used to refer to the class of theories of mental content that use a teleological notion of function. Teleosemantics is best understood as a general strategy for underwriting the normative nature of content, rather than any particular theory. What all teleological theories have in common is the idea that semantic norms are ultimately derivable from functional norms. Beyond saying this, it is hard to give a neat definition of the group of theories that qualify.

Consider, for instance, some theories that are clearly intended as alternatives to teleosemantics, such as Jerry Fodor's asymmetric dependency theory (Fodor 1987, ch.4, 1990b) or theories that appeal to convergence under ideal epistemic conditions (Rey 1997, Elaboration of these theories lies outside the scope of this entry, but suffice it to say that both need a notion of a normal system. Fodor's asymmetric dependencies pertain to what he refers to as the "intact" perceiver and thinker: that is, they pertain to the normal perceiver and thinker. The idea of convergence under ideal epistemic conditions also involves a notion of normal functioning, for epistemic conditions are not ideal if perceivers and thinkers are abnormal in certain respects: for example, if they are blind or delusional. Again, what counts as normal goes unanalyzed and mostly unremarked in these accounts. But if it were to be analyzed in terms of an etiological theory of normal functioning, according to which items are functioning normally if they have the dispositions for which they were selected, then these theories would qualify as teleological theories of mental content under the characterization provided in the first paragraph. Those who propose the theories that are intended to be alternatives to teleological theories tend to reject an etiological analysis of normal functioning, but there could be teleological versions of these theories.

As the previous paragraph suggests, an appeal to teleological functions can be combined with various ideas to form hybrid theories. By way of further illustration, it's worth mentioning that such an appeal can also be combined with isomorphism theories (e.g., Cummins 1996). If we combine the idea that representations are isomorphic with their representeds with the idea that psychosemantic norms depend on the norms of proper functioning, we can generate several proposals: for example, the proposal that the relevant mappings are those that systems were designed to exploit, and/or the proposal that the targets of representations are determined by teleological functions.

Teleological theories can also be informational theories. The notion of information is variously defined, but roughly speaking a type of state (event, etc.) is said to carry information about some other state (event, etc.) when it is caused by it or corresponds to it. It will help to see how an appeal to functions might be thought to help an informational theory if we begin with a crude causal theory and the problem of error.

Probably no one has seriously held the crude causal theory, but it often serves as a useful starting place for introductions to the problem of content determination. According to the crude causal theory, a mental representation represents whatever causes tokens of the type: in other words, Rs represent Cs if and only if all and only Cs cause Rs. There are many problems with this crude causal theory. One is its inability to provide for the possibility of misrepresentation (Fodor 1987, 101-104). To see the problem, recall the case where I see some crumpled paper as a cat slinking. The crude causal theory does not permit this characterization of what happened because, if crumpled paper caused this tokening of CAT, then crumpled paper is in the extension of CAT, according to the crude causal theory. Since cats also sometimes cause CATs, cats are in the extension too, but the problem is that crumpled paper is included in the extension as soon as some crumpled paper causes a CAT to be tokened. This is referred to as the problem or error or the problem of misrepresentation. The problem is that there is no logical space for error because candidate errors are transformed into non-errors by their very occurrence.

The error problem is an aspect of what is often called "the disjunction problem". With respect to the crude causal theory, the name applies because the theory entails disjunctive contents when it should not: e.g., it entails that CATs have the content cats or crumpled paper in the case just considered. The disjunction problem is larger than the problem of error, however, because it's not only in cases of error that mental representations are caused by things that are not in their extensions (Fodor 1990c). Suppose, for example, that your talking about your childhood pet dog reminds me of my childhood pet cat. In this case, no misrepresentation is involved, but the crude causal theory again entails inappropriate disjunctive contents. In this case, it entails that CATs have a content along the lines of cats or talk of pet dogs. This last aspect of the disjunction problem might be called the problem of representation in absentia: how do we explain our capacity to think about absent things? (Fodor 1990c, calls it "the really terrible problem".)

In the case of perceptual representations, only the problem of error is relevant. The question with respect to perceptions is, how can we alter the crude causal theory to allow for error? One approach would be to try to describe certain situations in which only the right causes can produce the representation in question. The content of the representation is then defined as whatever can cause the representation in situations of that type. This is sometimes referred to as a "type 1 theory". A type 1 theory distinguishes between two types of situations, ones in which only the right causes can cause a representation, and ones in which other things can too, and it says that the first type of situation is content-determining. A type 1 teleological theory might state, for example, that the content of a perceptual representation is whatever can cause it when conditions are optimal for the proper performance of certain functions. The theory described in the next section is a variant of a type 1 theory, but those described in later sections are not. Not all teleological theories of content are type 1 theories, therefore.

The following sub-sections of section 3 highlight many of the most important differences among teleological theories. It is not possible to describe all extant theories, but different approaches are illustrated with descriptions of some of the theories currently on offer and a review of some of their strengths and weaknesses. Some general objections to teleological theories are then discussed in section 4.

3.1 Indicator Semantics

Dennis Stampe (1977) was one of the first philosophers in modern times to suggest a theory of content according to which content is a matter of reliable causes. Fred Dretske's book, Knowledge and the Flow of Information (1981), was another major influence on the development of informational theories, and although the theory developed there is not a teleological theory, Dretske (1986, 1988, 1991) later produced an informational version of teleosemantics. He begins with a concept of carrying information that he calls "indicating", explains that indicating is not equivalent to representing, and then suggests that a representation's content is what it has the function of indicating.

Dretske (1988) defines "indication" as follows: a given type of state, R, indicates another type of state, C, iff (if and only if) if there is an R then C. Dretske tells us that although indication will often be underwritten by a causal regularity such that Cs cause Rs, it is not a requirement that Cs cause Rs. Cs and Rs might have a common cause, for instance. He also tells us that "if R then C" need not be nomological. For local reasons, it could just be that if there's an R then there's always a C. One of his examples is of doorbell ringings: if there is someone ringing the doorbell whenever the doorbell rings, he says, its ringing indicates that someone is at the door, even if there is no natural law to the effect that doorbells only ring if someone is ringing them. If squirrels start to ring doorbells because people start to make them out of nuts, he says, then a ringing doorbell will no longer indicate that someone is at the door.

Dretske points out that representation is not equivalent to indication. They cannot be equivalent because "R indicates C" entails "if R then C", but, if misrepresentation is to be possible, it must be the case that "R represents C" does not entail "if R then C". So Dretske suggests that perceptual representations have the function of indicating. The starting idea is this: if something has the function of indicating something else, then it is supposed to indicate it, but, since items don't always perform their function, room for error has been made. At first Dretske was not committed to any particular analysis of functions, but he later expresses his ideas in terms an etiological analysis (see e.g., Dretske 1995, p. 7). At a first pass, Dretske suggests that Rs represent Cs iff Rs were recruited for indicating Cs and for causing a bodily movement, M.

Later Dretske (1995, p.2) says, "[t]he fundamental idea is that a system, S, represents a property, F, if and only if S has the function of indicating (providing information about) the F of a certain domain of objects. The way S performs its function (when it performs it) is by occupying different states s1, s2, … sn corresponding to the different determinate values f1, f2fn, of F." For example, part of the visual system might represent the orientation of lines in a region of the visual field. If so, it does so because it has the function of carrying information about the orientation of lines in that region and it performs this function (when it performs it) by entering into different states when different orientations of lines are present in that region.

This account of representation seems to make room for error, because it implies that indicators of a given type need only indicate their future contents during recruitment or in the environment in which recruitment took place; error being possible after that time or in other environments. However, Dretske (1986) sees a problem with this suggestion. By way of illustration, he gives an example of some ocean-dwelling anaerobic bacteria that have tiny magnets, magnetesomes, that are attracted to magnetic north (or south, depending on whether we are talking about the ones that live in the northern or southern hemisphere). These magnetesomes serve to direct the bacteria downwards into the relatively oxygen-free sediment on the ocean floor and they are thus essential for the survival of the bacteria. It seems, then, that the function of the magnetesomes is to direct the bacteria to anaerobic conditions, so that if we "fool" them by holding a bar magnet nearby, and lead the bacteria upward to their death, this is a case of natural misrepresentation. We were, in Dretske's words, looking for "nature's way of making a mistake", and it might seem that we have found it. The problem, says Dretske, is that it is indeterminate how we should describe the function of the magnetesomes. We can plausibly say that they have the function of indicating the oxygen-free sediment. But we can also plausibly say that they have the function of indicating geo-magnetic or even local magnetic north. If we say the latter, no misrepresentation has been made, on the part of the magnetesomes, when we "fool" the bacteria, and lead them to their death. Thus Dretske concludes that we cannot count this as an unambiguous case of error, on his theory as outlined so far.

As we will see later (in section 4.1), there are several problems that go under the name of "the functional indeterminacy problem". However, Dretske's response to the problem he has raised for his own proposal reveals that his focus is mostly on the problem of distal content. The problem for Dretske, then, is this. Suppose that we have a simple system that has just one way of detecting the presence of some feature of the environment. We have just seen a case of this: the anaerobic bacteria that have just one way of detecting anaerobic conditions: i.e., via the local magnetic field. In such a case, if an inner state indicates the distal environmental feature (here, the anaerobic conditions), it will also indicate the more proximal things that carry information about the distal thing to the system (here, local magnetic north). Moreover, if the indicator has been recruited for indicating the former, it will also have been recruited for indicating the latter. Dretske further points out that, even if a creature has several routes by which it can detect a given distal feature (for instance, even if the bacteria can detect anaerobic conditions by means of light sensors as well) there would still be a disjunction of more proximal properties that the representation could count as representing, since it could still count as having the function of indicating the disjunction of them (here, some state could have the function of indicating local magnetic north or reduced light).

While we might be happy to allow that anaerobic bacteria and their parts do not mis/represent, the problem generalizes. When you see a chair across the room as a chair across the room, you represent it as a solid 3D object, away from and apart from you, and not as a stream of light reflected from it. Nonetheless, if a perceptual representation indicates the former, it presumably indicates the latter. It is therefore a problem for Dretske's theory, if we can plausibly say that the perceptual representation has the function of indicating the latter as well as the former.

Dretske (1986) therefore modifies his proposal, and maintains that a creature that is capable of representing must be capable of learning any number of new epistemic routes to the same distal feature. In that case, he says, there is no closed set of more proximal stimuli, the disjunction of which the representation could count as representing. He speaks of conditioning in this context. The relevant representation is recruited by conditioning to indicate the distal feature, and not the disjunction of more proximal features, because there is, according to Dretske, no finite time-invariant disjunction of more proximal stimuli that it has the function of indicating. However, as Barry Loewer (1987) points out, there are some difficulties with this attempt to solve the problem of distal content. With death, conditioning ends, and at that point no further epistemic routes can be acquired. So at the death of a creature, there will be a closed disjunction of proximal features that each of that creature's representations will have been recruited to indicate. Loewer comments that Dretske might try to appeal to the epistemic routes that could possibly be acquired by a creature, but he adds that it is not clear that Dretske's theory can be adequately formulated in these terms.

Dretske's early claim that mis/representation is not possible without learning is anyway problematic, since it precludes innate representation. This conflicts with current thought in psychology, which holds that creatures are endowed with innate concepts and with innate representational capacities (e.g., innate perceptual capacities). Dretske (1988) later drops his conditioning requirement in so far as it is a requirement on content possession, but keeps it as a requirement for the kind of content that can explain behavior (for discussion of this part of Dretske's theory, see McLaughlin 1991). While this allows for innate representations, it re-raises the question of how content is to be disambiguated when function ascriptions are indeterminate, at least for innate content.

A further problem with Dretske's theory concerns the fact that it is a "type 1" theory (as characterized in the introduction to this section). To see the problem, we need to note that Dretske often insists on a rather strict notion of "indication". On the strict interpretation, a given type of state, R, indicates another type of state, C, if and only if it is one hundred percent reliable that an instance of R is accompanied by an instance of C within the relevant environment. A probability (perhaps understood as frequency) of less than one won't suffice, he says. He argues that if we allow Rs to count as indicating Cs if a C given an R has a probability of less than one, then Rs could indicate Cs and Ss could indicate Ds without it being the case that R AND S, indicates C and D. Suppose, for instance, that Dretske allows that a probability of .9 suffices. Then C given R could have a probability of .9, and D given S could have a probability of .9, and yet C and D together given R and S together could have a probability of less than .9. Fodor (1990b) argues that Dretske's concern here is mistaken, and that the problem does not arise if one has a combinatorial semantics. That is, as long as the content of R and S and AND are determined separately, and retain their content in the complex expression, R AND S, then R AND S can mean C and D, even if indication is probabilistic.

The present problem arises if there is a commitment to a strict interpretation of "indication". The strict interpretation is troublesome, because it forces an indicator theory to rely on an unrealistic distinction between recruitment and post-recruitment phases, or recruitment and post-recruitment environments. Here is why. First, there can be no non-intentional process of selection for something's D-ing unless that type of thing does D. Hearts cannot be selected for pumping blood by natural selection unless some hearts pump blood. For the same reason, Rs cannot be selected for indicating Cs unless some Rs indicate Cs. If indication is strictly defined, though, all Rs must indicate Cs within a certain region of space-time, if any do. So all Rs must indicate Cs in that region if there is to be selection of them for doing so in that region. Add to this Dretske's point that, if some Rs are to mis/represent that C is the case, Rs cannot indicate that C is the case, and it follows that the selection of Rs for indicating Cs must finish before mis/representation starts. Hence a sharp divide is needed between recruitment and post-recruitment phases or between recruitment and post-recruitment environments. Where and while recruitment continues, the proto-representation cannot represent or misrepresent C; once it does represent or misrepresent C it can no longer be recruited for doing so. (Fodor 1990b, makes something like this point.)

There are clear hints in Dretske's writings of a willingness to use a less strict notion of indication. Indeed, he sometimes speaks of the content of a representation as the "maximally indicated state", which suggests that there are more minimally indicated states, which would be an oxymoron on the strict interpretation. However, this looser interpretation is not developed in Dretske's writings.

Despite problems with the detailed articulation of this informational version of teleosemantics, one might think that Dretske's main insight is important and appealing. That is, one might think it plausible that representations have the function of carrying information and that this bears on their content. We will look at an alternative attempt to elaborate this insight in section 3.5.

3.2 Consumer and Benefit-Based Theories

As we have just noted, Dretske claims that representations and representing systems have the function of carrying information and that representational contents are determined by these information-bearing functions. Some proponents of teleological theories adopt a markedly different approach. Most notably, Ruth Millikan (1984, 1989b, 1990, 1991, 1993) focuses on the functions of what she refers to as the "consumers" of representations, where the consumers are the systems that use the representations to perform their (i.e., the consumers') proper functions.

Millikan gives some general arguments for a consumer-based approach, which will be examined briefly before her account of content is characterized. For one, she seems to claim that an appeal to representation consumers helps to solve the functional indeterminacy problem (this claim is discussed in section 4.1). Putting this aside for the moment, she offers two further arguments. One appeals to the fact that teleological functions are selected effects and concludes that any appeal to representational functions must be an appeal to the effects of representations (Millikan 1989b, p. 85). Since the effects of representations concern the consumers of representations, Millikan concludes that we must look to the consumption and not the production of a representation, when we develop a teleological theory of content. This assumes that we are committed to looking to representational functions. Assuming we are, a response is that functions might be seen as more than selected effects, and as selected dispositions (see again the end of section 2, in this entry). Since dispositions involve causes as well as effects, an appeal to functions need not then make the production of representations irrelevant.

Millikan's second argument involves the claim that something qualifies as a representation only if it is used as a representation (Millikan 1989, pp. 84-90). She concludes that a representation's content must be determined by its use, or else something could count as a representation without it representing anything, which is nonsense. The thought seems to be this: if representational status and representational content are determined separately, something could count as a representation, by satisfying the requirements for representational status, without representing anything in particular, by at the same time failing to satisfy the requirements for representational content.

Some might want to question the claim that representations must be used as representations. However, another response, which does not question this, is as follows. Suppose that for something to be a representation, two requirements must be satisfied: one that is content-determining, as long as the other is also satisfied. To hark back to Dretske's proposal, perhaps something is a representation if, (a) it has been recruited for indicating something, and (b) it has been recruited for playing a certain role in causing bodily movements. We have seen that this suggestion is problematic. However, it is the general two-part form of the proposal that is of interest here, not the specifics of either (a) and (b). These requirements, (a) and (b) together, may not be satisfactory as a characterization of representational status. But what matters here is whether they are consistent with Millikan's claim that for something to be a representation it must be used as a representation. If (b) is one way to articulate that requirement, then they are consistent with her claim. And yet on this proposal the content of a representation is not determined by its use but by its indicator function.

While general arguments for a consumer-based approach might be inconclusive, such an approach might be correct nonetheless, and Millikan's theory has certainly been very influential. On her theory, the content of a representation is linked to the performance of the proper functions of its consumers. When the relevant representation is used to communicate between creatures, the producer and the consumer of the representation are different creatures. One of Millikan's examples is of a beaver splash: the beaver that splashes its tail is the producer of the representation and the consumers are the nearby beavers that dive for cover, having been warned of danger. In the case of internal representations, the producer and consumer are both parts or aspects of the same creature. The consumers and producers could be different systems or different time-slices of the same systems, before and after the representation is tokened. In either case, a consumer is a system that normally exploits the mapping between a representation and its represented in the performance of its proper function, where the normality is teleological and not statistical. Consumers might or might not be cognitive systems. Consider the often mentioned case of the frog that responds to anything appropriately small, dark and moving past its retina by darting out its tongue. In this case, one relevant consumer of the frog's perceptual representation is the frog's digestive system. The digestive system is not a cognitive system and has no direct dealings with the representation, but its performance of its proper function of feeding the frog depends on and in that sense exploits the mapping between the representation and its represented, which according to Millikan is frog food.

To find out the content of a representation, says Millikan, we look at the functions of its consumers, although even these do not directly determine the content of the representation. A consumer has a function because past tokens of the type did something that contributed to the preservation or proliferation of such a system in the population. Ancestral frogs had ancestral digestive systems, and these did things that contributed to the preservation and proliferation of such digestive systems in frogs. It is the explanation of their preservation or proliferation that most nearly concerns content, says Millikan. To determine the content of a representation, we look at those past occasions when consumers contributed to their own preservation or proliferation, and we ask what mapping between the representation and the world was typically required for this, on those occasions when the representation was used. According to Millikan, the frog's visual representation represents frog-food, since it was only when frog-food accompanied such a representation that the frog was fed, and only then that the frog's digestive system contributed to its preservation and proliferation by using that representation. Millikan calls that which must have mapped on to the representation in this way the Normal condition for the performance of the proper function of the consumer. The Normal condition is the content of the representation.

An issue worth considering is whether a multiplicity of consumers for a given representation will lead to more content ambiguity than we want. This will depend on how often different consumers have different Normal conditions for the use of the same representation. There is no guarantee that the Normal conditions of different consumers (with respect to a given representation) will always coincide, because what benefits one system in an organism can damage another. If this is not a problem, and if the needs of consuming systems routinely coincide, one might wonder if the needs of producing systems will coincide with them as well.

Whether or not a consumer-based approach is desirable, Millikan's theory has some advantages in comparison with Dretske's indicator semantics (see Godfrey-Smith 1989). On Millikan's theory, a representation, R, can represent some environmental feature, C, even if Rs have never indicated Cs. That is, R can represent C even if it was never reliable that if there was an R then there was a C. It's good enough, on her theory, that Rs have mapped on to Cs often enough for the representation's consumers to have exploited that relation and benefited from doing so. This means that Millikan does not have the same need for a distinction between recruitment and post-recruitment phases or between recruitment and post-recruitment environments. On her theory, Rs can misrepresent even where and while the relevant selection or learning continues.

It can be argued that Millikan has also solved the problem of distal content, and for innate as well as learned concepts. Since neither neural firings, retinal images, nor light reflected from prey feed a frog, and because only frog food will feed a frog, it can be argued that the Normal condition for the performance of the proper function of the consumer of the frog's perceptual representation is frog food, which is distal. However, whether Millikan's solution to the problem of distal content survives closer scrutiny is not clear. In the case of the frog, one problem is that its digestive system does not require only frog food for the performance of its proper function. Frog food is no use to a frog if the frog cannot detect it, so feeding a frog normally also requires that information about the food be carried to the frog. To solve the problem of distal content, a theory of content must exclude inappropriate proximal items, as well as include appropriate distal items. Food is included in the content of the frog's perceptual representation, on Millikan's theory, but the issue is whether the proximal items that carry information about the food to the frog are also excluded. Thus the issue is whether Millikan's characterization of Normal conditions precludes the proximal items.

Millikan considers a related objection to do with omnipresent beneficial background conditions, the worry being that her theory does not seem to exclude them. To stay with the same example, the problem is that other things besides frog food were required for a contribution to fitness on past occasions when the frog's perceptual representation was used: oxygen and gravity, for instance. A worry is that her theory entails that the frog's perceptual representation does not mean frog food but something more like frog food in the presence of oxygen and gravity, etc.. Millikan claims that she can exclude such background conditions because they do not explain the success of the systems that consume the representation. Frog food does seem explanatorily more salient, in comparison to both more proximal things and in comparison to omnipresent beneficial background conditions, but an issue is whether this intuitive idea can be elaborated in a suitably naturalistic way.

This entry refers to theories like Millikan's as benefit-based theories, since they intuitively link content to the special benefit to the creature that accrues from the use of the representation. Gravity is not a benefit that accrues to frogs because they use their prey-representation. Nor are retinal firings beneficial per se. Nutrition, on the other hand, is a special benefit that accrues to frogs when they use their prey-representation. Benefit-based theories need not be consumer-based theories, however, since we could speak of benefits to both producing and consuming systems, or to the creature as a whole.

Some objections to Millikan's theory put worries about how the special benefit is isolated aside, in order to question whether Normal conditions — intuitively understood — give correct content ascriptions. One objection is that they generate contents that are overly specific. Consider the fact that all sorts of circumstances could prevent a contribution to fitness: for example, an infected fly, or a crow standing nearby, could spell death instead of nutrition for the frog (Hall 1990). It has been argued that Millikan's theory has the unintuitive consequence that the frog's representation has the content food that is free of debilitating infections, with no crows standing nearby … etc. and that such contents are implausible. Millikan denies that such contents are implausible.

Another objection is that Millikan conflates evolutionary explanations and intentional explanations of behaviors and divorces perceptual contents unduly from what can be discriminated. Paul Pietroski (1992) tells an imaginary tale to press the point. In the beginning, the kimu are simple-minded, color-blind creatures. Then Jack is born with an internal mechanism that produces a certain brain state, B, in response to certain wavelengths of light. Jack enjoys the resulting sensation as do those of his descendants who inherit the mutation and the mechanism. As Pietroski wants to describe the case, B has the content, red. Jack's descendants see red and are attracted to it, which leads them to climb to the top of the nearest hill every morning to see the rising sun. As luck has it, they consequently avoid the dawn-marauding predators, the snorf, who hunt in the valley below, and as a result (and solely as a result of this) there is selection for the mutation. The point of the story is that Millikan's theory does not allow the story to be told this way. On her theory, Jack's descendants do not represent red, and so cannot see red or desire to see it. For it wasn't the mapping between B and red, but between B and snorf-free-space that was most crucial for the fitness of Jack and his descendants. Thus, on Millikan's theory, Bs mean snorf-free-space (or fewer snorfs this way, or something of this sort) and there is no representation of red by the kimu.

Pietroski argues that biting the bullet is radically revisionist in this case. Behavioral tests, he says, could support his claim: plant a red flag among a crowd of snorfs and Jack's descendants will move toward it; paint a snorf red and Jack's descendants will follow it. It is consistent with his story that Jack's descendants might never have seen a snorf, and might be unable to recognise one standing smack in front of their faces. Intuitively, we want to say that they might know nothing of snorfs. Pietroski suggests that this is a problem for all teleological theories of content, as does Hall, with respect to the preceding objection. However, both objections are, more specifically, objections to benefit-based versions of teleosemantics. In so far as they are a problem, they are a problem for any theory that links perceptual contents, not to the causes of perceptual representations, but to the benefits that result from using them. (A theory that is not benefit-based is considered in section 3.5).

Millikan (2000, p. 149) agrees that her theory entails that the kimus do not represent red and instead represent fewer snorf this way. She "bites the bullet" but claims that it is palatable. In support of this, she maintains that we need to distinguish between the properties represented and the properties that cause representations. How else, she asks, could a tortoise think "chow over there", given that being nutritious is an invisible property and so could not cause a perceptual representation.

Carolyn Price (2001), who offers a detailed teleological theory that closely follows Millikan's in some respects, also defends Millikan's interpretation of the kimu's representation. She claims that this interpretation does a better job of explaining their behavior by making it seem rational. In doing so, she endorses the idea that the point of making content ascriptions is to rationalize behavior. The thought is that a desire to avoid snorf is a better reason for climbing to the top of the hill than a desire to watch the sun rise is. A number of responses are possible. One is to contend that a desire to watch a sun rise is a good enough reason for climbing to the top of a hill. One might also argue that, while her interpretation explains why the kimu climb to the top of the hill, it provides a peculiar explanation of why the kimu crowd into snorf-infested spaces when the snorf are near red: i.e., on this interpretation, the kimu reliably mistake snorf-infested spaces that are near red for snorf-free spaces. Which interpretation best rationalizes the behavior can therefore be disputed. A different response is to question whether it is the role of content ascriptions to rationalize behavior.

Neander (forthcoming) disputes the claim that this is the role of content ascriptions in cognitive science. She argues that, in this context, benefit-based theories generate the wrong contents, not only for the kimu, but also for the simple cases that have been the staples of the literature (the frog, etc.). More precisely, she argues that these theories often fail to generate contents that can play a role in information-processing explanations of the relevant cognitive capacities. Millikan maintains that how a representation is produced is irrelevant to its content, whereas Neander tries to show that this is not true, on an information-processing approach. Her claim is that the information-processing that leads to a perceptual representation constrains the perceptual content of that representation. She argues that, on an information-processing approach, invisible properties cannot be represented in perception until visible properties have been represented first: vision must begin by representing the surface features of objects. The claim is that, if something's being nutritious is represented, its being nutritious must be inferred from its surface properties (e.g., its being green, or its being small, dark and moving). This runs counter to a benefit-based theory, if such a theory entails that in some cases it is only the invisible but beneficial property that is represented in perception.

One might wonder if some content ascriptions are suitable for some theoretical purposes, and others for others. It is possible that contents suitable for an information-processing approach will not be suitable for other (e.g., Gibsonian) approaches to explaining cognitive capacities. Further afield, Larry Shapiro (1992) discusses the role of content ascriptions in foraging theory, which raises a different set of theoretical considerations.

Before closing this sub-section, we should also note that Millikan occasionally makes it clear that her theory is intended as a version of an isomorphism theory. According to an isomorphism theory, representation is a matter of preserving the similarities and differences among relations such that relations in the represented domain are mirrored by relations in the representing domain. This is therefore a resemblance theory, but the relevant resemblances are second-order or relational: there is no requirement that representations share properties other than abstract relational properties with their representeds. This makes isomorphism theories more plausible than crude resemblance theories. They also have some currency with cognitive scientists (e.g., see Gallistel 1990, and Palmer 1999, 77). Moreover, a teleological version of an isomorphism theory has the resources to address at least some of the traditional objections to isomorphism theories. For instance, one traditional objection is that resemblance is too cheap: i.e., the objection is that everything maps on to everything by some rule of mapping or other (Goodman 1976). However, as mentioned in the introduction to section 3, a teleological theory can restrict the relevant mappings to those that the system was designed to exploit. This part of Millikan's theory is not much discussed in this entry, however, because it is not very much developed.

To a large extent, Millikan's theory has been responsible for the great interest, both positive and negative, that philosophers have shown in assessing this general class of theories. While this section summarizes her core idea, readers will need to turn to her extensive writings for the full version. A similar warning applies to all the theories summarized here, but since Millikan's writings on the topic are very extensive and are sometimes hard to integrate, the warning is especially relevant in this case. For the best brief version of her theory, readers should probably turn to her "Biosemantics" (Millikan 1989b, reprinted in Millikan 1993).

3.3 Non-combinatorial Theories

We have seen that teleological theories of mental content can appeal to the functions of producers or consumers of representations. They can also link content more closely to normal benefits to fitness, or to the information that representations normally carry. Another important difference lies with the kinds of contents that these theories are most directly aimed at explaining. David Papineau's theory, which was independently developed at the same time as Millikan's, will help illustrate this point. Papineau (1984, 1987, 1990 and 1993) develops a theory that is distinctively top-down, or non-combinatorial, insofar as the representational states to which his theory most directly applies are whole propositional attitudes (e.g., beliefs and desires). Millikan sometimes seems to hold a similar view and some of the objections raised against her theory are based on this interpretation of her (see, for example, Fodor 1990b, 64-69, where he raises some of the points that follow).

In Papineau's theory, the contents of desires are primary and those of beliefs are secondary. According to Papineau, a desire's "real satisfaction condition" is "… that effect which it is the desire's biological purpose to produce" (1993, 58-59), by which he means that "[s]ome past selection mechanism has favored that desire — or, more precisely, the ability to form that type of desire — in virtue of that desire producing that effect" (1993, 59). So desires have the function of causing us, in collaboration with our beliefs, to bring about certain conditions, conditions that enhanced the fitness of people in the past who had these desires, which caused them to bring about these conditions. Desires, in general, were selected for causing us to bring about conditions that contributed to our fitness, and particular desires were selected for causing us to bring about particular conditions. These conditions are referred to as their satisfaction conditions and they are the contents of desires.

The "real truth condition" of a belief, Papineau tells us, is the condition that must obtain if the desire with which it collaborates in producing an action is to be satisfied by the condition brought about by that action. A desire that has the function of bringing it about that we have food has the content that we have food, since it was selected for bringing it about that we have food. If this desire collaborates with a belief to cause us to go to the fridge, the content of the belief is that there is food in the fridge if our desire for food would only be satisfied by our doing so if it is true that there is food in the fridge.

This approach is in contrast to a combinatorial semantics. Language is combinatorial to the extent that the meaning of a sentence is a function of the meanings of the words in the sentence and their syntactic relations. "Rover attacked Fluff" has a combinatorial meaning if its meaning is a function of the meaning of "Rover", the meaning of "attacked", and the meaning of "Fluff", along with their syntactic relations (so that "Rover attacked Fluff" differs in meaning from "Fluff attacked Rover"). According to some philosophers, the content of propositional attitudes is combinatorial in an analogous sense. That is, for instance, the content of a belief is a function of the contents of the component conceptual parts of the complex representation of the proposition believed, along with their syntactic relations. A teleological theory of content can be combinatorial, for it can maintain that the content of a representation that expresses a proposition is determined by the separate histories of the representations for the conceptual constituents of the proposition (and, perhaps, by the selection history of the syntactic rules that apply to their syntactic relations). Papineau's theory is not, however, combinatorial.

Papineau's theory is a benefit-based theory, and it can be argued that it runs into problems parallel to some of those discussed in the previous sub-section. Intuitively, the content of a desire need not be what is beneficial to fitness. One might want sex, not the babies or bonding that tend to result from it, and yet it might be the babies and the bonding that are crucial for fitness. However, this section will not attempt an overview of the strengths and weaknesses of this theory, but will instead focus on issues peculiar to non-combinatorial accounts.

Any non-combinatorial theory must face certain general objections to non-combinatorial theories. It is argued (e.g., by Fodor 1981, 1987) that they cannot sufficiently account for the productivity and systematicity of our thoughts. This entry will not rehearse that argument, but it should be noted that there are special problems for a teleological version of a non-combinatorial theory. Consider, for example, the desire to dance around a magnolia tree when the stars are bright, while wearing two carrots for horns and two half cabbages for breasts. Probably no-one has wanted to do this. But now suppose that someone does develop this desire (to prove Papineau wrong, say) so that it is desired for the first time. We cannot characterize the situation in this way, according to a non-combinatorial teleological theory. Since it has never been desired before, it has no history of selection and so no content on its first occurrence, on that style of theory. It is also a problem for this kind of theory that some desires do not, or cannot, contribute to their own satisfaction (e.g., the desire for rain tomorrow or the desire to be immortal) and that some desires that do contribute to their own satisfaction will not be selected for doing so (e.g., the desire to kill one's children). In contrast, teleological theories that are combinatorial have no special problem with novel desires, desires that cannot contribute to bringing about their own satisfaction conditions, or desires that have satisfaction conditions that do not enhance fitness, as long as their constitutive concepts have appropriate selection histories.

Papineau might respond by agreeing that some concessions to a combinatorial semantics have to be made. However, a worry is that such concessions would be ad hoc. The problem is to justify the claim that the desire to blow up a plane with a shoe explosive is combinatorial, whereas the belief that there is food in the fridge is not. General problems for combinatorial semantics would also remain.

3.4 More or Less Modest Combinatorial Theories

Some teleological theories of mental content, in contrast to Papineau's theory, are combinatorial theories. According to these theories, a teleological theory directly accounts for the contents of just the representational primitives, and combinatorial mechanisms are in addition required to account for the contents of more complex representations. There are two kinds of possible combinatorial mechanisms that are relevant. One kind is thought by some to play a role that is analogous to that of the grammar of a spoken language. It is thought to combine representations that express concepts to form more complex representations, often of propositions: e.g., it might combine the concepts CAT, ON, and MAT, to produce the thought (belief, desire, etc.) that the cat is on the mat (or the thought that the mat is on the cat). In addition, some think that there may be a second kind of combinatorial mechanism, which combines concepts to form more complex concepts: e.g., it might combine the concepts MALE, ADULT, NOT and MARRIED to form the concept BACHELOR. Someone who thinks that there are both kinds of combinatorial mechanisms might also think that teleological theories only directly account for the most basic of our concepts. Such theories have been dubbed "modest theories" (Sterelny, 1990). Dretske (1986), expresses a "modest" view when he gives voice to the hope that more sophisticated representations can be built out of the simple representations his theory accommodates.

One "modest" view is that a teleological theory should directly apply to innate concepts only (i.e., those that can be produced without learning). However, this needs qualifying, since it is controversial how many of our concepts are innate, and on some views there is nothing modest about this claim. For instance, on a radical nativist view (Fodor, 1981), all or almost all of the concepts expressed by the lexical morphemes (the smallest meaningful components) of a language are innate. Those who propose "modest" teleological theories do not hold this view, for they claim that some mental representations that correspond to lexical morphemes are conceptually complex, in the sense that they are somehow composed of simpler concepts.

Kim Sterelny (1990) describes his teleological theory as "modest" because it only attempts to give an account of innate representations. As for giving an account of the human propositional attitudes, Sterelny maintains that a teleological theory of content will face "appalling difficulties". He believes that a teleological theory for the representational simples will be part of the complete psycho-semantic theory, but not the whole of it. This obviously contrasts with Papineau's theory, which applies most directly to the propositional attitudes, and it also contrasts with Millikan's (1984) ambitious attempt to directly account, not only for the contents of all mental representations, but also the contents of all linguistic utterances, via a fundamental teleological theory.

Modest theories can be developed in different ways. Sterelny maintains that a representation "… represents (i.e., represents correctly) rather than misrepresents when the token is caused by circumstances of the same kind as those selectively responsible for the existence of the type" (1990). By "kind" he means a real or natural kind. According to Sterelny, in the case of the frog that snaps at anything suitably small, dark and moving, "[t]he natural representational hypothesis, and the one underwritten by teleological considerations, is this. The content of the frog's visual system is: that's a fly’" (1990, 125). This assumes that flies are the kind selectively responsible for the existence of that type of representation. (Actually, real frogs, including Rana pipeans, the frogs that first inspired the philosophical example, prey on many different kinds of creatures in their natural habitats.)

It is worth noting that Sterelny's appeal to an ecologically relevant kind is somewhat different to an appeal to what was crucial for fitness. However, Sterelny's discussion of this alternative proposal is brief. As he notes, the relevant notion of a kind is vague. Moreover, it is not clear that it can do the work asked of it here. Too loosely understood, the appeal to a kind will do no work in the analysis; too rigorously understood, it will be too restrictive, since we plausibly have innate representations of kinds of things that are not, in any strong sense, real or natural kinds: e.g., colors.

Again, however, no attempt at an overall critique will be attempted, in order to focus on some general points about modest theories. First, a teleological theory that is modest has some advantages. Most obviously, unless some concepts can be derived from other concepts, teleological theories will have trouble accounting for novel and empty concepts. For example, no mapping between unicorns and UNICORNs could have been crucial for any actual contribution to fitness. No unicorns were ever indicated. Unicorns are not the Normal condition for the performance of the proper function of systems that make use of UNICORN. The desire to find a unicorn cannot have been satisfied on past occasions when people wanted to find one, and such a desire cannot in that manner have ever contributed to fitness. Nor, for that matter, was the unicorn-kind selectively responsible for the representation, UNICORN. Similarly, when the concept of an electron was first introduced, there can have been no past selection that relied on a special mapping between electrons and ELECTRONs.

This problem is avoided by a teleological theory that tries to account for the contents of just the representational simples, on the assumption that none of these simples express empty or novel concepts. However, those offering modest theories will need to explain how empty and novel concepts can be composed out of or derived from the use of non-empty and non-novel concepts. Some novel and empty concepts are plausibly syntactically compositional (e.g., BLUE MAMMAL) but the harder cases are not. It might fairly be said that it is not the task of a fundamental theory of content per se to explain how complex concepts can be composed out of simple ones, but it is a problem for modest theories if no such explanation is available. Moreover, providing such an explanation is generally thought to be problematic. Some say that "modest" theories have some seriously immodest consequences, the main one being that there must be a principled analytic/synthetic distinction (see, for instance, Fodor and Lepore, 1992, who argue that it's either this or meaning holism, and Devitt 1996, and Prinz 2001, who reply to this). Readers who want to pursue this issue could turn to the literature on concepts (e.g., Margolis and Laurence, eds. 1999).

3.5 Informational Theories Revisited

To round out this survey of teleological theories, we return to informational versions, to make clear that some can avoid certain objections to Dretskean indicator-semantics as well as certain objections to benefit-based theories. This section briefly describes a proposal favored by this author. It is intended as a "modest" proposal, in the sense characterized above; thus it is intended to apply to just the representational simples.

It is also intended to answer the conditional content question for representational simples. The conditional content question asks, "On the assumption that something is a representation, what determines its content?" Thus the proposal is consistent with the claim that further conditions might have to be satisfied for representational status to be satisfied. The proposal first defines a notion of informing and then uses that notion to describe content-determining conditions for representational simples, as follows:

  1. A mechanism/process informs representations of type R about situations of type C, to the extent that it enhances the correlation between Rs and Cs.
  2. Rs represent Cs if mechanisms/processes were adapted for informing them about Cs by causally connecting them with Cs.

The proposal needs glossing. Crucially, mechanisms can correlate representations with their contents by causally connecting them with them in different ways. For example, the relevant mechanisms might be caused by a represented to produce the representation, or the representation might cause the relevant mechanisms to produce what is represented. Thus, C1s (certain things that are seen) can cause the mechanism to produce R1s (certain perceptual representations), or R2s (certain motor instructions) can cause the mechanism to produce C2s (certain motor outputs). Doing either will tend to produce a correlation between representation and represented. Thus the proposal has some chance of working for some representations other than perceptual representations (e.g., it has some chance of working for motor output instructions too). Content is also mechanism or process-relative. We can speak of the perceptual content of a representation, by speaking of what perceptual processing informs it about. And we can, perhaps, speak of the motor output content of the same representation, by speaking of what motor-output mechanisms inform it about. Or, in such a case, we might speak of its combined sensorimotor content, by speaking about both.

The proposal also uses a graded notion of informing, in the sense that it allows that a mechanism can inform representations about their contents to a greater or lesser degree. That is, mechanisms can correlate representations and representeds to a greater or lesser degree. It thus allows that a mechanism can have been selected for informing a representation about its content, even if the correlation was always imperfect. So there is no need to specify special circumstances in which only the right causes or effects can accompany the representation. And there is no need, therefore, for a distinction between places and phases of selection in which misrepresentation (and hence representation) cannot occur, and places and phases where misrepresentation (and hence representation) can occur.

Further, this proposal generates different content ascriptions to those generated by benefit-based teleological theories. To see this, consider the frog's perceptual representation. The frog responds to anything small, dark and moving and thereby feeds itself. It is plausible that the relevant perceptual mechanisms in the frog were selected for correlating to some degree the relevant representation with small, dark, moving things. It is also plausible that they were selected for correlating to some degree the relevant representation with frog nutrients. For it was by correlating the representation with small, dark, moving dots that the perceptual processing correlated it with nutrients too. However, on this present proposal, the perceptual content of the representation is small, dark, moving things, or something of this sort, and not nutrients. This is because the relevant mechanism is causally sensitive to the size and motion of the stimulus, and not to the nutritional value of the stimulus. Packets of nutrients that are not appropriately small, dark and moving do not cause a normal frog to produce the relevant representation, whereas small, dark, moving things that are not packets of nutrients do. Thus the mechanism was not selected for correlating the relevant representations with nutrients by causally connecting them with nutrients. It did not causally connect them, and items can only be selected by natural selection for things that they did do.

The proposal also disambiguates in favor of red, not snorf-free space, for the kimu. By hypothesis, the brain state, B, is correlated (to some extent) with both red and snorf-free space, by the mechanism that results from Jack's mutation. Moreover, the mutation and the mechanism were selected for informing B about both these things, because it was by informing B about instances of red that it was informed about snorf-free space, which is what saves the kimu from snorfs. However, the content of B is red, because the mechanism was selected for causally connecting B with instances of red and not with snorf-free spaces. (Red, with or without snorf, causes Bs; snorfs, with or without red, do not.) The proposal thus avoids the objections to benefit-based theories raised by Pietroski and Neander.

It might be questioned whether this type of proposal is a teleological theory, but it is. Consider that a frog with a suitably damaged thalamus will respond to moving stimuli by attempting to catch all sorts of moving things, such as large, looming, predator-like squares, an experimenter's hand and even the frog's own limbs. The representations involved in these cases count as misrepresenting, because the proposal appeals to selected dispositions, not current causal dispositions. The representations involved in these cases count as misrepresentations, on this proposal, because the relevant mechanisms (items of certain homologous types) were not selected for informing the relevant representation about these things (large, looming, predator-like squares, etc.)

While the present proposal avoids some of the objections to indicator-semantics and benefit-based theories, it has its problems. One issue is how it is to provide unambiguously distal content, which as it stands (as described above) it does not yet do. In this respect, it is in good company, but the problem remains a major problem, nonetheless.

Millikan maintains that a theory of this sort, one which links perceptual contents to the causes of perceptual representations, is too "verificationist" (Millikan 2000). Clearly, it is not a verificationist theory of meaning, in the usual sense. However, her claim is that a proposal of this sort ties perceptual contents too closely to the causes of perceptual representations, and hence too closely to the surface features of objects. Millikan argues that contents must be de-linked from the causes of representations. How else, she asks, can a tortoise think, "Chow over there!", rather than merely, "green stuff over there!", if it is the greenness of the chow rather than its nutritional properties that causes the relevant representation. This is, of course, a return to the debate already touched on in section 3.2, and as we have seen, it is controversial just what contents a good theory of content should generate in such a case. It is controversial whether the tortoise should be said to see that, think that, or recognize that something is nutritious. To settle this question, and to get away from mere conflicts of intuition, we need to consider the theoretical demands on content ascriptions.

One demand that must ultimately be met is that we provide for what are sometimes referred to, in the psychological literature, as "essentialist concepts" (Gelman & Wellman 1999): i.e., concepts of kinds that have possibly hidden or unknown natures or essences. The concept of water is an essentialist concept if we can use it to think specifically about water (and not also about superficially indistinguishable liquids), and could use it to do so even before we know the essential chemical composition of water. One interpretation of Millikan's concern is that a proposal of this sort cannot provide for essentialist concepts.

However, one response that can be made on behalf of the present proposal is that it is not intended as a complete theory of mental content; it is intended as a theory of simples. The issue, then, is whether essentialist concepts are plausibly simple. If not, they are not in the scope of this proposal. Many think that essentialist concepts involve an implicit intention to refer to something hidden or unknown that nonetheless explains the surface phenomena by which we recognize that things are of the relevant kind. If so, to possess an essentialist concept is to possess a rather sophisticated intentional capacity: one probably acquired early by human children (Welman & Gellman 1999), but presumably not ever acquired by toads and tortoises. Essentialist concepts are therefore plausible candidates for non-simples.

Even if this objection does not succeed outright, however, it does illustrate the difficulties that lie ahead. As with other modest theories, the largest problem with this proposal, putting aside the problem of distal content, is how to move from here to more sophisticated concepts and representational capacities. The proposal relies on the hope that more sophisticated concepts and representational capacities can be derived from the use of the simpler ones it covers. As noted at the end of the last section, it is controversial whether this hope can be realized.

4. Problems for Teleosemantics

The preceding survey of teleological theories of content does not mention all the extant teleological theories: for example, David Israel's (1987), Colin McGinn's (1989), and Daniel Dennett's (1995) have not been mentioned until now. However, it does illustrate the main differences among different versions of teleosemantics. We turn now to some objections that have been raised against the general idea of teleosemantics. This section looks at the three objections that have been most influential. Some have already been touched on in previous sections.

4.1 Functional Indeterminacy

"The" functional indeterminacy problem (Dretske 1986; Fodor 1990b) is really at least two problems, or three, if we include the problem of distal content. Aside from the problem of distal content, which has been discussed above, there is the problem that natural selection is extensional and the problem of selection for complex causal roles. These are discussed in this section, starting with the problem that natural selection is extensional.

Fodor once devised a teleological theory of mental content (published years later, as Fodor 1990a). However, he quickly repudiated the idea and has since been one of the most vigorous critics of teleological theories. His main objection was that teleological theories leave content too indeterminate because functions are too indeterminate to determine content. Functional indeterminacy, according to Fodor (1990b), stems from the fact that natural selection is extensional in the following sense: if it is adaptive for an organism, O, to do something, M, in the presence of environmental feature, F, and F is reliably co-extensive with another feature, G, then it is equally adaptive for O to do M in the presence of G. Fodor argues that teleological theories therefore cannot distinguish between candidate contents that are co-extensional in the environment in which a creature evolved.

Fodor's example is the frog that snaps at anything that is suitably small, dark and moving and thereby feeds itself. According to Fodor, it was as adaptive for the frog to snap at small, dark, moving things as it was for it to snap at flies, if flies and small, dark, moving things were reliably co-extensive in the frog's natural habitat. According to Fodor, we can therefore say that the function of the device is to detect flies and that its function is to detect small, dark, moving things. So, if we try to determine the content of the device's firing by appeal to the function of the device, the content remains indeterminate, he says. If we choose to describe its function the first way, then its content is fly, but if we choose to describe its function the second way, then its content is small, dark, moving thing. The content will then depend on how we choose to describe the function, and a content that depends on our choice is not a naturalized content.

The standard response to this objection starts by pointing out that the function of a trait is what that type of trait was selected for, and that the notion of selection for is a causal notion (Sterelny 1990; Millikan 1991). A trait is selected for its possession of a certain property only if that property causally contributed to its selection. Thus the pineal gland was selected for its releasing of melatonin only if the releasing of melatonin by ancestral pineal glands contributed to the preservation and proliferation of pineal glands in the population. Along similar lines, the heart was selected for circulating blood, but not for making a thumping noise, if the former but not the latter contributed to the selection of hearts. Functions can therefore distinguish between two properties that reliably co-vary as long as one but not the other caused the trait to be selected.

This point has mostly been well-taken. However, it is also generally agreed that this does not suffice to disambiguate content in a case like that of the frog (Griffiths & Goode 1995; Neander 1995). In the case of the frog, its responding to small, dark, moving things and its catching something nutritious both played a causal role in the relevant selection process, because it was by detecting small, dark moving things that the frog got fed. We return to this case when we consider the problem of selection for complex causal roles.

Fodor (1996) responds that there is anyway a remainder of a problem because content is more fine-grained than causation is. He points out that some pairs of properties are logically or nomologically co-extensive: e.g., being triangular and being trilateral, and being a renate and being a cordate. According to Fodor, since we cannot distinguish between selection for the one and selection for the other, there is a problem for teleological theories of content. We can represent each distinctly but, according to Fodor, causation is not sufficiently fine-grained to distinguish their contents.

However, it is not obvious that this is a problem for a theory of referential content. Consider the two options: either the causal powers of two co-extensional properties x and y can be distinguished, or they cannot be. Suppose they cannot be. On some plausible theories of properties, properties are individuated by their causal powers, so if there is no difference in the causal powers of x and y, they are the same property. On that view, a representation that refers to the one must refer to the other too, and so there is no problem here for a theory of referential content. On this way of thinking, if there is no distinction between the causal powers of triangularity and trilaterality, any difference in the mental representations TRIANGULAR and TRILATERAL must be a difference of a different sort, such as a difference in cognitive role. Suppose, on the other hand, that there is a distinction in causal powers. In that case this particular objection does not get off the ground.

We turn now to the second functional indeterminacy problem. It stems from the fact that organic systems are selected for complex causal roles. For example, a trait in an antelope might have been selected because it (i) altered the shape of some hemoglobin, (ii) which increased oxygen uptake, (iii) which allowed the antelope to move to higher ground, (iv) which gave them access to richer pasture in summer, (v) and so enhanced their chances of survival and reproductive success (Neander, 1995). To determine the function of a trait, according to an etiological theory of functions, one asks, "what did past instances of that type of trait do that caused that trait to be selected?". In this case, the answer is that it did all of (i) through (v). Thus, on such a theory, all these options would serve as correct function ascriptions. Different descriptions of the function of a trait can be had by focusing on different aspects of the complex causal role for which it was selected. As a rule, all biological traits that have functions will have the ultimate telos of enhancing (inclusive) fitness, but there are also the more specific things they did that caused their selection. Since this is usually a cascade of things done, there will be a number of more specific function ascriptions that can also be made.

Notice that something similar is true of the frog's detection device. The frog's detection device was selected because it (a) detected small, dark, moving things and because (b) that helped feed the frog. Both (a) and (b) are correct answers to the question, "what did the trait do that caused it to be selected?". Thus its responding to something small, dark and moving, and its assisting in the catching of something nutritious, can both be legitimately mentioned in correct descriptions of the frog's detection device. This does not depend on (a) and (b) being co-extensional. Even if they were not co-extensional in the frog's natural habitat (which they surely were not) the problem would remain.

Different proponents of teleosemantics have differed widely in their responses to the problem of complex causal roles. Nicholas Agar (1993) supports the idea that the frog's representation represents small, dark, moving food, a content intended to incorporate all causally relevant properties.

Price (1998, 2001) claims that, contrary to what has just been said, there is a unique, correct function ascription for each trait. She offers a more complex etiological theory of functions, and elaborates a number of principles, which cannot be summarized in short order, which are intended to isolate the unique, correct function ascription. Berant Enc (2002) endorses Price's claim that function ascriptions must be determinate if any teleological theory of content is to succeed, but he raises problems for her attempt to show that function ascriptions are suitably determinate. Contrary to both Price and Enc, one might maintain that there is no unique, correct function ascription for a trait, but that content can still be determined by an appeal to functions, plus some additional further principles.

Neander (1995) takes this approach. She argues, as above, that there is more than one correct description of a trait's function, but that a description may be privileged in particular contexts. For example, she argues that although the trait in the antelope has the function of doing all of (i) through (v), it does not count as malfunctioning unless it lacks the capacity to do the more immediate of its functions (that by which it does the other things): i.e., it does not malfunction unless it alters the shape of the hemoglobin. Its failure to do other things may or may not be due to its malfunctioning, she says: e.g., its failure to lead to better pasture in summer may be due to new highway construction. Similarly, she says, the same "more immediate" description is appropriate for content determination, in the case of simple representational systems. Thus, on this view, the frog's perceptual representation represents small, dark moving things, since it is by detecting small, dark moving things that the frog's perceptual system helps the frog feed itself. (We saw a somewhat different proposal from Neander in section 3.5.)

In responding to this problem, Millikan (1991) might be thought to rely on the fact that, on her theory, it is the proper function of the consumer and not that of the producer of the representation that determines its content. To some extent, this interpretation is understandable. For instance, she says that, "[t]he mechanisms THAT USE the magnetesome's offerings don't care at all whether the magnet points to magnetic north, geomagnetic north or, say, to the North Star. The only one of the conditions Dretske mentioned that is necessary FOR THE USER'S PROPER FUNCTIONING is that the magnet point in the direction of lesser oxygen" (Millikan 1991, 163, original emphasis). However, it seems unlikely (to this author) that Millikan really intends to appeal to representational consumers per se to solve the problem, since the consumers are selected for causal roles that are just as complex as the producers are. Recall that one consumer of the frog's perceptual representation is its digestive system. We can describe the function of the frog's digestive system as providing nourishment, but we can also describe it as performing certain chemical operations on what is ingested. Another consumer is the frog's tongue-snapping mechanism. We can describe its function as snapping at frog food, but we can also describe it as snapping when and where the brain tells it to. Thus a mere appeal to consumers would seem to shift the problem without solving it. An alternative interpretation of Millikan's position is that she appeals to the Normal conditions of consumers to solve the problem. At least intuitively, what was special and crucial for enhancing frog fitness, when use of the relevant representation enhanced it, was that something nutritious was swallowed.

Finally, some proponents of teleological theories do not think that content is determinate in the cases used to illustrate the alleged problem, or that it is determinate in the ways that have been mentioned. Dennett, whose theory of content has evolved into a teleological theory, maintains that indeterminacy of content is unproblematic (Dennett 1995). Papineau (1997) also maintains that content is indeterminate, in the case of a simple system, like that of the frog, on the assumption that such creatures lack a belief-desire psychological structure. (Whether they have one or not will depend on what one means by that; it is not straightforward, for they have both informational and motivational states, but one might have good reasons for denying that these are propositional states.)

4.2 Swampman

Another objection that has been influential is the Swampman objection. Swampman-style examples have been around for some time. Christopher Boorse (1976) imagines a population of rabbits accidentally coalescing into existence, as a counter-example to Wright's etiological theory of functions. Boorse's claim was that we could ascribe functions to their parts, even if they lacked any selection-history. Swampman in particular was raised by Davidson (1987) as a potential objection to his own historical (but not teleological) theory of content.

When Swampman comes into existence he is a synchronic (at a time, but not extended over time) physical replica of Davidson at a certain point in time (t). The key difference between the two is that Swampman's history differs radically from Davidson's because he comes into existence as a result of a purely accidental collision of elementary particles. Crucially, he does not partake in our evolutionary history or have any evolutionary or developmental history of his own. Nor is he created by God or copied from Davidson by a machine. The resemblance is nothing but a stupendous coincidence. Swampman's appearance of design is deceptive because he in no way derives from any design process, natural or intentional. Swampman's component parts have no functions according to an etiological theory and his brain-state analogs have no contents according to a teleological theory of mental content.

Many people find these results of these theories highly counter-intuitive, especially the result that Swampman lacks all intentional states. Assuming physicalism, we could substitute Swampman for Davidson and no one, including his most intimate friends and family, would detect a difference. Swampman would have collected Davidson's salary and sat by his fireside, sipping wine with his friends, while making noises that they would have interpreted as witty, interesting, and so on. Nonetheless, according to teleological theories, Swampman can have no ideas about philosophy, no perceptions of his surroundings, and no beliefs or desires about anything at all.

There are two basic strategies in responding to this objection. One is to try to loosen the grip of the intuition that Swampman has intentional states, and the other is to argue that any intuitions that remain do not show that teleological theories are wrong. In either case, it is important to isolate the relevant intuition because, by all accounts, Swampman would have much that Davidson had at t. All of the chemical activity in Davidson's brain when he understood words, for example, would occur in Swampman's brain-analog, and certain descriptions of this activity will apply to both equally: e.g., physical, chemical and formal descriptions of it. Further, it is trivial that Swampman has narrow content, if "narrow content" is defined to mean whatever most closely approximates content, which nonetheless supervenes on just the narrow physical states of an individual at a time and "from the skin in". By definition, whatever narrow content Davidson had at t, Swampman must have had too, when he first pops into existence, since Swampman is at that point physically indistinguishable "from the skin in" from Davidson at t. What teleological theories entail is that Swampman, no matter what narrow content he has, lacks regular normative content: i.e., the kind of content that licences all the usual semantic evaluations. The intuition that conflicts with teleological theories, therefore, is that Swampman's brain state analogs are correct or incorrect, true or false, accurate or inaccurate, in the usual way.

It is clear that, if Swampman's inner states do have truth-evaluable content, they cannot always have the same truth values as Davidson's. At t, Swampman cannot remember his past life, since at most he can have pseudo-memories of Davidson's. And he cannot correctly think he is returning home and sitting in his house, since the house is not his. Further, it should be kept in mind that many think that Putnam and Kripke have shown that the contents of natural kind concepts are not all "in the head", and that Putnamesque twin cases can arguably be constructed for many other concepts/contents (Burge 1979, 1986). It thus requires careful analysis with respect to controversial issues to determine just what intuitions about Swampman would tell against the externalism of teleological theories.

Those who try to dislodge any remaining intuitions against teleological theories argue that an appearance of design can be misleading. (Recall that "design" here includes the mechanical design-work of natural selection.) Consider, for example, Boorse's swamprabbits. It might be intuitive to attribute functions to their eye-analogs, but is this just because they look designed? In nature, nothing remotely so intricately organized as if for the performance of a function fails to be the result of selection. It is argued that habits of thought usually take us from an appearance of design/selection to correct ascriptions of functions (Neander 1991). Dretske (1996) argues the case with another imaginary example. Twin-Tercel, a random replica of his old Tercel, comes about as the result of a freakish storm in a junk yard. It is molecule for molecule identical to Tercel, except that its gas-gauge analog does not move in relation to the amount of gas in its tank-analog. We might be tempted to say that the thing is broken, but Dretske says that there is no basis for saying that it does not work, because to say that it does not work implies that it was designed to do something it cannot do, and it was not designed to do anything. If we should reform our intuitions in the one case, perhaps we should also reform them in the case of Swampman's intentionality.

We might grant Dretske his claim about Twin-Tercel, and yet resist the move from functions to intentionality. The problem for theories of content, as opposed to theories of function, is exacerbated by the relation between intentionality and consciousness. Many philosophers find it plausible that an individual's phenomenal consciousness at a time supervenes on just the inner physical properties of that individual at that time. If this narrow supervenience thesis is true, then Swampman will have phenomenal consciousness when he comes into existence, assuming Davidson did at t. However, it is hard to see how we can attribute phenomenal consciousness to Swampman without also attributing some intentional states to him. Suppose, for example, that Swampman has a red-sensation. Then surely it will seem to him that he is seeing something red, but its seeming to him that he is seeing something red is presumably an intentional state.

Here we connect with another important issue that lies outside of the scope of this entry. However, a couple of points can be made. First, some proponents of teleological theories of content are not troubled by this line of argument because they reject the view that consciousness supervenes on narrow states and hold theories of phenomenal consciousness that deny consciousness to Swampman. According to some, phenomenal consciousness supervenes on (non-narrow) content, so if Swampman lacks content he must also lack phenomenal consciousness, on this view. This is Dretske's (1995) position. If, on the other hand, a proponent of teleosemantics accepts the narrow supervenience theory for phenomenal consciousness, s/he cannot deny that Swampman would have phenomenal consciousness. In that case, the objection remains in force and there appear to be just two options. One is to maintain that Swampman can have a red sensation without it seeming to him that he sees something red. The other is to maintain that, although it seems to Swampman that he sees something red, this seeming is not truth-evaluable. Whether or not the latter option is correct, it does cohere to some extent with the traditional idea that seemings have a special epistemic status. It fits with the traditional idea that we cannot be mistaken about how things seem to us, and that in that context, misrepresentation is not possible, although it does not fit with the idea that we are infallibly correct with respect to how things seem to us.

The second tack was to argue that Swampman intuitions cannnot show that teleological theories are incorrect because they are not to the point. They are, it can be argued, not to the point if a teleological theory is offered as a real-nature theory (Millikan 1996). A real-nature theory attempts to describe the nature of the relevant kind, and such natures can be (prior to successful analysis) unknown or hidden. The analogy of water and XYZ is thought to be helpful here. Recall that XYZ is an imaginary liquid that is superficially indistinguishable from water (H2O), although it has a different molecular constitution (dubbed "XYZ"). We can, it is argued, agree that "water" can refer to H2O exclusively, even if all of the members of the relevant linguistic community (whose word it is) would classify XYZ as water, were they to find some. Following Kripke and Putnam, many have been persuaded that WATER might have referred to H2O exclusively in 1750, before it was known that water is H2O, because there was an intention to refer to a kind with a hidden or unknown nature that explained the superficial properties by which we usually recognise instances of the kind. On this view, it was, in 1750, an epistemological possibility that water was not H2O, but it was not a metaphysical possibility, given that water is H2O. Along similar lines, it can be argued that it is only an epistemological and not a genuine metaphysical possibility that Swampman might have intentionality.

Note that this last claim is not the claim that it is merely an epistemological possibility that Swampman might exist. Rather, the crucial claim is that, even if he did exist, it would remain a mere epistemological possibility that he would have genuine intentionality. This parallels the claim regarding water and XYZ. Even if XYZ were to exist (on Twin-Earth, say), it is claimed that it would not be genuine water. Superficial appearances would be on the side of Swampman's having intentionality, just as they would be on the side of XYZ's being water, but it may turn out that Swampman's "intentionality" is not genuine intentionality, just as it turned out that XYZ is not genuine water. In support of teleological theories of content, it is claimed that only the correct analysis of intentionality, as a real kind, can settle this issue. The possibility of Swampman, it is claimed, cannot decide the issue of what the correct analysis of intentionality is.

Of course, in the case of intentionality, unlike the case of water, the hidden nature or essence cannot be an inner structure, if a teleological theory is correct. On such a theory, intentionality is alleged to be a historical kind, so the hidden nature or essence would be a matter of history. It would count as hidden, not in the sense that we must seek it with a microscope, but in the sense that we must discover its historical nature. It is argued that the nature of intentionality, as a real or scientific kind, must be determined by the theoretical needs of the relevant science (Neander 1996). As proponents of teleological theories point out, there is an apparent need for other historical kinds in science: e.g., the species, the higher taxa, and functional and/or homologous kinds in biology.

The debate about Swampman continues. Most notably, David Braddon-Mitchell and Frank Jackson (1997) have argued that this "real nature" response is not available to proponents of teleological theories of content, and Papineau (2001) has responded on behalf of teleological theories.

The Methodological Individualism debate is also relevant here, since it questions whether science should have any historical kinds. If those who favor methodological invidualism are correct, teleological theories of content do not provide us with a good scientific way to individuate psychological states (Fodor 1991; Antony 1996). One argument for methodological individualism involves the claim that science should individuate kinds on the basis of causal powers. In brief, the idea is that, since science is in the business of causal explanations, and causal powers are what are relevant for causal explanations, science should classify items on the basis of similarities and differences in causal powers. Since there are no differences in causal powers between Davidson's kidney or beliefs at t and Swampman's kidney-analog and belief-analogs when he first pops into existence, they should belong to all the same scientific kinds, on this view. (For discussion of this issue, see Heil & Mele eds. 1993.)

One problem with methodological individualism is that it is radically revisionary, for biology at least. Biology has many historical categories, in its physiological as well as its more historical parts: e.g., physiological biology has homologous and functional categories. Moreover, if, for instance, we classify kidneys on the basis of actual causal powers, we include Swampman's kidney-analog at the cost of excluding many real kidneys: e.g., those of people on dialysis. While the arguments given in favor of methodological individualism may seem plausible, they are not usually accompanied by any attempt to understand the role that historical classifications play in biology or elsewhere. That being the case, we have reason to worry that the understanding of scientific classification that supports methodological individualism is too simple. Further, it must be kept in mind that the proponents of teleological theories claim that a historical theory of content is needed to capture psycho-semantic norms. Perhaps this is wrong. But if it is right, and if cognitive science needs such a normative notion, then methodological individualism must be wrong. Thus the debate must turn on the more specific issues of whether normative content involves history and whether cognitive science needs normative content.

4.3 Sophisticated Concepts and Capacities

The weightiest objection to teleological theories of content, and the hardest to assess, is that it is unclear how such theories could explain our most sophisticated concepts and capacities. No naturalistic theory of content, at this time, makes plain how we can, for example, think about democracy, virtue ethics, quarks, or perhaps even tomorrow. However, it is argued that teleological theories of content have a special problem in this respect (e.g., Peacocke 1992). The thought is that they may have some hope of working for contents that concern things that impact on fitness — food, shelter, mates, etc. — but that they are, in principle, unable to deal with contents that cannot have impacted on fitness, or not in any suitably selective way. Some contents cannot have impacted on fitness because they belong to the future, are non-existent, or exist outside our light cone. Others cannot affect fitness in any suitably selective way because, although they have an impact, their impact is too non-specific: for example, quarks have an impact, but because they are omnipresent in our environment, they cannot qualify as the content of a representation by virtue of some simple selectional story.

This objection is hard to assess for a number of reasons. One is that there are many different kinds of sophisticated concepts and capacities, and accounting for them all is a very large task. Another is that, while the objection is sometimes posed as an objection to all teleological theories, different versions of teleosemantics will address it in very different ways. Yet another is that teleological theories are least well developed with respect to such hard cases, and yet we might allow that it is still early days with respect to their development. In view of all this, the present section can do little more than offer a few remarks about how some versions of teleosemantics might make some inroads on the issue.

One class of cases often cited in this context is the empty concepts. As noted at the start of this entry, a minimal capacity for misrepresentation ensures some capacity for representing non-existent things: e.g., representing an instance of red in a certain region of the visual field when there is no instance of red in that region. However, the human capacity to represent non-existent things goes well beyond a capacity for error, because humans also have empty concepts- of unicorns, Big Foot, phlogiston, entelechies, etc. The obvious problem for a teleological theory of content, as noted earlier, is that non-existent things cannot play any role in a natural process of selection.

This objection affects different teleological theories differently. As we have seen, some teleological theories are "modest", in the sense that they only try to directly account for the contents of a subset of mental representations, those that are the representational simples. On a theory of this sort, it is claimed that the empty concepts are not simple, and that the contents of representations that express empty concepts must in some way be composed out of the contents of representations that express non-empty concepts. A problem for such "modest" theories, as noted before, is to explain how this can be done, and it is fair to say that there is no unproblematic theory of concepts presently available that does this.

The most intuitive suggestion as to how this might be done is the traditional suggestion, that complex concepts (including empty concepts) can be defined in terms of simpler concepts. However, this traditional answer is now often regarded as naive or at any rate wrong. Notoriously, good definitions, which state necessary and sufficient conditions for the application of a concept, are (at best) hard to find. And the idea that there are such definitions seems to entail that there is a principled analytic/synthetic distinction, an idea that has been in disrepute since Quine's "Two Dogmas of Empiricism". Nonetheless, there may be a way around both problems. There are in addition other less traditional proposals regarding the way in which complex meanings could be composed out of simpler meanings. While it can be argued that none does all the work required, it may be too soon to conclude that no such alternative proposal could do so. This issue cannot be explored further here, but modest teleological theories will stand or fall on this issue.

It is also possible that there is another problem in store for "modest theories". Some argue that it is possible that there are representations that are simple and yet empty. Suppose, for example, that a theory of vision determines that a CIRCLE or SQUARE representation is primitive (the example comes from Georges Rey). Plato taught us that there are no perfect circles, no perfect squares, in the ordinary sensory world. So, it is argued, such simples would be empty. In response to this, however, it can be questioned whether such a theory of vision would really require that the contents of the primitives be, in effect, perfect circle and perfect square, as opposed to something more like approximately circular or circular to such and such an approximation.

It might seem that teleological theories that aim to directly account for all mental representations must directly account for all empty concepts. However, Millikan (1984) points out that empty concepts, being empty, do not strictly speaking refer, and that she is interested in providing a theory of referential content. A complete semantic theory must give some account of the difference in meaning among empty concepts because, in some sense of the word "meaning", "phlogiston" and "unicorn" do not have the same meaning. But Millikan's theory of referential content is not required to do so.

In that case, we are left with the other types of concepts mentioned earlier: a concept of a quark, for instance. A modest theory might beg off providing an immediate answer on the grounds that such concepts are not simples, but a theory that aims to directly account for all referring representations cannot do so. Millikan discusses sophisticated theoretical concepts (1995), but does not closely tie her comments to her core teleological theory. One might be tempted to suggest that these cases are not really a problem for her core theory. One might suggest that QUARK's mapping onto quarks explains the perpetuation of the consumers that use QUARK. However, one might also worry whether this is really a substantial, non-circular proposal. No doubt, QUARK has been useful because it maps on to quark, but if this just means that QUARK has been useful because it has meant quark, we would still lack an account of its content. In order to assess Millikan's core theory, in such a case, we need to be able to identify the consumers and the Normal conditions for the performance of their proper functions, but it is hard to know what these are meant to be in such a case. In an ordinary sense, the student or the scientist is the consumer (they use the concept to do their work), but the student and the scientist do not, in the relevant sense, have proper functions. We need to see such cases worked out in detail.

Perhaps the same is true for Papineau's theory. Recall that, for Papineau, the content of a desire is primary, and the content of the desire is given by the conditions which it is the function of the desire to bring about. We might suppose that the desire to detect a quark might tend to cause quark detection. We might also suppose that being a successful scientist might contribute to one's fitness, and detecting a quark might contribute to being a successful scientist. Thus, it might be argued, it is the function of the desire to detect a quark to bring about quark detection, and thus the content of the desire is that a quark be detected. So far, so good. But a worry is that this mode of analysis will be too imprecise for the work at hand. Consider also the following scenario. The desire to detect phlogiston might tend to cause oxygen detection (i.e., oxygen which is mistaken for phlogiston). Further, being a successful scientist might contribute to one's fitness, and seeming to have detected phlogiston by really having detected oxygen might contribute to being a successful scientist. Thus it would seem that, in this scenario, and according to Papineau's theory, PHLOGISTON means oxygen.

Finally, we return to a problem mentioned in the introduction to section 3, which stems from the fact that correct representation can occur in the absence of the thing represented. This can occur in both labeling contexts and in contexts where nothing in particular is labeled. For example, it can occur when I recall that my long-dead pet was a cat (a case of labeling), as well as when Mrs Boffin wants to adopt an orphan, but as yet no orphan in particular (a case of non-labeling). The problem is, as Fodor remarks, mainly a problem for versions of informational semantics (he had mainly non-teleological theories in mind at the time). This problem, although a serious one, has received little attention, and no more than a few remarks will be attempted here.

Teleological theories of content that are not informational theories have something to say in response to this problem. Papineau's theory, for instance, allows a great deal of representation in absentia. A desire for food, if it tends to cause a creature to find food, has the content that there be food even in the absence of food, on his theory. Moreover, since absent things can be components of the satisfaction conditions that desires have the function to bring about, they can also be the components of the truth conditions of beliefs, since they can be required for the satisfaction of desires that collaborate with those beliefs in causing actions.

Informational versions of teleosemantics are in a more difficult position, with respect to this issue, and (to the knowledge of this author) there has been little, if any, work done on this issue from within such a framework.

It is to be hoped that further work will cast more light on which of these problems are soluble. In any case, large issues relevant to assessing the different teleological theories of content remain to be settled. In particular, it is at present controversial which representations a fundamental intentional theory must account for, and what theoretical purposes must be served by the contents it generates. Without agreement on these issues, there can be little agreement even as to what the criteria of success are. On a more hopeful note, remember that serious work on naturalistic theories of content has been done for no more than a few decades, and on a philosophical timescale, that is quite a short time. It might be that a significant number of these problems will be solved in time.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

analytic/synthetic distinction | Brentano, Franz | cognitive science | concepts | consciousness | consciousness: representational theories of | fitness | functionalism | intentionality | mental causation | mental content: causal theories of | mental content: externalism about | mental content: narrow | mental representation | naturalism | teleology: teleological notions in biology


Thanks to David Chalmers and Georges Rey for penetrating comments. The editors would also like to thank Christopher von Bülow for carefully reading this entry and calling numerous typographical errors to our attention.